2013.08.07

Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson (eds.)

Property-Owning Democracy: Rawls and Beyond

Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson (eds.), Property-Owning Democracy: Rawls and Beyond, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 320pp., $93.95 (hbk), ISBN: 9781444334104.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


John Rawls's discussion of economic institutions in A Theory of Justice[1] is among the least-discussed parts of that book. Long after TJ's original publication, many readers still assumed that Rawls's two principles of justice were to be satisfied, or -- since Rawls also mentioned market socialism -- at least could be satisfied, by capitalist economies with generous social welfare programs.[2] But in the preface to the revised edition of TJ, published in 1999, and in Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, Rawls said that this assumption was a misunderstanding -- albeit one that he himself had encouraged, or at least had failed to anticipate and forestall -- by failing to distinguish clearly between the form of economy he called "welfare-state capitalism" and what TJ had called a "property-owning democracy".

Property-owning democracy is unfamiliar and not well-understood, but it is a promising ideal for progressive political economy. In this very instructive, wide-ranging, and most welcome volume, Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson have assembled fourteen thoughtful essays and a substantial introduction which together explore its meaning and history, and the prospects of its implementation. The book has a great deal to interest political philosophers and theorists, political scientists, political economists, and reflective political activists on the left. The essays are accessibly written, and the economics that is included is not mathematically demanding. As with any collection on an unfamiliar topic, a review of this one requires the provision of considerable background. The book is not primarily about Rawls. But its sub-title is "Rawls and Beyond" and it takes Rawls's treatment of property-owning democracy as its touchstone and starting point. And so to appreciate this book, we need to see what Rawls meant by "property-owning democracy" and why he concluded in Restatement that either it or what he called "liberal socialism" "seem[s] necessary" to realize his conception of justice.[3] I shall therefore explain what Rawls had in mind while engaging and commenting on a number of the essays in O'Neill and Williamson's collection.

* * * * * * * * * *

Rawls takes the term "property-owning democracy" from the British economist James Meade, who won the Nobel Prize in 1977 for his work on the theory of international trade.[4] Meade's own writings on property-owning democracy, including his version of realistic utopianism,[5] are quite interesting. Some indication of the scope of Meade's work can be got from Ben Jackson's contribution, which provides a fascinating history of the idea of property-owning democracy from its antecedents in early modern republicanism to what Jackson calls its "Rawlsian and Neo-liberal Lineages" (for Meade, see pp. 44-46). Because of Meade's seminal role in the left-liberal discussion to which this book contributes, it is regrettable that the editors did not include an essay dedicated entirely to his work and continued influence, even if doing so would have required some modification of the book's subtitle.

In Restatement, Rawls contrasts property-owning democracy not just with welfare-state capitalism, but also with laissez-faire capitalism (which he equates with what he called "natural liberty" in TJ), state socialism (characterized by a command economy governed by one political party), and liberal socialism.[6] Since the Rawls of Restatement wants to clarify the ambiguity and uncertainty of TJ's discussion of political economy by showing that justice as fairness cannot be realized by welfare-state capitalism as he understands it, the first contrast is -- as O'Neill and Williamson recognize from the outset (p. 3) -- the most important one and the one most deserving of attention.

The philosophical method Rawls employs in introducing and contrasting types of economic systems is both essential to his arguments as I read them and somewhat puzzling. O'Neill raises some very probing questions about the method in his own superb contribution to this volume, and, as we shall see, Rawls's use of it seems to leave him open to telling objections. Yet Rawls helps himself to the method without explanation or defense. Indeed Restatement's silence on the relevant methodological questions stands in stark and frustrating contrast to the many rich and transformative methodological discussions in TJBecause Rawls says so little about the method he uses at this point in Restatement, and because I shall try to address O'Neill's questions and objections below, I want to review Rawls's method here in some detail.

Rawls introduces the five economic systems he discusses by means of what he calls "ideal institutional description[s]." He says:

By the ideal institutional description of a regime I mean the description of how it works when it is working well, that is, in accordance with its public aims and principles of design.[7]

I take the ideal institutional description of a regime -- in Rawls's case, an economic regime or system -- to be conjunctive. One conjunct gives the aims of the system, which I take to be the values or states of affairs the regime is intended to realize in its on-going operations. The other conjunct is a description -- perhaps a highly abstract description -- of economic institutions such as those of capital ownership and formation, taxation, industrial management, and mechanisms for determining price and income, all of which are designed to realize those aims.

Rawls clearly does not intend an ideal institutional description of an economic system to be a description of an economic system which is morally ideal, since some of the economic systems he describes are clearly not morally ideal and since he argues that others -- such as welfare-state capitalism -- can be seen to be defective on examination even if they are not obviously so. Moreover, Rawls implies that all the systems described can "work well", so what it means for a system to work well is not for it to work in some morally ideal way, but simply for it effectively to advance whatever aims are partially definitive of its type. What, then, does Rawls mean by "ideal" in the phrase "ideal institutional descriptions"?

One way in which such descriptions are ideal is that they are idealized in a way that is clear enough from Rawls's text. Rawls says that an ideal institutional description "abstracts from its political sociology, that is, from an account of the political, economic and social elements that determine its effectiveness in achieving its public aims."[8] Here I take Rawls to mean that he puts aside a host of practical problems that might beset a regime once it is institutionalized, such as collective-action and information problems, and the difficulties of generating stabilizing forces. For purposes of the argument at hand, Rawls idealizes by assuming that the institutions described can and will realize their characteristic aims.

But Rawls's reliance on ideal institutional descriptions, and in particular his talk of institutional "aims" and "principles of design" which are public, raises the question of just how the descriptions themselves -- the conjunctions of aims and institutions -- are arrived at. After all, economic systems as we know them seem a far cry from regimes with clearly-defined ends and with blueprints which are open to public inspection. So whatever ideal institutional descriptions are, they are not -- and presumably are not meant to be -- descriptions that portray the economies of our world with photographic accuracy.

Rawls's descriptions of the five regime-types can read like stipulative definitions and it is tempting to take them as such. If we accede to this temptation, we will then take "welfare-state capitalism" to denote a set of institution-types designed to realize the values Rawls stipulates -- values which are publicly known in welfare-capitalist states because their regimes are further stipulated to satisfy Rawls's publicity condition.[9] The problem with imputing this methodology to Rawls is that the association of a description with a familiar term such as "welfare-state capitalism" cannot be entirely stipulative if the description is to do any argumentative work against the actual welfare states with which we are familiar, as Rawls surely intends them to do. Whatever method Rawls is taken to use, it must be one that insures some link between the ideal institutional description he associates with a familiar term and that term's usual referent.

This link could be provided if Rawls's descriptions were arrived at by a different method, one his name for them suggests. For it is tempting to seize on Rawls's use of the word "ideal" to assimilate ideal institutional descriptions of economic systems to Weberian ideal-types -- as O'Neill does (p. 91)[10] -- and to suppose that ideal institutional descriptions and ideal types are worked up from familiar cases in the same way. The problem with imputing this method is that there are no extant cases of property-owning democracy as Rawls and Meade understand it from which an ideal institutional description could be worked up, Weber-like.

In fact I believe that Rawls employs a methodology that is most accurately described as "mixed". The term "property-owning democracy" has a rich, varied and -- for progressives anyway, a checkered -- history that is amply documented in Jackson's essay. But like Meade, Rawls ignores that history and treats "property-owning democracy" as a term of art -- one for which he provides a stipulative description. That is, he simply stipulates that the term will denote a set of economic institutions, which he singles out because he believes they will realize aims given by justice as fairness. But a property-owning democracy is not just one of the social types that pursues the aims of justice as fairness. It is also a society that is well-ordered by justice as fairness. And so its aims are public knowledge because Rawls also stipulates that societies that are well-ordered satisfy the publicity condition. Property-owning democracy as Rawls understands it shares its aims with liberal socialism, but it differs from liberal socialism in allowing private ownership of a considerable amount of society's capital. As will be clear when we look at the institutions of property-owning democracy, there are no familiar cases of this regime-type the essentials of which Rawls's stipulative definition must capture if it is to be plausible. Rather, Meade and Rawls introduce property-owning democracy specifically to fill a previously uninhabited but, they think, fertile square in the logical space of political economy.

The other terms Rawls lists – "laissez-faire capitalism", "welfare-state capitalism", "state socialism" and "liberal socialism" -- are familiar, and he uses a different method to arrive at the ideal institutional descriptions he associates with them. I do take these descriptions to pick out Weberian ideal-types of extant or previously extant economic systems -- respectively: Gilded Age capitalism, contemporary welfare capitalism, 20th century Euro-communism and 21st century Chinese communism, and European socialism.

The ideal institutional descriptions of these regime-types imply that their aims are public. I believe that the publicity of aims, and their educational effects, are crucial to the contrasts Rawls means to draw between property-owning democracy and the other regime-types. But the reliance on publicity might seem to pose two problems for Rawls. First, the publicity of its aims might seem to make the ideal-type of, for example, welfare-state capitalism too unlike welfare states of the actual world for the ideal institutional description associated with "welfare state capitalism" to be linked to the familiar referent in the requisite way. Second, if the familiar referents do not have publicly avowed aims, then it is hard to see how Rawls can identify the aims he associates with their ideal-types.

I believe Rawls thinks that, in the actual world, the characteristic aims and design-principles of familiar types such as welfare-state capitalism are public knowledge, not because they satisfy the publicity condition of TJ, but because -- more weakly -- they are readily ascertainable by sophisticated observers and by reflective persons who live under them.[11] They are public because, to use a phrase Rawls uses in a different connection, they are the "evident intention" of the regimes.[12] And so I believe Rawls thinks he can identify the aims and design-principles associated with the ideal-types in part by generalizing from aims explicitly avowed in the actual cases from which they are worked up, but also by asking what aims would furnish the most plausible philosophical rationale for the institutions and policies of, for example, contemporary welfare states.

What might more plausibly be said to distance Rawls's ideal-types from economic systems of our world than the publicity of their aims is the regimes' high degree of internal coherence, bestowed by what might seem their unrealisitic unity of purpose. This might seem to require quite considerable abstraction from the messiness with which policies are made, particularly in democracies. For the economic systems of democracies are bound to be the cumulative result of so much log-rolling and deal-cutting, and of so many switches of party- and sectional-dominance, that it is impossible to offer a unified explanation of them or to recover a single intention animating their policies, let alone to discern an evident one. Thus (as with Weber's ideal-types so with Rawls's ideal institutional descriptions) articulation may seem to involve the intentional exaggeration of some features of actual systems at the expense of others, which in reality are equally prominent,[13] and so to yield caricatures that impede rather than advance analysis. I shall return to this worry when I consider O'Neill's objections to Rawls's arguments for property-owning democracy. But first, let us turn from the aims of property-owning democracy -- given by Rawls's conception of justice, justice as fairness -- to its institutions and to the contrast with welfare-state capitalism.

* * * * * * * * * *

Since a property-owning democracy is by definition a democracy, it must make provision for the political liberties. And since property-owning democracy aims at the realization of justice as fairness, also by definition, Rawls's first principle says what provision it must make: its institutions must be designed so that the political liberties have what Rawls calls "fair value". Rawls conjectures that insuring fair value may require the public financing of political parties, election-campaigns, and fora of public deliberation, as well as limits on campaign contributions.[14]One of the points or purposes of insuring the value of the political liberties is that the promise of popular control over politics can be realized. Another is that everyone has the opportunity to participate in "public political culture".[15] And so the aims of justice as fairness also require that citizens in a property-owning democracy have sufficient education to gain some understanding of the institutions under which they live, including an understanding of their characteristic aims.

But Rawls does not think that public funding of political life and political education are enough to ensure the fair value of the liberties. For he thinks that concentrations of wealth allow "a small part of society [to] control the economy and indirectly political life itself".[16] And so if property-owning democracy is to guarantee that the political liberties have fair value, it must avert the threat posed by the accumulation of wealth in small sectors. One way to do this would be to nationalize productive capital. But as I mentioned earlier, property-owning democracy differs from liberal socialism by allowing a great deal of capital to be privately held; that is what makes it a property-owning democracy. Rawls therefore takes a property-owning democracy to be a democracy in which non-human capital -- by which he means roughly natural resources, securities, savings, and shares in productive enterprises -- is privately owned but ownership is widely dispersed.[17]

By contrast, Rawls thinks, capitalist welfare-states that are democratic may have the political mechanisms of democracy, including legal recognition of the political liberties, but they do not -- contrary to what Ingrid Robeyns says in her essay (p. 172) -- aim at insuring the fair value of those liberties. They therefore do not institutionalize measures to insulate political life from the influence of money wielded by a small capitalist sector, nor do they take the fair value of those liberties as a reason to disperse capital-ownership. Thus, Rawls thinks that the aim of insuring the fair value of the political liberties itself has implications for political, educational, and economic institutions that distinguish property-owning democracy from welfare-state capitalism. But Rawls does not argue for such dispersion only on the ground that it is needed to satisfy the first principle of justice. He also thinks that it is needed to satisfy the second principle -- more specifically, to satisfy the difference principle.

The difference principle famously says that "economic inequalities" must work to the maximum advantage of the least advantaged. The phrase "economic inequalities" is sometimes thought to refer only to inequalities of earned income. But if it is understood -- and it surely must be, as O'Neill also stresses (p. 90) -- to refer also to inequalities in wealth and to the unearned income that wealth generates, then the difference principle must have implications for the ownership of non-human capital. Rawls thinks that allowing concentrations of capital to grow unchecked, particularly concentrations that are allowed to accumulate across generations, is bound to violate the difference principle, in part because of the differences in bargaining power that will inevitably result. And so he thinks the difference principle requires that accumulations be subject to regulations which disperse ownership of non-human capital -- especially when conjoined with measures to insure the widespread development of human capital, of which more below. If dispersion of capital and fair bargaining power are maintained, the background conditions of fair transactions will be in place and, he thinks, distribution can be left to pure procedural justice.

Welfare-state capitalism may adopt some measures that reduce inequalities by taxing inherited wealth and unearned income, by imposing progressive taxes on earned income, and by insuring a social minimum of income and goods-in-kind. But these measures are not intended to bring inequalities into line with the difference principle, and their aim is quite different from the underlying rationale of the difference principle. For the point of the social insurance measures enacted by welfare-state capitalism is, as the name of this economic system suggests, welfarist. Welfare-state capitalism does not aim to equalize welfare or to equalize the opportunity for welfare. Rather, it aims to insure that even the least advantaged citizens do not below a certain level of welfare or, as Rawls says, "below a decent minimum standard of life".[18]

Justice as fairness, on the other hand, is an equalizing view. Its deepest underlying rationale is, we might say, to equalize people -- more precisely, to enable people to express their nature as free and equal citizens by relating to one another as such. The point of dispersing capital and adopting other equalizing measures is therefore not to bring everyone to a certain level of welfare. It is "to put into the hands of citizens generally, and not only of a few, sufficient productive means for them to be fully cooperating members of society on a footing of equality."[19]Presumably dispersing capital-shares achieves this, not only by providing a stream of unearned income, but also by providing a social basis of self-confidence, security, and self-respect.[20]

Rawls thinks the difference between welfare-state capitalism and property-owning democracy can be brought out by seeing how each views the worst-off. In welfare-state capitalism, welfarist measures are a form of insurance and its recipients are those who fall victim to misfortune. Because the recipients are victims, Rawls thinks that institutionalizing these measures is consistent with viewing their beneficiaries as pitiable, with allowing their dependency, and with encouraging attitudinal and social inequalities. In property-owning democracy, by contrast, the least-advantaged citizens are "those to whom reciprocity is owed as a matter of political justice among those who are free and equal citizens, along with everyone else."[21] Thus the word "democracy"  in the phrase "property-owning democracy" does not refer only to a form of sovereignty, but also to the form of social and economic equality that prevails there in virtue of its intent to realize the difference principle.[22]

Finally, Rawls adds that the dispersal of non-human capital takes place "against a background of fair equality of opportunity"[23] -- also required by the second principle of justice -- and in conjunction with the wide development of human capital -- what he calls "education and trained skills".[24] Fair equality of opportunity might require considerable capital-dispersion, quite apart from the requirements of the difference principle, in order to mitigate the effects of familial wealth on life-prospects. Its point, like that of the difference principle, is to bring about a kind of equality, since it requires that those who are equally talented and motivated face equal life-prospects. Both fair equality of opportunity and the development of human capital would seem to require universal access to high-quality education. This is a requirement that a property-owning democracy would therefore have to satisfy.[25] When it does, the more competitive labor market that results may itself do much to bring social and economic inequalities within the range required by the difference principle. Welfare-state capitalism, on the other hand, is not committed to fair equality of opportunity, and allows great disparities of educational quality.

Rawls's property-owning democracy would therefore aim at satisfying the principles of justice as fairness, and at realizing the goods and values that give those principles their point. In a property-owning democracy, those aims and their satisfaction would be public knowledge. When democratic equality is realized and known to be realized in political and economic institutions, citizens are encouraged to think of themselves as the free equals justice as fairness says they are, and to frame their desires accordingly. That is an effect that Rawls thinks welfare-state capitalist regimes cannot have, since they avow and are known to avow quite different aims. Indeed, I believe Rawls thinks that welfare-state capitalism cannot realize the value of reciprocity. That is not just because such a regime is unlikely to satisfy the difference principle and the other demands of the two principles. It is also because reciprocal relations are relations among persons who think of themselves and one another -- and who respect themselves and one another -- as free and equal cooperators in Rawls's sense. The conditions -- or what Rawls calls the "foothold"[26] -- for citizens seeing themselves and others that way are absent from societies that do not have reciprocity among their "public aims".

One of the unfortunate consequences of neglecting TJ's treatment of political economy is the neglect of what Rawls says about how economic systems affect our relations by shaping the persons we desire to be,[27] and of the implications of that line of thought for his comparison of regime-types. Another unfortunate consequence is that the radicalism of Rawls's vision is easy to overlook, as it is by those who think his vision can be realized by making existing welfare-states more generous. Rawls's radicalism is easy to overlook in part because he himself says relatively little about how its dispersion of capital is brought about and maintained. Indeed, Rawls may think dispersion can be brought about largely by taxing estates and inter-vivos gifts, by encouraging savings among families below the median, and by decompressing the labor market.[28] Fortunately, the radicalism of the vision is brought out in quite different ways by several of the essays in this volume.

One of those essays ("Justice or Legitimacy, Barricades or Public Reason? The Politics of Property-Owning Democracy")  is the first in the volume. In it Simone Chambers highlights the radicalism of TJ and Restatement, but alleges a tension between it and the more modest aims of Political Liberalism, the subject of which she takes to be not justice but legitimacy. (p. 20) In brief, her argument begins from the fact that Rawls turned to political liberalism because he realized that the account of stability he had offered in TJ was flawed. To remedy the flaw, she thinks that the Rawls of Political Liberalism focused on the question "Why should we think citizens would accept these principles [Rawls's two principles of justice] as legitimate?" (p. 20), since he recognized that only principles generally accepted as legitimate could be stable for the right reasons. The problem, she thinks, is that Rawls also came to recognize that citizens of the societies to which Political Liberalism was addressed, such as the United States, would not accept the difference principle as legitimated by public reasoning. (p. 18) That is why she thinks that in Political Liberalism "controversial principles concerning social justice moved into the background and more widely accepted principles concerning rights and freedoms moved into the foreground." (p. 18)

"The take-home message" of the argument, Chambers says:

is that a Rawlsian commitment to egalitarianism points to the need to develop arguments that persuade the public and contribute to the direction in which public culture moves and develops. (p. 29)

I do not disagree with this conclusion. One of the many merits of Property-Owning Democracy is that it includes other essays that offer just the sort of arguments Chambers commends, of which more below. I do, however, disagree with the reading of Rawls that she uses to support the conclusion. I have argued against it and similar readings elsewhere and do not want to repeat the argument here.[29] For now, suffice it to say that if there is one central question on which Political Liberalism focuses it is not, as Chambers alleges, "Why should we think citizens would accept these principles as legitimate?". It is "How is it possible that citizens of a well-ordered society would accept these principles as legitimate?". To draw conclusions about what citizens of a well-ordered society could accept on the basis of survey data about contemporary America (pp. 25-26) is a mistake because it overlooks a point I have said that Rawls was concerned to stress: that economic and political institutions shape the attitudes of those who live under them. Indeed, I believe Rawls thinks that the institutions of a well-ordered society would encourage its citizens -- unlike citizens of contemporary welfare states -- to accept some strongly egalitarian principles as legitimate. That difference itself shows how great the difference between property-owning democracy and welfare capitalism would be. If that is right, then there is considerably less tension between Political Liberalism on the one hand, and TJ and Restatement on the other, than Chambers claims.

* * * * * * * * * *

A number of objections have been raised to Rawls's arguments for property-owning democracy, both before and after Restatement. Since some of them are mentioned in the volume, and since the methodology I have imputed to him seems to heighten his vulnerability to those objections, I want to review them here to see what responses are available.

To see the first, note that there are two forms of regime-failure that Rawls does not consider. There are those he idealizes away when he "abstracts from . . . political sociology" to arrive at his ideal institutional descriptions. By thus idealizing away the practical problems that may beset all regime-types, he idealizes away those that may cause property-owning democracy to fail. But the possibility of such failures arguably requires quite serious consideration before property-owning democracy can be endorsed. It is surprising that none of the essays in Property-Owning Democracy considers these objections, since it would be good to see them worked out in detail.[30] I believe Rawls has at least a preliminary response. He could point out that in Restatement, at least, he never claims that either property-owning democracy or liberal socialism will be sufficient to realize justice as fairness. He refrains from making the sufficiency claim in part because he is well aware of the possibility that the political sociology may not work out and that justice may prove unrealizable, but he also thinks that practical problems with property-owning democracy to which the objection points are problems that have to be addressed by economists and not philosophers. The strongest claim he will make on behalf of liberal socialism and property-owning democracy is that they "seem necessary" for realizing justice as fairness.

But this response opens Rawls to the second objection, premised on another form of failure he does not consider -- this time one he assumes away rather than abstracts from. Recall that to say a regime-type is working well is to say that it attains its aims. So one way a regime-type could work badly -- indeed, could fail -- would be if it did not realize its aims but realized those of an economic system of a different type. According to Rawls's ideal institutional description, welfare-state capitalism aims at the efficient production of considerable welfare, constrained by the requirement that no one have an indecent life. It does not aim at the difference principle or at the value of reciprocity. Thus, a welfare-state could fail, in the sense of "failure" now in view, if it satisfied that principle.

Rawls simply assumes that welfare-state capitalism cannot fail in this way, for he says "it seems safe to assume that if a regime does not try to realize certain political values, it will not in fact do so."[31] But it seems possible, as some objectors have argued, that there could be a welfare state -- call such an economy a WS* -- whose least well-off citizens were better off than they would be under any alternative economic system that could structure that society, including property-owning democracy. So it seems at least possible that a WS* rather than property-owning democracy would satisfy the difference principle, in which case Rawls would have been mistaken to assert, in response to the previous objection, that either property-owning democracy or liberal socialism is necessary to satisfy it.

Samuel Freeman thinks that to respond to this objection, Rawls should assume that workers have an interest in control of their work-place and that their doing so raises their index of primary goods. Since firms are not worker-controlled under welfare-state capitalism -- if we assume that an economy with worker-controlled firms could be as productive as one without them -- it seems possible that for every WS* there is an economy WM* that is like WS* in every way except that its firms are worker-managed firms. Since workers are better off in WM* than they are in WS*, the objection fails.[32] This line of thought is seconded in this volume by Nien-hê Hsieh, who endorses Freeman's argument in a fascinating essay on the implications of property-owning democracy for the conditions of work. (p. 152) But Rawls himself was reluctant to claim that workers have the interest Freeman and Hsieh claim,[33] and he has other responses available. He could, for instance, claim that even if the inequalities in WS* do make the least-advantaged as wealthy as they can be, they do not make the least-advantaged as well-off as they can be because WS* is bound to have inequalities so large that they violate the self-respect of the least-advantaged, thereby lowering their index of primary goods.[34]

A different response, one that does not depend upon an empirical claim about the psychological consequences of inequality, is suggested by Williamson and invokes a claim I made earlier about political economy: economic systems, and the political systems associated with them, have powerful educational effects, conditioning the way citizens think of themselves and one another. Indeed, what Rawls may have in mind in asserting that "if a regime does not try to realize certain political values, it will not fact do so" is that a regime's realizing values depends upon the educative effect of its being publicly known to encourage them. If that is right, then, if reciprocity is not among a society's "public aims", its citizens will not conceive of themselves and will not relate to one another -- and particularly to the least-advantaged -- as free and equal. Since welfare-state capitalist regimes do not aim at reciprocity, they do not encourage it or educate citizens into it. WS* therefore cannot realize the central value of justice as fairness even if it satisfies the difference principle and, indeed, even if it happens that opportunities are fairly accessible and the political liberties have fair value. Even then WS*, like societies which are "just throughout", falls short of being perfectly just.[35] It is, we might say, only "fortuitously just."

This response, in turn, opens Rawls to the final objection I want to consider: his reliance on ideal institutional descriptions -- and, in particular, his reliance on an ideal-type of welfare-state capitalism -- blinds him to the possibility that there is no one best explanation, evident intention, or public aim of the policies and institutions of welfare-state capitalism. And so these regimes are hybrids, some of whose features do attempt to realize the aims of property-owning democracy even if other features have welfarist aims instead. Rawls's reliance on an ideal-type of welfare-state capitalism leads him to impose a specious unity on its aims, and his criticisms miss the mark.

Rawls's failure to consider the possibility of hybrid-regimes will seem an especially troublesome omission if the characteristic aims of property-owning democracy can only be realized by an economic system that combines the institutions of property-owning democracy with some measures found in the welfare state. Meade's own best regime seems to be thoroughly hybridized.[36] Indeed, there is one place where Rawls himself seems to concede the need for hybridization, albeit parenthetically.[37] The objection that justice as fairness can only be realized in a hybrid regime was pressed quite forcefully by Richard Krouse and Michael McPherson in their classic paper on property-owning democracy in TJ, though to make the objection they had to draw the distinction between property-owning democracy and welfare-state capitalism much more clearly than Rawls thought he had in that book. Rawls's introduction of ideal institutional descriptions in Restatement helped to draw that distinction with much greater exactness than he had previously. But the price of clarity might seem to be conceding the ground on which Krouse and McPherson's objection rested.

The necessity of a hybrid regime is pressed quite powerfully by O'Neill in "Free (and Fair) Markets without Capitalism: Political Values, Principles of Justice, and Property-Owning Democracy." (p. 92) O'Neill also argues, quite compellingly, that some of the aims of property-owning democracy -- the fair value of the political liberties and fair equality of opportunity -- have been taken up by welfare-states, and with great success. He thinks that this fact weakens Rawls's criticisms of welfare-state capitalism quite considerably, since it shows that only the difference principle argument for property-owning democracy -- and not the arguments from political liberty or equality of opportunity -- establishes the necessity of an alternative to welfare capitalism. Moreover, insofar as Rawls's criticisms of welfare-state capitalism target its ideal-type, the successes of actual welfare states in meeting some of those criticisms demonstrate the weakness of Rawls's method. (p. 92) But O'Neill also thinks these successes show an important and encouraging political point: the aims of property-owning democracy could be realized gradually, if actual welfare states adopt increasingly egalitarian measures. (p. 92)

O'Neill's political point is a most welcome one. It dovetails nicely with what Simone Chambers calls the "take-home message" of her essay and forms a natural lead-in to the closing essays, which talk in detail about how a just society might be brought about. But what of O'Neill's objection to Rawls's claim that some alternative to welfare-state capitalism is necessary to realize justice as fairness, and the related objection to Rawls's reliance on ideal institutional descriptions?

I think that the right responses to these objections would begin by distinguishing economic systems that have a unitary aim that they realize by combining features of property-owning democracy and welfare-state capitalism, from those that combine features of two or more regime types because they do not have any one aim. O'Neill argues that justice as fairness can only be realized by a hybrid of the former kind. Welfare states as we know them -- including the welfare states that O'Neill says have had some success in insuring fair value of political liberty and fair equality of opportunity -- are arguably hybrids of the latter kind.

Even if O'Neill is right about the kind of regime Rawls should have endorsed, the soundness of his point would not require a major concession on Rawls's part -- as it would if property-owning democracy were, as O'Neill and Williamson contend in their introduction, "a central idea in Rawls's entire theory of justice". (p. 6) For while Rawls may, as O'Neill and Williamson observe, be "determin[ed] to find a different way to organize a modern economy" (p. 6), the point he really wants to make about how modern economies should be organized does not stand or fall with his claim that property-owning democracy (or liberal socialism) "seems necessary". The point is that modern economies should be organized, and publicly known to be organized, so as to realize the systematically unified aims of justice as fairness. Rawls discusses political economy in TJ, and introduces the idea of property-owning democracy there, to make that point.

We might think that that point had already been gained by the end of TJ, Part I with the adoption of the two principles in the original position. But the justification of the principles is not complete until we see in Part II how they might be institutionalized and until we see in Part III whether, once institutionalized, they would stabilize themselves. And so Rawls introduces property-owning democracy as part of the larger argument of TJ, Parts II and III so that we can see quite clearly whether the aims of justice as fairness -- and, in particular, the difference principle -- are in reflective equilibrium with our considered judgments.[38] The conclusion for which he is ultimately arguing in his discussion of political economy, and which supports his claim about how modern economies should be organized, is that it is. What really matters for supporting that conclusion is that the institutions necessary to realize justice as fairness are appealing or at least do not strike us as unjust, not that they conform as strictly to the definition of property-owning democracy. If it can be argued persuasively -- and I think O'Neill has argued persuasively -- that just economic systems would have to be hybrids with a unitary aim, I think Rawls would regard any needed amendments as friendly.

Thus, Rawls's failure to consider the first kind of hybrid does not ground a telling objection to the argument he wants to make. What of Rawls's alleged failure to consider a hybrid of the second kind? In fact Rawls did consider some such hybrids in TJ, namely those that are animated by what he referred to there as "mixed conceptions" of justice. The mixed conceptions he considers in TJ, like the second kind of hybrid regimes Rawls is now said to have overlooked, accept the need for equal rights and liberties but regulate the distribution of income and wealth by a combination of precepts not all of which are clearly derived from any one aim or principle. Greatly to compress: Rawls argues that in the absence of such a unified rationale, there is no way of explaining how the precepts or hybridized aims are to be weighted. But in that case, it is not at all obvious that the mixed conception is an alternative regime rather than one that spasmodically pursues the aims of justice as fairness even as it unintentionally obscures them. As Rawls says "in the absence of a procedure for assigning appropriate weights (or parameters), it is possible that the balance is actually determined by the principles of justice".[39] So the fact that welfare states as we know them may be hybrids of the second kind does not tell against Rawls's real point either.

* * * * * * * * * *

I conclude, then, that Rawls's reliance on what I called his "mixed method" is defensible, given his limited purposes. But if Rawls took up questions of political economy primarily to complete the justification of justice as fairness, those who grant that Rawls's two principles or other egalitarian principles are justified may be more interested in the questions of transition and implementation than he was.

Property-Owning Democracy includes a number of powerful essays devoted to these topics. David Schweickart builds on his previous work to argue that Rawls is wrong to put property-owning democracy and socialism on a par. In fact, he contends, his own version of a socialist regime -- which he calls "economic democracy" -- would better realize the demands of justice than even an enhanced property-owning democracy would. Gar Alperovitz argues for what he has called a "pluralist commonwealth" in previous work, a regime that shares the aims of property-owning democracy. He offers a number of proposals for realizing those aims, though he is pessimistic about large-scale fundamental change in the short run. Thad Williamson has two essays in the closing section; they betray somewhat more optimism than Alperovitz's. One lays out an agenda for realizing property-owning democracy in the United States over the next two decades. The other considers whether a politics aimed at such a transformation is viable. I have not engaged these essays because their arguments rest so heavily on claims outside philosophy, but they are challenging and valuable.

When Rawls observed that the inability to accept injustice is sometimes likened to an inability to accept death,[40] what he meant is that both injustice and death are sometimes treated as inevitable parts of human life to which the wise and the realistic accommodate themselves. He could have qualified the observation by adding that in both cases the appearance of realism may be illusory since accommodation is often abetted by denial. Denial of injustice is itself facilitated by the comfort of familiarity that even an unjust status quo offers to everyone and by the material comfort it offers to those of us who are among the fortunate. But as with mortality so with injustice, denial is also facilitated by the difficulty of imagining the alternatives. One of the many merits of Property-Owning Democracy is that the essays which make it up -- especially those that make up its last section -- relieve this poverty of imagination. This book may or may not offer realistic blueprints for a progressive politics that can succeed in our current circumstances, but its contributors provide sophisticated and salutary reminders of how very far the economic systems of western capitalism are from what justice demands.


[1] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1999), sections 41 and 42. I shall hereafter refer to this work as 'TJ'.

[2] For a list of writers who make this assumption, see Richard Krouse and Michael McPherson, "Capitalism, 'Property-Owning Democracy' and the Welfare State', Democracy and the Welfare State (Princeton University Press, 1988), pp. 79-106, p. 79 note 1.

[3] Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, (Harvard University Press, 1999), ed. Kelly, p. 136.

[4] Rawls, TJ, p. xiv note 6.

[5] See James Meade, Liberty, Equality and Efficiency (New York University Press, 1993), pp. 85-188. For justice as fairness as a realistic utopia, see John Rawls, The Law of Peoples(Harvard University Press, 1999), pp. 11-23.

[6] Rawls, Restatement, pp. 136-38.

[7] Rawls, Restatement, p. 137.

[8] Rawls, Restatement, p. 137.

[9] Rawls, TJ, p. 115.

[10] And Krouse and McPherson at "Capitalism, 'Property-Owning Democracy' and the Welfare State", p. 94.

[11] At Samuel Freeman, Justice and the Social Contract : Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2007), p. 103, Freeman seems to imply that what I have referred to as the philosophical rationale of a regime type is its Hegelian Idea. Freeman's discussion is quite illuminating, but the reference to Hegel suggests that more reflection is required to ascertain the aims of an economic system than is compatible with Rawls's description of those aims as public.

[12] Rawls, TJ, p. 429.

[13] See Max Weber, "The Meaning of 'Ethical Neutrality' in Sociology and Economics", The Methodology of the Social Sciences: Max Weber (NYU Press, 1949), eds. Shils and Finch, p. 90.

[14] Rawls, Restatement, pp. 149-50.

[15] Rawls, Restatement, p. 140.

[16] Rawls, TJ , pp. xiv-xv.

[17] Meade also seems to favor policies promoting widespread home-ownership; see Liberty, Equality, Efficiency, p. 67. Rawls would presumably agree, provided the mechanisms for financing widespread home-ownership are not inimical to the health of the economy. For a brief but interesting discussion of this question, see the interview with Yale economist Robert Shiller  (accessed July 10, 2013).

[18] Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[19] Rawls, Restatement, p. 140 (emphasis added).

[20] See Meade, Liberty, Equality, Efficiency, p. 41 and Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[21] Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[22] See TJ, pp. 65-73.

[23] Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[24] Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[25] Meade seems to agree though he is given pause by the complexities; see Liberty, Equality, Efficiency, pp. 55ff.

[26] Rawls, Restatement, p. 122.

[27] Rawls, TJ, pp. 229-31.

[28] Krouse and McPherson, "Capitalism, 'Property-Owning Democracy' and the Welfare State", pp. 100-101.

[29] Paul Weithman, "Legitimacy and the Project of Rawls's Political Liberalism", to appear in Rawls's Political Liberalism (Columbia University Press, forthcoming), eds. Brooks and Nussbaum.

[30] As Kevin Vallier is now doing in some unpublished work he has graciously made available to me.

[31] Rawls, Restatement, p. 137.

[32] Freeman, Justice and the Social Contract, pp. 106-8.

[33] Rawls, Restatement, pp. 178-79.

[34] This response is suggested by a remark at p. 2 of Alan Thompson and Thad Williamson, "Introduction" to a symposium on property-owning democracy in The Good Society, Volume 21, Number 1, 2012. The response is very helpfully spelled out by O'Neill in his contribution; see p. 88.

[35] For this contrast, see Rawls, TJ, p. 68.

[36] See the passage cited by Krouse and McPherson at "Capitalism, 'Property-Owning Democracy' and the Welfare State", p. 99 note 34. Note further that in Meade's ideal the state owns 50% of society's productive wealth; see Liberty, Equality, Efficiency, p. 94, which gives his ideal a socialist element. The vesting of so large a portion of capital in public hands would allow the hybrid regime to enjoy one of the advantages Meade thought socialism enjoys over property-owning democracy: it can build up savings without onerous taxes, provided it runs a surplus; see Liberty, Equality, Efficiency, p. 61.

[37] Rawls, Restatement, p. 139.

[38] Rawls, TJ, p. 168.  This reading of Rawls's argument also explains his puzzling remark in the preface to TJ: "To see the full force of the difference principle it should be taken in the context of property-owning democracy (or of a liberal socialist regime) and not a welfare state". (Rawls, TJ, p. xv)  The first reaction to this remark may be that by the point in TJ at which Rawls introduces property-owning democracy, his intention must surely be to show the difference principle is to be implemented and not to show its force. On my reading, this reaction depends upon a misreading.

[39] Rawls, TJ, p. 281.

[40] Rawls, TJ, p. 87.