Stephen Stich

Collected Papers, Volume 2: Knowledge, Rationality, and Morality

Stephen Stich, Collected Papers, Volume 2:  Knowledge, Rationality, and Morality, 1978-2010, Oxford University Press, 2012, 415pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199733477.

Reviewed by Rasmus Grønfeldt Winther, University of California, Santa Cruz

Volume 2 of Stephen Stich's Collected Papers is a useful selection of 15 papers that have been important and controversial in analytic philosophy. Perhaps now that they have been collected, they may become more influential in other relevant disciplines, including psychology, sociology, and anthropology, and perhaps even business and law. In general, Stich argues that information about the architecture and dynamics of cognition emerging from surveys, fMRIs, psychiatric studies, and ethnographies has deep repercussions for epistemology and ethics, and analytic philosophers ignore such information at their peril. Put differently, philosophers should take seriously the fact that Homo sapiens' inferential rules and moral judgments are constrained by, and supervene on, our cognitive make-up, itself sensitive to cultural context. Stich's concern is not just that the dynamics and diversity of cognition inflect actual knowledge and morality, but also that they affect the legitimacy and justification -- i.e., the very rationality -- of knowledge claims and moral principles.

Regarding his methodology, Stich is an innovator of experimental philosophy and avidly engages in "collaborative philosophy" (though perhaps more in an intradisciplinary fashion than in an interdisciplinary one, since most of the fourteen (!) collaborators in this volume are philosophers; all collaborators are listed at the end of this review). More importantly, this volume shows the fruits of developing a philosophy responsible to a wide variety of empirical studies (not just the surveys typical of experimental philosophy), and responsive to collaborations beyond "our" culture, i.e., the culture of "the typical analytic philosopher, who is white, western, high SES [socioeconomic status] and has lots of philosophical training" ("Meta-Skepticism," Chapter 10, p. 241). Indeed, Stich points the way towards a philosophical methodology appropriate for today's scientific and collaborative academic climate.

This volume gives us a new map of philosophy. Here we see one way of putting people as complex, willful, limited, and real cognitive agents back into analytical philosophy. To paraphrase Rorty, Stich's title could have been "Cognitive Science as a Mirror of Philosophy." That is, Stich's empirical studies and theoretical insights are a mirror for philosophers to look into and observe the unseemly image of our overly and inappropriately abstracted, idealized, and reified notions of reason and reasoning agents. For a richer and more accurate cartography of the terrain of "knowledge, rationality, and morality" (the volume's subtitle), philosophy needs empirical studies -- cognitive science, psychiatry, social psychology, anthropology, and medicine.

Given the depth and importance of many ideas in Stich's book, it will be most effective to organize a review not in an article-by-article book report format, but with respect to general themes. Four particularly important and influential themes are: (1) Cognitive diversity, (2) Biases and heuristics in reasoning, (3) Psychological foundations of morality, and (4) Philosophical methodology.

1. Cognitive Diversity

Cognition may operate differently, and be subject to distinct rules and principles of justification, in different cultural and social contexts. Stich is partial to the possibility that "some of our cognitive processes are shared by all normal humans, while others are a part of our cultural heritage." (p. 68) Indeed, the theme of cognitive diversity stemming from differences in culture, socioeconomic status (SES), and even number of philosophy courses taken (i.e., Hypotheses 1-3, pp. 168, 230) does crucial work in a variety of arguments, including:

I. A critique of the putative universal power of skepticism, and of the alleged universality of intuitions underlying skepticism, such as a single univocal knowledge/belief distinction ("Meta-Skepticism," Chapter 10)

II. A debunking of reflective equilibrium (Nelson Goodman, John Rawls, Laurence Jonathan Cohen) -- because, after all, whose inferential principles and, more abstractly, whose "concept of inferential justification" (p. 77), should we use and appeal to in characterizing reflective equilibrium -- the "folk" of "folk theory," analytic philosophers, Westerners in general, or East Asians or Yanomamis? ("Reflective Equilibrium, Analytic Epistemology, and the Problem of Cognitive Diversity," Chapter 4)

III. Contra ethical realists, such as Peter Railton and Richard Boyd, a defense of the irreducibility, even under ideal conditions, of rational moral disagreement ("As a Matter of Fact," Chapter 11)

Again, cognitive diversity is central to each of these arguments.

As detailed in the introduction to the volume, Richard Nisbett's social psychological and anthropological research program influenced Stich's thinking tremendously (the entire volume is dedicated to Nisbett). Nisbett's work provides a sustained interrogation of cognitive diversity. One empirical result worth summarizing is the "large and systematic differences between East Asians and westerners on a long list of quite basic cognitive processes including perception, attention and memory." (229) Most generally put, East Asians think "holistically," westerners "analytically." Holistic thought is oriented towards context -- the relations between object and its contextual field are central to practices of explanation and prediction. In contrast, analytical thought is individualistic -- objects are detached from their context, and predictions and explanations are articulated in terms of categorical properties of these objects (e.g., Nisbett et al. 2001). Stich's "jaw dropped" upon hearing of this work (p. 11). Despite Stich's often cautious language regarding cognitive diversity throughout the volume (e.g., "more than a mere possibility," p. 229; "might be expected," p. 267), the investigations of Nisbett and his collaborators in particular gave Stich a much-needed proof of concept that cognitive diversity is actual and real, and not just possible and hypothetical.

The theme of cognitive diversity concerns prescription of inference as much as description of reasoning: "if there can be cultural variation in reasoning strategies and other cognitive processes, there can also be cultural variation in the evaluative concepts used to assess reasoning." (p. 8) Stich's defense of the cultural inflection of epistemic and moral justification is controversial. Indeed, his careful and evidence-based cultural relativism has been critiqued (e.g., Goldman 1991, Dretske 1992, both reviews of Stich 1990), but the evidence of cognitive diversity is significant and should not be ignored. Whether this evidence can be downplayed, and whether theoretical arguments in favor of universal standards of truth and justification might prevail in the face of (multi-)cultural relativism, is an ongoing discussion in which Stich's work is heavily involved (e.g., Boghossian 2006, Lloyd 2010).

2. Biases and heuristics in reasoning

The ideal of a single, universal rationality looms large in philosophy, if not always explicitly. Just think of the ongoing Kantian project, in epistemology, ethics, and metaphysics at large (e.g., Michael Friedman, Christine Korsgaard). If Stich's research into cognitive diversity fragments this project into "clusters of rationality," then his study of the consequences of the biases and heuristics research program of, most prominently, Amos Tversky and Daniel Kahneman, identifies the potential break-down of rationality (even of Western, scientific rationality). To speak somewhat metaphorically, while cognitive diversity sub-divides rationality horizontally, biases and heuristics problematize rationality's vertical depth (e.g., its explanatory power, utility, and inferential consistency and justification).

The basic thesis of the biases and heuristics in reasoning literature is that typical human agents, and even experts, make systematic reasoning errors, particularly with respect to the laws of logic, and the laws of probability. For instance, typical (and even expert) reasoners ignore base rates and the law of regression to the mean (p. 41), engage in fallacies such as the gambler's fallacy (p. 40) and the conjunction fallacy (pp. 116-7), and are very often subject to framing effects (pp. 270-1). According to Kahneman, the birth of his collaboration with Tversky was in a guest lecture Tversky gave in Kahneman's 1969 seminar at the Hebrew University in Jerusalem. Tversky framed the overarching question of his research project to Kahneman's students, roughly, in the following way:

Are people good intuitive statisticians? We already knew that people are good intuitive grammarians: at age four a child effortlessly conforms to the rules of grammar as she speaks, although she has no idea that such rules exist. Do people have a similar intuitive feel for the basic principles of statistics? (Kahneman 2011, p. 5)

After a few years of collaborative research, Kahneman and Tversky wrote the following oft-cited sentence:

In making predictions and judgments under uncertainty, people do not appear to follow the calculus of chance or the statistical theory of prediction. Instead, they rely on a limited number of heuristics which sometimes yield reasonable judgments and sometimes lead to severe and systematic errors. (Kahneman and Tversky 1973, p. 327)

Four decades of research (and at least one Nobel Prize) later, this research tradition has produced strong evidence any philosopher interested in reasoning and inference would do well to consider.

Stich explores many of the numerous questions raised by this rich empirical tradition, including the following.

Explaining the data. Whence these systematic reasoning errors? Do we humans have our own universally flawed but contextually effective "psycho-logic," or are our errors merely "performance" rather than "competence" errors (employing a Chomskyian distinction), thereby saving the rationality of our reasoning rules? That is, are we lazy and sloppy thinkers (the "bleak implication view"), or might the rationality of our reasoning capacities be saved by appealing to a wide variety of "modules," honed by natural selection early in hominid evolution to effectively deploy logical and statistical rules in contextual cases (the "Panglossian" evolutionary psychological "massive modularity hypothesis," backed by evidence from the Wason selection task, which we are terrible at in some contexts, but excel at in others)? Might there even be a third alternative, recognizing the compatibility of the biases and heuristics literature with the evolutionary psychology research traditions, which can perhaps even identify other sorts of general reasoning errors? And is there still some irreducible disagreement between the two main alternatives, such as Gerd Gigerenzer's frequentism and Kahneman and Tversky's Bayesianism (pp. 216-220)? (See "Rethinking Rationality" and "Ending the Rationality Wars," Chapters 7 and 9 respectively.)

Non-human epistemology? Might the light shed on "human epistemology" by the biases and heuristics research tradition pertain, in content or in methodology, to pragmatic concerns with "programmability" and "android epistemology," or vice-versa? (See "Naturalizing Epistemology," Chapter 6, especially section 6.) Might a (non-human) "animal epistemology," or cognitively diverse "animal epistemologies," be possible (e.g., Schusterman et al. 2003).

Framing effects. How might framing effects impact the outcome of thought experiments in explicit ethical analysis (pp. 271-2), and meta-reflectively, perhaps even in survey design of experimental philosophy itself? Moving outside of Stich's frame, but, I hope, not unjustifiably so: if framing effects make the same situation appear differently, and given that "moral properties of a situation supervene on the nonmoral properties" (p. 89), might heuristic reasoning have consequences for ethical (and political) deliberation?

Stich and collaborators have made important, indeed even revolutionary, progress on many of these questions concerning the biases and heuristics in reasoning research tradition. Yet, some questions about reasoning and rationality remain unanswered, and surely many remain unasked.

3. Psychological foundations of morality

This is probably the most complex and speculative theme, pertaining to the ideas presented in the last four chapters of the book. This theme concerns, for instance, whether there is an important difference between moral and conventional rules. Typically, moral rules have been deemed objective and general, and violating them is a serious offence and often involves harming a victim. By contrast, conventional rules are understood as arbitrary, situation-dependent, and local, and violating them is a non-serious offence and does not strongly hurt the victim ("Two Theories about the Cognitive Architecture Underlying Morality," Chapter 14, p. 331). Stich and his collaborators point to empirical evidence suggesting that, for example, many subjects believe that norms protecting persons from harm need not be general, thereby undermining the standard hypothesis of a "signature moral pattern" (itself contrasted with a "signature conventional pattern," p. 333). More generally, this and other kinds of evidence deployed by Stich undermine the very distinction between moral and conventional rules ("Harm, Affect, and the Moral/Conventional Distinction," Chapter 13). A different account of the psychological foundations of moral rules and deliberation thus seems required. Stich provides an alternative rich model of the innate mechanisms grounding "the acquisition and implementation of norms," which also accommodates intentional and explicit moral deliberation and judgment ("A Framework for the Psychology of Norms," Chapter 12, especially Figure 12.3, p. 304; in Chapter 14 this model is called the "S&S model," named after the two authors of Chapter 12, Chandra Sekhar Sripada and Stich). Perhaps partly as a case study of his model of the psychological foundations of moral beliefs, decisions, and behavior, Stich explores the social psychology of altruism in the last chapter of the book ("Altruism," Chapter 15). His analysis is heavily influenced by Daniel Batson's psychological work, in particular by the idea of the important role empathy plays in motivating altruistic behavior. Moreover, Stich is critical of Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson's "evolutionary arguments for altruism" (pp. 357-368). The overarching lesson of these chapters is that our morality is grounded in cohesive and complex psychological machinery.

More could and should be said about the last third of this book. However, I hesitate to do so for two reasons. First, because collaboration with an ethicist seems itself called for in writing this review. Second, and more seriously, the papers on morality, while replete with strong evidence of the kinds of moral decisions and judgments people make (cognitive diversity plays less of a role in these studies than it perhaps should), seem weak in probative force for Stich's S&S model. Yes, Stich suggests an interesting, inspiring, and potentially fruitful model of our moral psychological machinery. But many other models are possible, and actual. Perhaps before engaging in further moral machinery "model-building," it might be best to ask why we are doing this and what we hope to achieve. In investigating mathematical and other kinds of models in the philosophy of science, we must always ask "what is this model for, is it effective at what it purports to do, and why should we care?" Asking such questions of the model proposed by Stich in this volume is beyond the scope of this review, but would be a worthwhile venture to carry out elsewhere.

4. Philosophical methodology

First, Stich's research program shows (rather than just tells) the benefits of collaboration. Ideas are tested, arguments enriched, and silliness and implausibility curbed in dialogue with intelligent collaborators. Admittedly most of Stich's collaborators are philosophers, which can be both advantageous (e.g., common language) and disadvantageous (e.g., limited perspectives). An increasing degree and depth of interdisciplinary collaboration might bear even more fruit insofar as philosophical tools could show relevant topics and fields, research questions and perspectives for further psychological, anthropological, or linguistic research (e.g., cross-cultural ethics, identification of modes of abstraction in language and in science). Philosophy affects the methodology of other disciplines.

Conversely, other disciplines affect core philosophical methodology. In conjunction with rich empirical research including, but not limited to, surveys, interdisciplinary collaboration might shed light on the limitations of canonical philosophical methodology. For example, conceptual analysis could very well turn out to be inappropriately fragile and contextual. If the extensions of normative concepts (e.g., justice, honor, duty) indeed turn out to be categorized in a "family resemblance" (Ludwig Wittgenstein) or "prototype" (e.g., Eleanor Rosch) manner, then standard conceptual analysis decomposing concepts in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions will fail ("Moral Philosophy and Mental Representation," Chapter 5). Second, reflective equilibrium will not have the universal normative force it is typically taken to have if, as discussed above, cultural variation exists (i) in reasoning competence, on analogy with linguistic variation (e.g., "Justification and the Psychology of Human Reasoning," Chapter 2 and "Could Man be an Irrational Animal?," Chapter 3) and (ii) in epistemic intuitions regarding knowledge and truth, intuitions plumbed by, for instance, running Gettier-type cases on experimental subjects of diverse cultural backgrounds (e.g., "Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions," Chapter 8). In short, these are two examples of how empirically-based interdisciplinary collaboration may force us philosophers to rethink and retool cherished methods.

Indeed, anyone interested in the development, dynamics, form, function, testing and justification of abstract representations, whether in scientific theory, as ethical principles, political injunctions, or linguistic structures, would benefit from taking Stich's critiques of standard philosophical analytical tools (e.g., reflective equilibrium and conceptual analysis) quite seriously. (In good pragmatic spirit, it seems hubristic, ahistorical, and disciplinarily insular to envision philosophical methodology as immortal. We learn to learn, especially in philosophy.)

Pragmatism is a time-honored tradition and attitude. Consulting Hacking (2007) makes it evident that one need not be a follower of C. S. Peirce, William James, or John Dewey, or even of C. I. Lewis or G. H. Mead, to be a pragmatist, or at least to be someone who adopts a pragmatic attitude. Such an attitude includes fallibilism, a general deflationary attitude towards "big questions" concerning realism and the nature of truth, an interest in scientific and hands-on work (naturalism is perhaps a concept too-contested to deploy here), an insistence that philosophy should be relevant, and an aim at generative intervention in intellectual investigations and social life. Stich is a self-professed pragmatist as evidenced by the subtitle of Chapter 6 ("Quine, Simon, and the Prospects for Pragmatism"), and of his 1990 book. He is not a follower of any of the founders of Pragmatism, but his philosophical methodology is suffused by a clear and non-psychologistic pragmatic attitude. Given the important and legitimate place of ontology, formal syntax, and semantics in contemporary analytic philosophy, Stich's intelligent and subtle pragmatism (with a small "p") is a welcome, and potentially collaborative, counterpoint.

This book deserves to be read by anyone interested in the methodology, psychology, and value of philosophy. While it may be too subtle for an undergraduate course (exceptions exist, of course), it would make an excellent text in practically any graduate seminar on ethics and political philosophy, epistemology, and philosophy of mind, language, or cognitive science, and should be at least recommended reading in seminars on analytic metaphysics, philosophy of science, and philosophy of law.



(10 of 15 papers are co-authored)

Michael Bishop (Chapter 9); John M. Doris (Chapters 11 and 15); Serena J. Eng (Chapter 13); Daniel M. T. Fessler (Chapter 13); Kevin J. Haley (Chapter 13); Daniel Kelly (Chapters 13 and 14); Shaun Nichols (Chapters 8 and 10); Richard E. Nisbett (Chapter 2); Erica Roedder (Chapter 15); Richard Samuels (Chapters 7 and 9); Chandra Sekhar Sripada (Chapter 12); Patrice D. Tremoulet (Chapter 7); Jonathan M. Weinberg (Chapters 8 and 10)


Cory Knudson, Alexis Mourenza, Richard Otte, and David Sosa critiqued earlier versions of this review.


Boghossian, P. A. 2006. Fear of Knowledge: Against Relativism and Constructivism. New York: Oxford University Press.

Dretske, F. 1992. "The Fragility of Reason." Dialogue 31: 311-20.

Goldman, A. I. 1991. "Stephen Stich, The Fragmentation of Reason," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 51: 189-193.

Hacking, I. 2007. "On Not Being a Pragmatist: Eight Reasons and a Cause." In: New Pragmatists, C. Misak (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 32-49.

Kahneman, D. 2011. Thinking, Fast and Slow. New York: Farrar, Straus, and Giroux.

Kahneman, D. and A. Tversky. 1973. On the Psychology of Prediction. Psychological Review 80: 237-51.

Lloyd, G. E. R. 2010. "History and Human Nature: Cross-cultural Universals and Cultural Relativities." Interdisciplinary Science Reviews 35: 201-14.

Nisbett, R, K. Peng, I. Choi, and A. Norenzayan. 2001. "Culture and Systems of Thought: Holistic versus Analytic Cognition." Psychological Review 108 (2): 291-310.

Schusterman, R. J., Reichmuth Kastak, C., and Kastak, D. 2003. "Equivalence Classification as an Approach to Social Knowledge: From Sea Lions to Simians." In: Animal Social Complexity: Intelligence, Culture, and Individualized Societies, F. B. M De Waal and P. L. Tyack (eds.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 179-206.

Stich, S. 1990. The Fragmentation of Reason: Preface to a Pragmatic Theory of Cognitive Evaluation. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/MIT Press.