Brian O'Connor


Brian O'Connor, Adorno, Routledge, 2013, 219pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415367363.

Reviewed by James Gordon Finlayson, University of Sussex

Hegel, a writer of brilliant introductions, knew that they posed peculiar difficulties. Some of these were due to the absolute pretensions of systematic philosophy, but not all. Introductions, like beginnings, as the German saying goes, are difficult. A good book may not be a good introduction. Anyone who has read Gillian Rose's brilliant The Melancholy Science: An Introduction to the Thought of Theodor W. Adorno (or, for that matter, Adorno's own Introduction to the Sociology of Music) will know this.

Introductions such as Brian O'Connor's Adorno (the latest in The Routledge Philosophers series) are a genre in their own right with their proper demands. One task is to initiate non-expert readers into the world of Adorno, and to make it accessible to the non-specialist without oversimplifying. Another is to give readers an overview of Adorno's entire work situating each aspect of it in relation to the others. O'Connor meets these demands deftly.

Writing an introduction to a thinker such as Adorno, whose writing is dense and difficult, and whose thought is set out unsystematically and diffused across a number of different texts that do not form a whole, is challenging in particular ways. Just consider the range of subjects his writing embraces: music, philosophy, sociology, literature, psychoanalysis, German politics and society. Though not the grandest polymath of his era, Adorno is nonetheless one of several European public intellectuals of the 20th Century with wide cultural horizons.

O'Connor's philosophical interpretation of Adorno centres on the latter's notion of experience, and the excellent chapters 3 and 4 (on Experience and Metaphysics, respectively) focus on ideas that radiate into all corners of his work. He bases his interpretation for the most part on Adorno's major published works of philosophy, Negative DialecticsMinima Moralia, the post-humously published Aesthetic Theory, and the co-authored Dialectic of Enlightenment, but leavens his interpretation with references to the radio broadcasts, lecture series, letters, and other important studies and essays. At a pinch, one might have asked for more engagement with Adorno's essays on music and the musical monographs in the long sixth chapter on Adorno's aesthetics, but otherwise nothing is missing.

O'Connor's style is careful, mercifully jargon-free, and nicely suited to the genre. He is not seduced into emulating Adorno's scintillating style, and he handles Adorno's abstruse concepts with insight and dexterity. There is no need for a book on Adorno to read like Adorno's philosophy, as some do. Indeed there is reason for them not to: Adorno's own work is difficult enough. The pitch of this work is well-judged. It will be of interest to experts on Adorno as well as to students encountering his work for the first time. The only caveat I would make is that the chapter summaries were awkwardly repetitious and unnecessary since the arguments of each chapter were clearly set out. This format is a feature of the series and not the author's fault, but it seems more appropriate to a textbook, which this is not.

O'Connor resists the temptation of trying to make Adorno relevant to contemporary philosophy by drawing comparisons with currently fashionable philosophies in other traditions, be it American pragmatism, post-modernism, Wittgensteinianism, or semantic inferentialism. This is not to disparage such attempts. At their best they can be imaginative and illuminating. But they are fraught with dangers, and at their worst can result in idle and superficial comparisons. An introduction to Adorno is anyway not the place to take such risks, and O'Connor does not. Instead, he draws judiciously on thinkers who had a demonstrable influence on Adorno: Hegel, Kant, Nietzsche, Freud and his contemporaries Lukács and Benjamin, and he introduces background material sparingly, only when relevant to the point at hand. Though not as broad and rich in scholarship as, say, Simon Jarvis's book, it has a sharper focus on what O'Connor takes to be the central philosophical concerns of Adorno.

Another requirement of an introduction is to position itself in the field of interpretation. Unlike the writer of a scholarly monograph, who aims at originality by defending a new view or resurrecting an unfashionable one, the writer of an introduction will often provide an account of the philosopher in question that is indicative of the field of interpretation or broadly representative of it. O'Connor's is no exception. His is an Adorno that most people with a decent knowledge of the primary texts and the secondary literature would recognize. To pull this off though, as we will see, he has to tiptoe around some of issues that divide critics and commentators without ignoring them.

O'Connor begins by noting that Adorno saw himself as belonging to a generation who "grew up in violent rebellion against the very concept of philosophical systems, and whose entire way of thinking was defined by that rebellion" (p.14). It was the only kind of violent rebellion he felt comfortable with, and that he thought appropriate to inspire in others. As befitted his critical cast of mind, Adorno was a masterly writer of essays, reviews and articles. Most of the philosophical writings he prepared for publication took the form of essays, fragments, aphorisms, or thematic arrangements of material falling under no established philosophical genre, and which, when he had a mind to, he called "concepts" or "models;" and he explicitly contrasts these genres to the philosophical theory or treatise. Adorno described his magnum opus, Negative Dialectics, the work in which he gives the most sustained and thorough account of his philosophical views, as a kind of philosophical "anti-system" (p. 14). This was not just a matter of philosophical inclination. He came up with various justifications for why philosophy qua critical theory should resist its assimilation to theory and eschew formal modes of argumentation. Some of these justifications are more compelling than others, but all of them flow from his deep convictions: that the way modern subjects think and act is unavoidably influenced and determined by the patterns of constitution and self-constitution of the social world (in ways that are complex and obscure); that the social world is constituted by the ways in which modern subjects think and act; and, of course, that 20th Century Western capitalist society is deeply awry and ought to be otherwise.

Adorno's disavowal of theory poses a particularly thorny problem for the philosophical interpreter. Not all books on Adorno's philosophy are and aim to be themselves works of philosophy, that is, philosophically informed works which display the distinctive virtues of philosophical exposition and argument. There are many excellent books about Adorno's philosophy that are not works of philosophy, but rather of intellectual history, literary theory, musicology, sociology and cultural studies, each with their distinctive perspective and approach, not to mention the recent slew of biographies. These all have their place in the effective history of Adorno's thought, and their disciplinary diversity stands as a testament to its richness.

I make this point not because I hold the philosophical literature on Adorno in higher esteem than the sociological, musicological, or literary, but because any book that aims to be philosophical, over and above the fact that it is about philosophical matters, faces a peculiar difficulty. A philosophical interpretation of an author's work, assuming that the author's commitment to her subject carries with it a measure of charity, will almost inevitably aim to provide an account that is coherent, true and justifiable in the light of current canons of philosophical respectability. By this I don't mean that the author means to make interpretative claims about Adorno that are coherent, true and justifiable, where such claims are justified or made true by the textual evidence. Every interpreter does that. I mean that philosophical interpreters impute to the author whose work they interpret an overall view that is coherent, justifiable and true. In other words, philosophical interpretations inevitably involve an element of reconstruction and justification of the interpreted author's position. (Henry E. Allison's first book on Kant is a good example of this kind of philosophical justification: Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense. Allison's subtitle makes explicit what I take to be a feature of all philosophical interpretation.)

The difficulty with providing such a philosophical interpretation of an avowedly anti-systematic thinker like Adorno is that the aim of the philosophical interpreter departs inevitably from the aim of the interpreted philosophy, for Adorno eschewed the kind of theorising and the kind of philosophical argumentation that is now virtually hegemonic in the discipline. Adorno believed that this tendency toward formal argumentation was unwelcome, and knew that his own work would be dismissed as inadequate in the light of it. "This inadequacy" he claims (with which his theory is convicted by philosophers):

resembles that of life, which describes a wavering, deviating line, disappointing by comparison with its premises, and yet which only in this actual course, always less than it should be, is able, under given conditions of existence, to represent an unregimented one.[1]

That said, Adorno's eschewal of certain kinds of theory, empirical social science, and formal argumentation is itself unsystematic. There is no sustained programme or method. Even Adorno's programmatic statements about how philosophy ought to be done, such as "In a philosophical text all the propositions ought to be equally close to the centre," have to be taken with a pinch of salt, since Adorno does not apply them consistently and does not try to. So one cannot claim either that Adorno's philosophical practice is at least consistent with his meta-philosophical view that (to put it crudely) logical validity and consistency, and empirical justifiability are never to be valued above individual insight.

This is why interpreting Adorno can be a frustrating experience for someone who wants to make philosophical sense of his work. (It is also why Habermas, doyen of the so-called second generation Frankfurt School critical theory, claimed that, in his view, when he was at the Institute for Social Research in the 1950s "there was no such thing as Critical Theory, there was no coherent doctrine."[2] He was right. Adorno does not so much give us a theory as he does a series of individual set pieces: essays, studies, monographs, speeches, lectures on various different subjects, etc. In this, Adorno resembles Lessing, Nietzsche, Kierkegaard and Benjamin much more than Kant and Hegel. Consequently, the attempt by the philosophical interpreter to saddle Adorno with a single, coherent theory crosses one of Adorno's purposes by ironing out the tensions that he deliberately puts in his philosophy, and filling in the gaps he leaves. In order to do this effectively, interpretative choices have to be made about which aspects of Adorno's work to make salient, which evidence to omit, and what to do about the conflicting passages where Adorno endorses discrepant views.

For example, O'Connor maintains that in Adorno's eyes "the nonidentical does not lie beyond us. It is not a mysterious transcendent otherness" (p. 15). Yet there are places in Adorno's work -- sections of Negative Dialectics entitled 'Concern of Philosophy' and 'Antagonistic Whole' spring to mind -- where Adorno seems to claim just the contrary.

O'Connor argues (consistently with the above) that Adorno is basically a Hegelian, with a Hegelian notion of experience, who embraces Hegel's notion of determinate negation as an articulation of the logical structure of his own negative dialectic (pp. 63, 65). Yet one can equally understand Adorno's critique of Hegel as implying a break not just from Hegel's system, but from Hegelian logic tout court, with all its conceptual apparatus including the idea of determinate negation. This is particularly keenly expressed in the some of the Lectures on Negative Dialectics and the section of Negative Dialectics entitled 'Critique of Positive Negation.' It is difficult to see how Adorno can help himself to Hegel's idea of determinate negation and to the statement that Hegel's system would collapse "without the principle that to negate negation is positive."[3]

Thirdly, O'Connor claims that Adorno's dialectical method (broadly speaking), or his approach to the object of his criticism, is one of "immanent critique" understood as a criticism of the coherence of a society's self-conception on the basis of "values it would recognize as its own" (p. 46). And immanent critique is not just a style of philosophizing, it is equally a way of being, a practice that is central to Adorno's ethos of autonomy qua resistance (p. 135). As a devotee of immanent criticism, he eschews transcendent criticism, glossed by O'Connor as criticism that adopts a "perspective that is alien to the position criticized" (p. 50).

But the matter it is not clear cut. On the one hand, Adorno claims immanent criticism as his method (one he avowedly inherits from Hegel). On the other hand, particularly in his later work but also in some of the work from the 1950s, Adorno draws the consequence of his view that the context of immanence just is the context of delusion that philosophy must aim to escape, that a merely immanent criticism of society is neither possible nor desirable, because there are no available standards of criticism that are not contaminated by a society which, by Adorno's own lights, is "totally administered" and radically and pervasively evil, as Auschwitz showed.

In making each of these claims, O'Connor is in line with the majority of commentators on Adorno. Furthermore, each of these views can be consistently maintained alongside the others, and thus slot into the unified and coherent view attributed to him. And O'Connor can rest all these lines of interpretation on textual evidence, for there are plenty of passages where Adorno explicitly embraces the position attributed to him.

The trouble is that there are plenty of other passages where Adorno maintains the opposite, and these cannot easily be interpreted away. What does one do about the contrary passages? Generally the tactic of the philosophical interpreter is to ignore them or, where they are too glaring to be ignored, to re-interpret them on an ad hoc basis as a modification or complication of the coherent overall view. This is what O'Connor does with, say, Adorno's remark in "Cultural Criticism and Society" that neither a merely immanent criticism nor a merely transcendent criticism of society is acceptable. According to O'Connor, Adorno does not give up the requirement that criticism should be based on standards "internal to" the criticised society, and should not adopt an alien perspective. Rather, he adds the thought that criticism also must release or realise the immanent potential of the criticised society to be different from what it presently is. As a matter of fact I'm not convinced that the twin difficulties for the standard view of Adorno as a friend and practitioner of immanent criticism and an enemy of transcendent criticism can be so easily finessed. O'Connor's interpretation does nothing to allay Adorno's worries about the very possibility of immanent criticism, nor does it do justice to Adorno's remark that under the circumstances transcendent critique should not be prematurely rejected, which flows from his wider concern with transcendence and redemption in his late work.

Still, O'Connor does his readers the service of alerting them to the tensions in Adorno's conceptions of "immanence" and "transcendence" that complicate the standard view. His defence of the standard view is nuanced and alert to potential objections. And it is unfair to complain that O'Connor does not resolve these difficulties in this work, where he has plainly succeeded in his aim of writing an excellent philosophical introduction to Adorno. To some extent, the genre of introductions and the demands of philosophical interpretation are at fault here. The aims of achieving broad representation of the field and of giving a plausible and coherent account of the author's ideas militate against the task of doing justice to a body of work so diverse, refractory and resistant to philosophical interpretation as Adorno's. For the most part, O'Connor has the upper hand, and succeeds in his aims. But it is noticeable that, in the chapter on Freedom and Morality, he decides not to try to corral the various different and discrepant things that Adorno says about morality and moral theory into a coherent position, but to merely lay them out. In this instance O'Connor is right to opt for discretion rather than valour. There just is no consensus on what conception of morality Adorno endorses, or whether he is a moralist at all, and the very attempt at a philosophical interpretation and defence of his moral views would depart so much from Adorno's remarks that the resulting ideas would scarcely be recognizable as his.

[1] Adorno, Minima Moralia, trans. E. F. N. Jephcott (London: Verso, 1991), p. 81. See also p. 71.

[2] Stefan Müller-Doohm,  Adorno: A Biography, trans. R. Livingstone, (Cambridge: Polity Press, 2005), p. 579.

[3] Adorno, Negative Dialectics, trans. E.B. Ashton (New York: Routledge, 1973), p. 160.