Brian Skyrms

From Zeno to Arbitrage: Essays on Quantity, Coherence, and Induction

Brian Skyrms, From Zeno to Arbitrage: Essays on Quantity, Coherence, and Induction, Oxford University Press, 2013, 272pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199652815.

Reviewed by Kenny Easwaran, University of Southern California

This book is a collection of previously published essays by Brian Skyrms. There have been almost no changes in any of the essays -- references to other papers in this volume, and references to papers by other authors that were forthcoming at the time, don't have updated publication information. There is nothing new here. This volume is certainly not comprehensive -- many topics that Skyrms has written on (causation, logic, and especially evolutionary game theory) are not represented at all. Even on the topics included, a few important papers are missing (I think primarily of his (1987) and (1992)).

But the book does present a valuable opportunity for people like me, who should have read these essays long ago (only one of the papers dates from after 1996), to reflect on the aspects of Skyrms' work included here. And it turns out that this book is a convenient source for a lot of his important work on the application of mathematics to philosophical questions about induction and epistemology, as well as some intriguing ideas for metaphysics.

The subtitle of the volume is "Essays on Quantity, Coherence, and Induction". The four papers in the first section don't really address a unified philosophical theme, but instead use unified mathematical techniques (Boolean algebras, Borel measure, unmeasurable sets) to address several different philosophical questions. The six papers in the second section all address issues related to coherence of degrees of belief. And the three papers in the third section give a particularly interesting take on Carnap's view of induction, arguing that Carnap's considered view was actually much more subjectivist than we usually realize. I will discuss each of these sections in turn, giving what I take to be the upshot of the corresponding projects.

In the four papers of the first section, the mathematics of measure theory is used to update Zeno's arguments, clarify a notion of possibility that might be implicit in Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, give a more general understanding of the part-whole relationship, and strengthen the notion of probabilistic coherence assumed in Bayesian theory. In typical Skyrms-ian fashion, he shows how the mathematics could be used by metaphysicians and epistemologists to make various points, but is a bit cagey about whether one or another of these uses would be the right way to go.

I found the first paper, "Zeno's Paradox of Measure" (originally published in 1983, in a hard-to-find volume), quite interesting on the parallels between the ancient debate among Zeno, Democritus, Aristotle and others, and the late 19th century debate between Cantor, Borel, Lebesgue, Vitali, and their contemporaries. Given the parallels, he argues that the Banach-Tarski paradox is the mathematically rigorous version of Zeno's paradoxes. "Tractarian Nominalism" and "Logical Atoms and Combinatorial Possibility" use the mathematics of measure theory to develop Wittgenstein's idea that facts are primary, and that the world, objects, and properties are all logical constructions out of facts. The resulting picture is mathematically interesting, and deserves to be investigated more fully by metaphysicians. The major obstacle I see is the question of how this picture of the world can give rise to mathematical objects, which seem to play an important role in constituting the worlds, objects, and properties. "Strict Coherence, Sigma Coherence, and the Metaphysics of Quantity" would perhaps fit better in the second section, on coherence, but appears to be included here because of its heavy reliance on the techniques from measure theory used in the first three papers. It lays out the relation between various issues that arise in probability theory when the set of possibilities is infinite, and gives the arguments for and against the ideas that extremely improbable events have zero probability (rather than some "infinitesimal" probability) and that the probability of an infinite exclusive disjunction should be exactly equal to the sum of the probabilities of the disjuncts (rather than possibly strictly greater). Skyrms does not try to settle these debates, which have been the subject of much work before and since, including my (2013).

The second section, on coherent degrees of belief, comprises six papers. There are various commonalities between the papers. Several discuss higher-order degrees of belief. Most of them also focus on diachronic coherence, giving comparisons between traditional conditionalization, Richard Jeffrey's generalization of it, and the "MAXENT" rule popular among objective Bayesians, which says to adopt the distribution with maximum entropy among those that satisfy a given set of constraints. However, Skyrms doesn't argue for or against any of the particular rules. Instead (as suggested in the last sentence of "Dynamic Coherence and Probability Kinematics"), he motivates a research program of characterizing update situations and asking, "What rule or rules for belief are dynamically coherent for this sort of situation?" (p. 137) I will discuss just a few of the papers of this section.

The first paper, "Higher Order Degrees of Belief", begins with a defense of second-order degrees of belief against several challenge. However, the second half of the paper does much more than this. It begins with an important early statement of Skyrms' general view that the proper interpretation of Ramsey's arguments involving bets is that the guaranteed loss accompanying the bets is just a way to dramatize an underlying inconsistency -- incoherence consists in the inconsistency, rather than in the actual loss. As he puts in on p. 94, "asking the question in this way [about losses, rather than inconsistency] appears to make the subjective theory of probability rest on a kind of methodological paranoia that is usually associated only with the theory of games." He then gives an argument for updating by conditionalization, and shows how Jeffrey's rule and MAXENT can be related to it by means of higher-order credences. Jeffrey's rule turns out to be equivalent to conditionalization on a certain second-order proposition, assuming that knowledge of one's future first-order credences is screened off by knowledge of the proposition, but that one's current credence is maximally dependent on one's future credence. Updating by MAXENT on learning some information about a parameter is then a special case of Jeffrey conditioning on the partition of possible values of that parameter.

Chapter 8, "Updating, Supposing, and MAXENT", gives the full specification of this special case. In Jeffrey conditioning generally, one scales up or down the probability of each cell of the partition by a multiplicative factor. In the specific case where it is generated by MAXENT for a constraint determined by the expectation of a parameter f, the multiplicative factor is proportional to ,e-kf., where k is chosen to fit the constraint. (It is instructive to note that this is just like Boltzmann's formula for the maximum entropy distribution of states in a body of a given total energy -- in that case, f is the energy level of a given state, and k turns out to be −1/T, where T is the temperature of the body. Perhaps we should consider the "temperature" of various distributions, in addition to the entropy.)

But this paper also questions the appropriateness of MAXENT for many of the purposes for which it is used. The basic idea (relying on an older argument by Abner Shimony) is that it is better to interpret a MAXENT distribution as one's best guess for a physical probability distribution, rather than as one's credences about the property that this is a distribution of. Skyrms suggests in this paper that MAXENT may be more useful for a sort of supposing than for updating. Stalnaker and others have suggested that the truth of a counterfactual conditional is determined by the truth of the consequent at the closest situation where the antecedent is true. Skyrms suggests that MAXENT can be used to find the closest probability distribution where a given constraint is satisfied. Rather than saying what one should believe if one finds out the expectation of a given parameter, it says what would be the chances of various outcomes if the expectation of the parameter had taken that value. This undermines one of the best hopes for an objective Bayesian theory.

Chapter 10, "Diachronic Coherence and Radical Probabilism", develops the theory of probability and updating as a special case of the general economic theory of pricing. It helps isolate what is really of interest in the standard Dutch book arguments for coherence, and how it relates to certain other arguments. It is not a major advance in the theory, but I suspect that I will use the ideas of this paper (though definitely not the paper itself, which gets quite mathematically advanced) in structuring introductory classes in the future.

Although the third section of the book is called "Induction", it doesn't have the general wide-ranging discussion that many philosophers will expect. But given the history of attempts to give positive general accounts of induction of this sort, this is for the best. The first two papers here discuss some parametric and non-parametric methods in Bayesian statistics, and show how they arise naturally as extensions of the Carnapian inductive logical program that many philosophers are familiar with and assume is "moribund" (Williamson, 2000, p. 211). The third paper (the final one in the volume) approaches the problem a bit more generally, arguing that the "grue" problem is even more widespread than Goodman thought, and giving a Carnapian justification for subjective Bayesian methodology.

This last paper starts with de Finetti's famous result on exchangeability -- if one's priors for some sequence of trials are "exchangeable" (meaning that one finds any given sequence of outcomes just as likely as any permutation of that same sequence), then it is "just as if" one thinks there is a stable "objective chance" of each outcome, and one treats the trials as independent, except insofar as they all give information about the same objective chances. No matter what exchangeable prior one has, one will thus automatically project experiences of the past into the future. In this sense, induction is inevitable.

Of course, nothing requires that one's credences be exchangeable. However, after discussing some other symmetry conditions of this sort, Skyrms gives a very general result, from ergodic theory. Given any symmetry condition on one's credences about a set of propositions (exchangeability is symmetry under the operation of a group of permutations on the propositions, but other symmetry groups will work), there is a class of stationary distributions (in the exchangeable case, the various chance distributions that might underlie a sequence of independent, identically distributed events), and one's credences must act just like a prior over these distributions. These stationary distributions look a lot like the sorts of causal regularities in the world that Goodman was interested in, and the result shows that one can't obey a symmetry constraint without automatically being disposed to draw these lawlike generalizations.

Skyrms suggests that this vindicates a kind of Goodmanian subjective justification of induction: "Regularities are where you find them, and you can find them anywhere." p. 245, quoting Goodman (1955, p. 82). One can't be a rational reasoner without having some sort of symmetry in one's judgments (so a fuller version of the argument would go), and the result means that one will get evidence for and against various generalizations that go beyond the evidence. These generalizations don't have to have any sort of physical reality -- they are inherent in the very idea of a rational reasoner that obeys a symmetry constraint. If the world happens to behave in accord with one of the generalizations, then one will almost certainly eventually learn the truth. But there is no guarantee that the world cooperates, any more than there is a guarantee that green, rather than grue, is the right property to generalize.

The two other papers in this final section show how this project relates to Carnap's program for inductive logic. Many philosophers are familiar with Carnap's early philosophy of probability, up to the 1950 Logical Foundations of Probability, where he develops a sort of Keynesian logical probability to try to give a unique confirmation function for an abstract first-order language. This rule turns out to be equivalent to Laplace's "rule of succession", which makes one's credences about future instances of a generalization into a weighted average of an a priori uniform distribution and the a posteriori observed frequencies. Some also know Carnap's 1952 work, The Continuum of Inductive Methods, which generalizes this to allow that a rational agent might put different weights (determined by the parameter λ) on the a priori and a posteriori parts, and might even have a non-uniform a priori part (determined by his γ parameters) if the properties involved are of the right sort. This system turns out to be equivalent to that of (Johnson, 1924).

But Skyrms points out that in posthumously published work, Carnap went further, and embraced de Finetti's full subjective probability, with exchangeability doing all the work of his earlier λ-γ continuum. Carnap called for a fuller study of what constraints might replace exchangeability in situations where it is not an appropriate assumption. In chapter 11, "Carnapian Inductive Logic for Markov Chains", Skyrms shows how to characterize the appropriate prior for Markov processes (ones in which the result of one trial might influence the next trial, but the influence does not spread any farther). And in chapter 12, "Carnapian Inductive Logic for Bayesian Statistics", Skyrms argues that the work of Bayesian statisticians is exactly the continuation of Carnap's late project. There is no longer any attempt to give a universal logic of induction -- there are just subjective features of the situation that determine which Bayesian model is appropriate, allowing for cases much more general than de Finetti's case of exchangeability.

This final view is perhaps not as satisfying for philosophers as a solution to Carnap's original question would have been. But it shows that Carnap's project didn't die when this original question was shown to be unanswerable. And it challenges general epistemologists to pay more attention to the literature on "model selection" in philosophy of science.

Although this book is not a new contribution, I hope that it helps make more philosophers aware of the important work Brian Skyrms has been doing for several decades. This work is well worth studying for anyone dealing with these issues, and this book is a convenient resource for it.


Easwaran, Kenny. 2013, "Regularity and Hyperreal Credences". The Philosophical Review, forthcoming.

Goodman, Nelson. 1955, Fact, Fiction, and Forecast.

Johnson, W.E. 1924, Logic, Part III: The Logical Foundations of Science.

Skyrms, Brian. 1987, "Coherence". in Scientific Inquiry in Philosophical Perspective. Nicholas Rescher (ed.). University Press of America.

Skyrms, Brian. 1992, "Coherence, Probability, and Induction". Philosophical Issues 2, 215-226.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000, Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford University Press.