A. J. Pyle


A. J. Pyle, Locke, Polity, 2013, 224pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780745650661

Reviewed by David E. Soles, Wichita State University

A.J. Pyle's Locke is an incredibly ambitious work. In fewer than two hundred pages (excluding end notes, bibliography and index) it covers Locke's epistemology, metaphysics, philosophy of religion and political philosophy "while glancing briefly at his views on other subjects" (2). In addition to providing an introduction to some of Locke's main themes, the book is concerned to locate them in their historical, political, religious, and intellectual contexts, and "Locke's central claims are subjected to close scrutiny, and his replies to his main critics are evaluated" (cover blurb). Given the ambition of the project, it is surprising just how successful Pyle is in meeting his objectives.

To begin, the book is engagingly written. Pyle has a succinct, lucid style and a remarkable ability to present difficult, sophisticated material in a manner accessible to the typical undergraduate. That alone should make it invaluable to any student initiating serious study of Locke. The book also is well structured. Pyle takes as his guiding thread Locke's claim that we have (or can acquire) enough knowledge for our needs in this world and that we should not repine over our inability to answer the "deep" questions of metaphysics, theology, or cosmology. Consequently, Pyle begins with chapters on Locke's epistemology and traces out how Locke's distinguishing knowledge, probability, and incurable ignorance influences his discussions of nature, metaphysics, religion, and politics. This certainly should help any beginning student get a sense of Locke's philosophy as a whole.

The work does an admirable job of placing Locke's thought in context, particularly excelling in discussing Locke's philosophy of religion. In addition to a sensitive and sensible discussion of Locke's disastrous proof of the existence of God, Pyle considers several issues in philosophy of religion less extensively covered in introductory works on Locke: the advocacy of toleration, the reasonableness of Christianity, the nature of the soul, the possibility of an afterlife, and the distinct provinces of faith and reason. 

The work nicely places these discussions in the context of seventeenth century debates about mortalism, deism, the materiality of the soul, and Athanasian, Arian, and Socinian views on the nature of Christ. It also considers how Locke's own views on the possibility of an afterlife and the nature of the soul are tied to his philosophical accounts of substance, substrata, and personal identity. The work also aptly presents the intimate connections between Locke's philosophy of religion and his political philosophy. As Pyle rightly emphasizes, a major concern for seventeenth century British (especially Whig) intellectuals was the issue of divided authority: what are you to do when the secular authority demands something that your religion tells you is forbidden by God (or vice versa)? One popular way of avoiding the problem was the absolutism articulated by Filmer and endorsed by the Stuarts and their followers: since the monarch is God's divine representative on earth, the monarch's commands are God's commands and, consequently, there can be no opposition between what is commanded by them. While this dissolves the tension, it leaves no space for conscientious disagreement and opens the door to both absolutism and Popery, each anathema to Protestant intellectuals committed to a parliamentary form of government. Here Pyle does a masterful job of delineating the issues and demonstrating how Locke's concerns led to a plea for toleration, the advocacy of a very inclusive form of Christianity, and an early defense of the separation of state and religion.

Given the scope of the work, Pyle necessarily paints in broad brushstrokes and this is where the book's few shortcomings arise. There is a tendency to present Locke's positions as being much clearer, more plausible, and less ambiguous than they really are. As one illustration, consider the work's discussion of the distinction between simple and complex ideas. That discussion consists of one sentence:

Ideas of both sensation and reflection admit a simple/complex distinction, giving us a fairly straightforward breakdown into four groups, as follows:

Simple ideas of sensation: red, hot, sweet, etc.

Complex ideas of sensation: elephant, oak, tree, fortress.

Simple ideas of reflection: thinking, willing, pleasure, pain.

Complex ideas of reflection: feeling sad at the loss of a loved one, the pleasant anticipation of successfully completing a job, experiencing anxiety about the state of one’s soul. (48)

Now this is overly truncated to the point of being misleading. While Pyle goes on to say some things about both simple and complex ideas, missing is any discussion of Locke's grounds for classifying some ideas as simple and others as complex. At 2.2.1 Locke seems to be offering a criterion of simplicity in terms of unanalyzability: simple ideas are those that cannot be analyzed into constituent ideas, while ideas that can be analyzed into constituent ideas are complex.1 2.2.2, however, seems to offer a criterion of simplicity in terms of manner of acquisition; simple ideas are those that can be acquired only as givens of experience while complex ideas can be acquired by manipulating ideas already in one's possession. While the two criteria may usually be co-extensive, they are not necessarily co-extensive. There could be some analyzable ideas that can be acquired only as givens of experience (perhaps the idea of what being in love feels like) and there could be some unanalyzable ideas that could be acquired other than as givens of immediate experience (perhaps the idea of Hume's missing shade of blue). This raises important issues about the relationships between Locke's two criteria. Even more troublesome, Locke's own classification of simple and complex ideas does not conform to his own criteria. Consider, for example, the idea of power, which is routinely cited as a simple idea. Locke maintains that:

The Mind, being every day informed, by the Senses, of the alteration of those simple Ideas, it observes in things without; and taking notice how one comes to an end, and ceases to be, and another begins to exist, which was not before; reflecting also on what passes within it self, and observing a constant change of its Ideas, and observing a constant change of its Ideas, sometimes by the impression of outward Objects on the Senses, and sometimes by the Determination of its own choice; and concluding from what it has so constantly observed to have been, that the like Changes will for the future be made, in the same things, by like Agents, and by the like ways, considers in one thing the possibility of having any of its simple Ideas changed, and in another the possibility of making that change; and so comes by that Idea which we call Power. (2.21.1)

According to this passage, the idea of power is not an immediate given of experience; the mind must do some rudimentary observing, comparing, reflecting, and concluding in order to acquire the idea of power. Also, the idea has several constituents into which it can be analyzed: the ideas of possibility, object, making, change, etc. Similar sorts of things can be said for Locke's stated accounts of ideas like those of motion or succession. Though they are classified as simple ideas, they conform to neither criterion of simplicity. This is not a trivial point. The simple/complex idea distinction is the foundation of Locke's account of idea genesis, which is central to his empiricist epistemology. Instabilities in the foundation are reflected upwards throughout the edifice. Pyle's not mentioning problems like these leaves the uninitiated with the impression that Locke's distinction is much clearer and more stable than it actually is.

While Pyle lauds recent Locke scholars who have "helped to strip away centuries of misunderstanding and misrepresentation" and have presented the real Locke as a "much more powerful and profound thinker than the caricature still sometimes found . . . in textbook accounts" (1), I believe that he is guilty of promulgating many of those misunderstandings and misrepresentations. As one example, consider his discussion of Locke's "definition" of knowledge at 4.1.1-2. There Locke maintains:

Since the Mind, in all its Thoughts and Reasonings, hath no other immediate Object but its own Ideas, which it alone does or can contemplate, it is evident that our knowledge is only conversant about them. (4.1.1)

Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy, of any of our Ideas. In this alone it consists. Where this perception is, there is Knowledge; and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge. (4.1.2)

Following an interpretation that goes back to Berkeley, Pyle takes these remarks as committing Locke to the counter-intuitive and bizarre view that one can have knowledge of only ideas. For the last thirty years, however, it has been commonplace for Locke scholars to emphasize that these remarks must be read in light of Locke's frequently repeated assertions that all knowledge is propositional, that knowing just is being certain of the truth of a proposition, that all knowledge consists in propositions, etc. Briefly, for Locke, a sentence --  what he calls a "verbal proposition" -- represents a mental proposition, which is the meaning or sense of the sentence. A mental proposition just is a concatenation of ideas that represents some possible state of affairs. Thus, the sentence "Jilly is in the west pasture" represents the idea that my horse, Jilly, is in the west pasture. That idea is comprised of several distinct ideas (ideas of Jilly, pastures, the west, etc.), and coming to know that Jilly is in the west pasture just is a matter of coming to see that the ingredient ideas have been combined in a way that represents some actual state of affairs. But perceiving that those ideas agree (i.e., are combined so as to represent some actual state of affairs) is to come to have knowledge of Jilly's location, not a matter of coming to know something about my ideas. While this whole approach to thought and knowledge is misguided, there is nothing in it that entails that one can acquire knowledge only of ideas. Instead of being an account of what I can have knowledge of, it is an account of what happens in the mind when I come to have knowledge. Simply repeating Berkeley's interpretation without any serious discussion of recent work on the topic makes Locke look silly and does the uninitiated reader a disservice.

An annoyance when working in the history of philosophy is to be told that a particular thinker maintains a given position in a certain passage and, when consulting the cited passage, finding that one has been given a contentious or highly implausible reading. By and large, Pyle is not guilty of this. His use of quotations and citations tends to be judicious and adroit and supports the interpretations being advanced. There are, however, occasional places where passages are taken out of context and erroneously offered as support for questionable interpretations. Pyle, for instance, attributes to Locke a representative theory of perception, the view that one never directly perceives eternal objects, but instead perceives only ideas that represent those objects. In advancing the view that ideas are some sort of "intermediate entity" standing between the mind and external objects, Pyle quotes 4.21.4's assertion that

since the things the mind contemplates are none of them, besides itself, present to the understanding, it is necessary that something else, as a sign or representation of the thing it considers, should be present to it, and these are Ideas.

But this can hardly be construed as committing Locke to a representative theory of perception because 4.21.4 has nothing to do with perception. As the quote makes clear, the topic under discussion is contemplation orconsideration. Locke's point here is fairly straightforward: I can sit here in my study and contemplate the Mongol influence on the development of Russian statute law. To do this it is necessary for me to have ideas (of Mongols, their occupation of medieval Russia, the development of Russian statute law during that period, etc.) that represent absent objects and events and that I can manipulate in considering the topic. Once again, this whole account of thought is no doubt wrong-headed. For present purposes, however, the important point is that it has absolutely nothing to do with external world perception. The whole point of 4.21.4 is to emphasize the necessity of ideas for thought, which in turn emphasizes the importance of semiotics, the study of signs -- a major topic of An Essay concerning Human Understanding.

This is a book I will recommend to students initiating serious work on Locke or seventeenth century philosophy in general, but only with caveats. While it does an excellent job of placing Locke's work in context and in demonstrating how his various views fit together and influence each other, there are important lacunae and many of the interpretations are questionable and insufficiently defended.

1 All Locke quotes and citations are from An Essay concerning Human Understanding, edited by Peter H. Nidditch, Clarendon Press, Oxford, 1975. They are provided in the form of book, chapter, and section numbers.