2013.08.16

Jack Reynolds

Chronopathologies: Time and Politics in Deleuze, Derrida, Analytic Philosophy, and Phenomenology

Jack Reynolds, Chronopathologies: Time and Politics in Deleuze, Derrida, Analytic Philosophy, and Phenomenology, Lexington Books, 2012, 281pp., $79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739132814.

Reviewed by Marco Altamirano, Louisiana State University


One of the chief virtues of Reynolds' book is the compelling case it makes for bringing together the admittedly motley set of philosophies listed in the subtitle. By focusing on the conceptions of time at work in the various figures discussed in the book, Reynolds shows that time is not only a point of distinction between various strands of philosophy but also a point of potential convergence, where the relative merits and deficiencies of each can be addressed. The book consists of thirteen provocative and ambitious essays divided into three parts broadly treating analytic philosophy, poststructuralism, and phenomenology.

The first part begins with a survey of two rival views on time in analytic philosophy, presentism and eternalism. Presentism holds that only present entities are real, while eternalism holds that all past, present, and future moments of time, along with the entities they contain, are real (the past and the future are simply not presently existing). What interests Reynolds is not the different senses of reality that distinguish them, but rather the fact that both presentism and eternalism operate on a linear model of time where moments succeed one another. This linear model of time conceives of the past as 'presents' that have past, and the future as 'presents' that have not yet arrived. While configuring time as a successive series of 'nows' enjoys the benefit of making all of time calculable and measurable, Reynolds finds this clock model of time afflicted by a "chronopathology." Reynolds cites David Wood as coining this term to indicate a "disease of time" suggesting

that what Nietzsche diagnoses as ressentiment (a disgust for life that trades in negativity) is fundamentally a taking revenge against the fact that time passes. The major form that this ressentiment consists in is by artificially delimiting time and insisting upon the priority of the present, and this could include the invocation of a self-contained intuitive present, or an ahistorical calculative deduction. (27)

To be sure, it is not simply the linear model of time that constitutes chronopathology. Poststructuralist philosophies, for example, operate according to an altogether different model of time based on the incalculable future, but they are nonetheless afflicted by a chronopathology. The way Reynolds uses the term, then, the symptom of a chronopathology  seems to be the privileging or exclusive reliance on one model of time at the expense of others. But Reynolds wonders if the particular chronopathology of analytic philosophy of time reveals "an implicit philosophy of time underwriting some of the major methodological practices of analytic philosophy" in general. He concludes affirmatively that common sense and reflective equilibrium are precisely such methodological norms of analytic philosophy that configure time in terms of the present (28).

Reynolds argues for this conclusion by first providing a survey of analytic philosophers who endorse some form of common sense (he cites David Lewis in this regard, "never put forward a philosophical theory that you yourself cannot believe in your least philosophical and most commonsensical moments" (45); as well as Nicholas Rescher, "we transact our question-resolving business in a way that is harmonious with and does no damage to our pre-philosophical connections in matters of everyday life affairs and of scientific inquiry" (46)). Reynolds then notes that thought experiments have significant appeal for common sense, because they are conducted in order to test common sense judgments and thus help to clarify the basic principles at work in them. So the thought experiment seems to be a natural ally of rationality. But he worries that such a methodological tool betrays a philosophical conservatism that winds up relying upon the common sense position it emerged from, thereby begging the question. Similarly, Reynolds finds that Rawls' notion of reflective equilibrium, or the process of working back and forth between our moral intuitions and considered principles in order to arrive at a rational judgment, has become a methodological norm in much of analytic philosophy (52). But thought experiments and reflective equilibrium are tools of a common sense methodology that preemptively evaluates problems according to the criteria of solvability (55). For example, in the so-called prisoner's dilemma,

The many different social pressures and desires confronted by two bank robbers who have been caught and are faced with a bargaining situation are simplified into a grid of four possible outcomes. Likewise, Rawls' "veil of ignorance" scenario at times appears to reduce the problem of justice to a judgment between the distributive principles of utilitarianism, liberalism, and strict egalitarianism. In both of these cases problems are understood in a manner that restricts them to a determinate range of possible outcomes. (52)

Reynolds' basic concern is that analytic philosophy tames its problems by confronting them with a subject equipped with a set of values that can be called rational, but values that nonetheless dismiss anything in the problem that lies outside of their purview. Cast in terms of time, this amounts to tracing future or "possible outcomes" upon the outlines of the present (as if the present were the standard of the past and the future, as if there were no essential difference between the present, past, and future), affording little room for genuine change or novelty, thus amounting to a philosophical conservatism. Reynolds does not make this comparison, but it seems that his characterization of analytic philosophy as puzzle solving by assimilating different possibilities and counterfactuals amounts to doing "normal philosophy," after Kuhn's "normal science" in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions.

Throughout the first part, Reynolds uses critical resources from Deleuze in order to expose the limitations of the common sense methodology of analytic philosophy. With regard to time specifically, he correctly notes that Deleuze and Derrida are critical of the subordination of time to movement, that is, the clockwork formulation of time that measures time through some periodic movement. But Reynolds finds that Deleuze and Derrida both privilege the future through what he calls a "transcendental philosophy of time" (121). Thus, while the first part of Chronopathologies consists of a critique of analytic philosophy from the perspective of a certain poststructuralist philosophy of time, the second part of Chronopathologies consists of a critique of poststructuralist philosophy, not only from an analytic perspective on time, but also from a phenomenological account of "lived time."

Analytic and poststructuralist philosophies are, in Reynolds' view, diametrically opposed: whereas analytic philosophy maintains a conservative methodology aimed at preserving its own theoretical frameworks, Deleuze pursues creativity and change at the heart of ideas; whereas "Rawls insists that the principles of justice as fairness must attain a reflective equilibrium, Derrida contends that justice is always that which disrupts any equilibrium" (77). The Derridean judge, Reynolds tells us,

Needs to invent the law, for otherwise we could simply get a computer to dispense judicial punishments, paying no attention to the singularity of the participants and the event of transgression. In an important sense, a judge needs to exceed the letter of the law in order to be just, and this is the case even where mercy provisions are themselves enshrined in law, because those particular supplements to the law are also permanently susceptible to revision. At the same time, it remains the case that a judge cannot completely ignore the law, but must negotiate this tension and must, as Derrida enigmatically suggests, "negotiate the unnegotiable.". . . There is no end to this deconstruction, however, and justice does not arrive. (90)

In this fashion, Derrida's present moment is constituted by a different kind of moment altogether, namely, a future that does not arrive and, consequently, cannot be anticipated. This is the fulcrum of Derrida's playful employment of the French word for the future, l'avenir. And it constitutes, for Reynolds, a prioritizing of a "transcendental" temporality that disrupts the present, which he also finds in Deleuze, for whom "it is the future and the past that affect us; an openness to the future that necessarily resists our calculative entreaties and that immemorial past which cannot be represented as a totality" (26).

Reynolds spends the majority of the second part of the book discussing his reservations about Deleuze (although Deleuze and Derrida both feature prominently in all three parts). The focus of his concern is the notoriously complicated relation between the virtual and the actual, Deleuze's alternative concepts for the possible and the real. While acknowledging a reciprocal determination between the virtual and the actual, Reynolds detects a privilege (in Difference and Repetition and The Logic of Sense) of the "transcendental condition, the realm of the virtual," over the actual, which he seems to consider as a separate realm of material presence (120-121). Far from being an innocuous metaphysical arrangement, however, Reynolds worries that this privilege might constitute an injunction to engage in disruptive experiences: "is [Deleuze] tacitly committed to what we might call perverse impulses of fidelity to particular kinds of moments of expressivity of the Other, modes of living that have long held his attention in highly acute studies of sadism, masochism, schizophrenia, etc?" (134). Nonetheless, and perhaps fortunately, Reynolds suspects that it is difficult to extract any kind of normative ethics from Deleuze (121). Still, he finds that the role of the virtual in Deleuze is not only "ethically problematic" but also "extra-worldly" (114). This is, admittedly,

a strange and counter-intuitive consequence for a philosophy of immanence, and it seems to me that it arises from competing tendencies in Deleuze's work that are never satisfactorily resolved: that is, his post-Kantian philosophy of time and the transcendental (which intercedes intermittently in his ethics), and his immanent Spinozan ethics of immanence (which is avowedly also ontological), the latter of which should theoretically do away with the hierarchies that his transcendental philosophy of time tacitly depends on. (121)

Most readers of Deleuze would not find "competing tendencies" in his appraisal of Kantian transcendentalism and Spinozan immanence, at least with regard to immanence and transcendence, since Kant's transcendental project develops a purely immanent critique of reason exposing the illegitimate or transcendent uses of the faculty. In fact, Deleuze's endorsement of the virtual over the possible is an attempt to move Kant even further in the same direction toward immanence by bringing the conditions closer to the conditioned, examining real (virtual and transcendental) conditions of real, and not just possible, experience. However, on Reynolds' reading, the virtual or transcendental dimension of Deleuze's philosophy constitutes a transcendent element, which complicates his insistence on an immanent ethics. On this admittedly strange transcendent reading of the transcendental, Deleuze's ethics of immanence harbors a dilemma: transcendentally, it cannot ground itself on the exigencies of calculative reasoning about the empirical and actual states of affairs, but it outruns its very immanence when it attempts to compensate for this inadequacy by appealing to some "extra-worldly" virtual realm, ultimately constituting a "retreat into romanticism" (194).

The third part of Chronopathologies presents some conceptual resources for thinking of a pragmatic and embodied time drawn from figures in the phenomenological tradition such as Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Dreyfus. Reynolds seems at home discussing the tendency of the body toward equilibrium through a procedure that Dreyfus calls "skillful coping" (169). In a particularly illuminating example of an expert cricketer, Reynolds shows the remarkable adequacy of phenomenology to account for the living present that constitutes the expert poise of the professional athlete. There is neither a question of reflection or calculative reasoning, nor a question of an other-worldly disruptive future, in the urgent moment when the batsman is confronting a fast bowler. Such a moment is constituted, rather, by an embodied retention of the past and an embodied anticipation of the future. Further, such a model of skillful coping can be extended to diverse fields of human behavior to the benefit of ethical and political analysis. Finally, Reynolds contends that this pervasive phenomenon reveals the primary orientation we have toward an embodied calibration of equilibrium within our environment (prior to present-based calculative reasoning or some disruptive future intervening upon the present).

Reynolds complains that, unfortunately, the embodied living present of phenomenology is devalued by the future orientation of Deleuze and Derrida. Deleuze encourages experimentation, problematic encounters, and the compulsory apprenticeship in learning how to swim, for example, over the calm mastery of the cricket player (195), and Derrida similarly neglects the body and shuns the value of practical experience (205-210). But while skillful coping and bodily equilibrium are promising areas of research for political and ethical philosophy, these areas are best explored through phenomenological analyses of the living present. Thus, by not according a central position to the lived time of the body, poststructuralism (future time) and analytic philosophy (clock time) alike are deprived of a temporality of massive service to ethical and political philosophy. Finally and most of all, the lived time of phenomenology avoids prioritizing one time or another, but represents an integrated balance of times: calculative, anticipatory, disruptive, and aporetic times all have their place within lived time, which embodies, as it were, all of them. The phenomenological analysis of the body, Reynolds concludes, functions as a kind of Aristotelian mean capable of moderating the extremes of poststructuralism and analytic philosophy (229).

Reynolds' book thus derives a certain coherence from the overall trajectory of his project: to first expose the inadequacies of certain representatives of analytic and poststructuralist philosophy with regard to time and politics (while at once acknowledging their relative strengths), and then to show how phenomenological analyses of the body could serve as a remedy to those inadequacies or "chronopathologies." And it is perhaps this culminating integration of analytic and poststructuralist philosophies of time within the phenomenological living present that makes a compelling case for Reynolds' motley gathering of figures, which may initially seem disparate and unrelated.

But this brings me to some slight reservations, because in order to render such a varied and sweeping portrait of contemporary philosophy, Reynolds must paint in broad strokes, at the expense of some conceptual detail. For example, there is some uncontrolled use of terminology that occasionally compromises the integrity of his arguments. The word "transcendental," for instance, is used by him in an alarmingly loose sense: after a page-length history of the term from Kant through analytic philosophy, poststructuralism, and phenomenology, Reynolds concludes that "throughout these many and varied reinventions of transcendental reasoning, the philosophical task typically remains one of reflecting on one's position as a philosopher" (6). He goes on to employ the word in this loose sense, but his criticism of Deleuze and poststructuralism, as previously mentioned, hinges considerably upon this term, in which case it even seems to indicate transcendence.

Additionally, Reynolds seems rushed trying to cover such a vast array of figures and schools in a relatively short volume. He moves hastily, for example, from Rawls to analytic philosophy in general, and from Deleuze and Derrida to 'poststructuralism', a term which, like 'postmodernism', is of questionable utility. And while Reynolds gives Deleuze sustained attention in Chronopathologies, his criticisms still seem quick and cavalier. Reynolds claims, for instance, that Deleuze "sideline[s] the importance of habit and embodied coping" (94), and that his "transcendental move," contrary to the reception of Deleuze as a thinker of the body, "diminishes the actions and passions of bodies" (123). But for Deleuze, the character of our successive 'presents' is grounded upon the kinds of vital values that we have, vital values that are distinct from other creatures that consequently enjoy different durations or 'contractions' of present moments; and the affective qualities that make us capable of acting, like Hamlet's becoming capable of killing Claudius, are likewise constituted by temporal syntheses that constitute a 'before' and an 'after'. Accordingly, readers of Deleuze would find Reynolds' criticism that Deleuze neglects to account for embodied time somewhat surprising, especially since Deleuze discusses need, fatigue, organism, life, embodiment, and the capacity of bodies to act precisely in terms of time.

But these passing criticisms should not diminish the appeal or accomplishment of Reynolds' book. Chronopathologies is a work of immense and impressive synthesis that conclusively shows us that the philosophy of time provides a useful perspective from which to survey contemporary philosophy. In the final analysis, Chronopathologies offers a provocative analysis of analytic philosophy, poststructuralism, and phenomenology, and makes a compelling case that the politics of each is inextricably bound to the tacit or explicit philosophies of time from which they draw their force and persuasion.