2013.08.31

Daniel C. Russell

Happiness for Humans

Daniel C. Russell, Happiness for Humans, Oxford University Press, 2013, 283pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199583683.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Russell's book has two main goals. First, it defends a conception of happiness based, with important modifications, on Aristotle's theory of eudaimonia. Those modifications are needed, Russell thinks, because the Stoic conception of eudaimonia poses a serious challenge to Aristotle's, one that can be answered only if his ethics is conjoined with a conception of the self superior to the one found in Stoic authors. Its second main goal is to provide a detailed guide through the relevant Aristotelian and Stoics texts. This work, then, has major philosophical and historical ambitions, but my review will concentrate on the former. I will ask to what extent the author succeeds in defending a plausible ethical theory, and I will leave aside questions about the accuracy of his reading of Aristotle and the Stoics.

I

Russell claims that although the question, "what is happiness?", can be understood in several ways, in one sense it is a normative question that looks to an individual's long-term future and asks what sort of life is in his best interest to pursue. He further claims that what Aristotle says about eudaimonia, supplemented by a plausible conception of the self, provides the best answer to that normative question. Aristotle holds that each of us should have just one ultimate end -- a good life for ourselves -- and that this consists in excellent activity of our reasoning and emotional faculties. As Russell often puts it, happiness consists in activities that are undertaken with "practical wisdom and emotional soundness".

If someone objects that each human being is psychologically unique, and that therefore one person's happiness is different from any other's, Russell will partly agree and partly disagree. He writes: "for creatures like us, genuinely living one's life means being committed to giving oneself a good life, by living for things in which one will find fulfillment, both as a human being and as the unique individual one is" (14). Some of the excellent activities that constitute one's eudaimonia will be fulfilling because they fit one's unique psychological make-up, but there are excellent activities that all of us should undertake because we belong to the general category of human beings. For example, Russell holds that if someone is incapable of loving others, his life cannot be counted happy, no matter how well he fares in other respects, and regardless of how well he does within the limits of his psychological condition. Because he is a human being, the prudential value of his life must be assessed by using a standard for the evaluation of all human beings. Russell assumes that even if nothing in the emotional repertoire of other animals counts as real love, that is not a loss, limitation or deficiency for them. But humans who cannot love are defective, because their happiness must be a human kind of happiness. (Hence the book's title: Happiness for Humans.)

The weak point in Aristotle's theory, in Russell's opinion, lies in his way of thinking about the value of goods other than activities that accord with practical wisdom and emotional soundness. The problem emerges most clearly in the several chapters Aristotle devotes to the life of Priam, who (we are to presume) was of excellent character and practically wise, but who came to a tragic end when his city was destroyed and his family enslaved. Looking to grave misfortunes of this sort, Solon inferred that since even the greatest of us is vulnerable to disastrous reversals, no one's life can be deemed happy until it is over. Priam's life looked happy for much of the time, but it proved not to be such. Aristotle partly agrees with Solon but partly disagrees. What Solon got right was this: being a good human being and engaging in activities that express this excellence are not sufficient for happiness; one needs "external" goods as well -- such goods as friends, family, political power. But Solon was wrong to infer that Priam's life was at no point happy, and that we should wait until someone dies before pronouncing him happy or not. Solon should have said that a sufficiently large loss of external goods takes happiness away from us. That way of putting the point presupposes that, prior to that loss, we were happy.

What does Russell find problematic in Aristotle's response to Solon's dictum? He notes that we would be missing a crucial element of his conception of well-being if we summed it up by saying simply that there are two necessary (and jointly sufficient) components of happiness: external goods and excellent activity. That would overlook a further central thesis of Aristotle's -- namely, that (as Russell puts it) "it is upon virtuous activity above all else that human happiness depends" (91). Aristotle wants to say that virtuous activity "controls" (a word Russell often uses) happiness. But what does this control amount to, if one's happiness also depends on circumstances beyond one's control? Impressed with what he calls a "tension" in Aristotle's theory, Russell shows great sympathy for the Stoic response to it: happiness consists entirely in virtue, and so it is entirely within the control of a wise person. If Priam remained a good man up to the end, then, for the Stoics, his happiness also remained intact as well.

The Stoic theory of value is buttressed by a stripped-down conception of who one is: one is identical to one's power of choice, and so one's happiness consists solely in the good condition of that faculty. When Priam's family and city were ruined, he still retained his ability to choose wisely within the changed circumstances of his life.

Russell's strategy for defending Aristotle's more complex conception of happiness in the face of this Stoic alternative is to propose this modification: he ought to have said that happiness consists in just this one type of good: embodied virtuous activity. He builds on the idea that we can become so attached to people and things in our environment that they become part of ourselves. One's excellent activity can be thought of as something that is essentially done with these particular people or in this community, and so if those people die or one must move to an unfamiliar and unloved environment, this is felt as (and is) an irreversible end to that activity. The boundaries of the self are enlarged so that one becomes, psychologically speaking, a different individual when these losses are incurred, and the happiness one had is lost. The lost goods are no longer to be thought of, as Aristotle does, as external. When Aristotle's theory is transformed in this way, Russell thinks, it can offer a better explanation of why happiness is vulnerable to fortune. The right explanation is that we do not have complete control over whether we engage in embodied virtuous activity; it is embodied in these people or places, and since these can be taken from us, we are vulnerable to misfortune. The explanation is not, as Aristotle thought, that happiness needs something in addition to a certain kind of excellent activity.

In his final chapter, Russell acknowledges that both the narrow Stoic conception of the self and the larger one he offers to Aristotle are practical stances that have advantages and disadvantages. There is no metaphysical fact about who one really is. If one's activities essentially involve others -- if one is committed to them in a way that makes one's sense of fulfillment depend on them -- that brings psychological rewards unavailable to those whose conception of themselves is narrower. On the other hand, if, with the Stoics, one places the boundaries of the self at a point that allows one's excellent activities to continue in all contexts and circumstances, one does gain in this respect: one's happiness is invulnerable to misfortune. Russell concludes:

I have chosen to accept the risks on this side of the dilemma over those on the Stoics' side. It is a choice I have made with some faith and much trepidation, which is I think the most that anyone can do here. In fact, if I am right in my thinking about happiness . . . then no proof as to what happiness is, on either side, will ever be in the offing. (257)

II

What should we make of this? To begin with, notice that Russell embraces a certain form of normative egoism, according to which each individual's deliberative reasoning should have as its single final goal the happiness (that is, well-being) of that individual. There is nothing objectionably selfish about this, he claims, because the search for one's own happiness may lead one to take up a life of service to others. As he puts it, one's 

first choice must be to commit to [one's] own needs and interests, to commit enough to [oneself] to give [oneself] the best life [one] can by finding people and pursuits to love. . . . [one] might reclaim [one's] life through serving others . . . provided [one] does so out of a love for others that [one] has chosen to make part of the good life one wants to give [one]self. (13-14)

Benefiting others for their sake is just fine -- provided that one's motivation for taking their interests to heart is that in doing so one serves one's own "needs and interests". This is perhaps best understood as a two-level theory: at the ground level, one devotes oneself to others and does not treat them as a mere means to one's own happiness. But why should one take up this non-instrumental stance towards others? In asking and answering this question, we move up a level: these loving attitudes towards others stand in need of justification, and the justification consists in the fact that taking this stance towards others is what makes one's own life happy.

The objection to be made to this is that it does not recognize others as ever constituting a direct source of reasons. Another's well-being never provides me, all by itself, with a reason to assist him; it does so only if and because I benefit from caring about him. If someone sitting next to me is in great pain, and I can stop the pain simply by lifting the electrical wire that is causing the problem, am I justified in assisting him only if and because my doing so partly constitutes a happy life for me? If I could be just as happy walking away, would that justify my doing so? Russell's reply (32) is that as a matter of fact I could not be just as happy, though he adds: "it would go far beyond my present scope . . . for me to try to offer a full-blown discussion of this very thorny theoretical issue here" (33-34).

Consider another sort of case: Suppose someone who is practically wise and emotionally sound foresees that his psychological condition will soon deteriorate unless he takes a large dose of a scarce wonder drug that will preserve these mental skills. He learns, however, that five others face the same problem, although each of them needs a much lower dosage (one fifth or less of what he needs) to preserve their mental skills. I do not see how Russell's "eudaimonism" (as he calls this form of egoism) can explain why it is rationally permissible for this one individual to prefer that the other five receive the drug. As he says, in the passage quoted above, one's "first choice must be to commit to one's own needs and interests". And, of course, the example can be altered by changing the number involved. The cognitive and emotional skills ofmillions of others may be at stake. What would we think of someone who believes that, because his "first choice must be to commit to [his] own needs and interests", he ought to bring it about that he receives the drug rather than they?

A second component of Russell's eudaimonism is his insistence that "there must be exactly one final end per life" (18, his emphasis) -- and that this final end must itself be unitary, not "some bundle of ends" (19). (That single final end is one's own happiness.) Why exactly one? He replies: "each life is only one, and so cannot be organized around conflicting ends, whereas multiple final ends would set the stage for just such conflicts -- and such conflicts are precisely the sorts of problems that we engage in deliberation to address in the first place" (18-19, his emphasis).

This overlooks the fact that we can compare the strength of two competing goals without needing to weigh them in relation to a third. Should we, for example, undergo a certain amount of pain in order to make certain pleasures available to ourselves? Here we have two different goals: pain avoidance and pleasure. Do we need some third goal, other than these two, in order to make a rational decision? Can hedonism be refuted simply on this basis? Not at all. The pain in question may be small in intensity and duration. The pleasures may be intense and long-lasting. If so, we can reasonably decide that the strength of the reason to avoid the pain is much smaller than the strength of the reason to pursue the pleasures.

The lesson to be learned from this goes beyond the comparison of pleasure and pain. It is that in order to deliberate well we do not need a single ultimate end by reference to which all subordinate ends are assessed; we need only acquire an accurate sensitivity to the competing strength of reasons. Our theory of value can therefore acknowledge that there are many good things (and many bad things), and that none of these good things is the one to which all other goods are subordinate. We can choose from among this multiplicity simply by assessing how good (or bad) it would be for us to do this as opposed to that.

A third feature of Russell's theory is that the single final end consists in virtuous (or, as he sometimes says, excellent) activity. This thesis would be implausible if it were understood to mean that whenever someone excels at an activity -- any activity -- his doing so is good (to some degree) for him. Is excellence at police work good for a police officer? Not necessarily. We assess someone's skillfulness at this job by looking to the effect he or she has on others. Police work may be so stressful that it is a bad job for anyone to have -- but it is nonetheless a job at which some may excel. Accordingly, even if it is simply assumed without argument that justice and honesty are excellent traits (virtues), that by itself would not license us to infer that it is in one's interest to be just or honest. Just and honest people do well by others, but we cannot assume that they themselves benefit from having these qualities.

How, then, does Russell defend Aristotle's thesis that "happiness is, above all, a life of virtuous activity" (80)? He relies on a capacious notion of what a virtue is. When he says that a happy human life is a life of virtuous activity, he does not "have in mind a do-gooder's life", nor does he "take the substance of 'virtue' to be fixed already." (6). For Russell, "What counts as a 'virtue' . . . in a human being depends on what humans must be like in order to live happy, fulfilled human lives" (6). In light of this, it is not easy to take the claim that happiness consists in virtuous activity to have any substance: this simply means that happiness consists in having what we need in order to be happy. What could save this theory of well-being from emptiness is its thesis that happiness consists in activities guided by practical wisdom and emotional soundness. But who has practical wisdom: is it the honest and just person, or his opposite? Russell has to answer this question from within the confines of his egoistic framework, which gives the good of others only indirect standing as a source of reasons. Further, he offers no informative answer to the question: which things are good for oneself? Practical wisdom, if it is to count as a substantive notion, must put one in touch with the practical reasons that apply to oneself. What are those reasons? It is empty to reply: one's own good, one's own happiness, one's own practical wisdom.

A fourth feature of Russell's eudaimonism is his struggle to find a form of Aristotelianism that is more attractive than the Stoic theory of value, according to which virtue is the only good. For the Stoics, as for Socrates, no harm can come to a good person. If he is tortured, that is an affliction for something other than himself -- his body, or his involuntary feelings, not his active choice-making mind. Aristotle thinks such a thesis has no plausibility. His theory of well-being takes it for granted that when suffering is sufficiently great and extends over a long period, then whoever endures it is not living well, no matter how virtuous he is. True, there is something this person has that is very good for him -- his virtue. But pain is bad, and it can be so bad that when we make an overall assessment of someone's life, we cannot call it a good life for him if it was so painful.

By contrast, Russell seeks to explain how it is possible for a good person to fail to be happy by means of his idea that virtuous activity is embedded in particular friends, projects, or locations. When, for example, our virtuous activity is embedded in our dealings with someone we love, the death of that individual brings with it the irreversible loss of that virtuous activity, and so one's happiness must, at least for some period of time, also come to an end. Notice that the only way in which Russell's theory accounts for the vulnerability of a good person to misfortune is through the cessation of that good person's embedded virtuous activity. The only way something bad could happen to someone who is practically wise and emotionally sound is through the disruption of activities that express those cognitive and affective skills.

This is too close for comfort to what the Stoics are forced to say about pain. They hold that it is not bad for anyone to suffer; similarly, Russell holds that if one can remain as active as ever, in accordance with one's wisdom, being in pain makes one's life no worse. That commits him to saying, implausibly, that there is no reason to prefer (a) being killed by one's enemies without being tortured by them, to (b) first being tortured by them and then killed. He can say that both are bad alternatives, since when one is dead one no longer exercises practical wisdom. But, like the Stoics, he cannot give a good explanation of why one of these alternatives is prudentially worse than the other.

Fifth and finally, Russell's eudaimonism holds that what is good for a human being is partly (and to large extent) determined by that individual's membership in the class of human beings. He seems to subsume that thesis under one that applies to the well-being of any kind of animal, so that what is good for a dog (for example) is determined by the norm we use for assessing canine happiness. He says that if a dog is incapable of love, that is no loss of well-being for it, because canine happiness does not require and is not partly constituted by loving relations with others. You and I, by contrast, are human; therefore a different standard applies to the assessment of our lives.

Why not say instead that one of the limitations of canine life (relative to ours) is that their emotions are shallow in comparison with ours? Doggy love cannot be the cognitively enriched array of deep feelings and thoughts that it is for humans. Why isn't that a reason to say that dogs at their best cannot live as good a life as we can when we are at our best?

Consider a different sort of example, one in which we change the nature of a species for the better. Suppose that songbirds as they are presently constituted are not receptive to the beauty of their chirping, but that genetic manipulation could give them an enriched awareness of the musical features of their songs, with the result that they get much more enjoyment from their singing. Assuming that this had no ill side effects, their lives would be better -- it would be better for a songbird to be a songbird than it was before. This thought experiment suggests that the appreciation of beauty would be a good thing for any creature who can be made receptive to it. So, it is not someone's membership in the human family that makes it the case that it is good for him to appreciate beauty and bad for him to lack this receptivity. Rather, the appreciation of beauty is a good thing -- good, that is, for the creature, of whatever species, who has it. Similarly, deep joy in one's relationships with others should be considered a good thing for any individual to feel. Accordingly, when some unfortunate human being lacks the capacity for such joy, we should not say: because he is human, he could be living a better life. We should simply say: he could be living a better life. Russell is mistaken, then, to think that you ought to live a certain kind of life because you are a human being.

He tries to address this objection by imagining "a race of non-human rational creatures" who possess "perceptual organs that enable them to have aesthetic experiences that make their lives richer, but which we humans lack" (57). He asks: if we could implant these organs in ourselves, should we do so? Would that make life better for us? His reply is that opening these new realms of beauty might not improve human life because this added capacity "may involve awareness of things in an expanded perceptual field that we would find distracting, disorienting, or over-stimulating" (57).

But this does not respond adequately to the objection. I want to know whether I, Richard Kraut, should acquire a new sense modality that will allow me to experience a further dimension of beauty not presently available to me. I agree that if this new organ were, in my case, "distracting, disorienting, or over-stimulating", that would be a drawback, and perhaps the disadvantages would outweigh the value to me of my new aesthetic experiences. But what if there were no such drawbacks? In that event, there is every reason for me to acquire this new organ, because my life would be richer -- better for me. And that is true not because I am human (there is nothing peculiarly human about this organ), but because the experience of beauty enhances the life of anyone who has this experience. The non-human rational animals that Russell imagines have better lives than they otherwise would because of their aesthetic experiences. So too would I (if there were no off-setting ill effects); so too would any human being; so too would anyone (human or not).

If I should not acquire this new organ, that is because the result would be "distracting, disorienting, or over-stimulating" in my case, so much so that I would not be able to enjoy my new aesthetic experiences, or their value would be outweighed by the discomfort or suffering I undergo. It is bad for me to be distracted, disoriented, over-stimulated. But that is because these experiences are bad for anyone, human or non-human.

Russell is right that perceptual organs that are good for non-human creatures might not be good for humans to have, all things considered. But that generalization is true because it rests on the truth of many particular statements: statements about what would be good for this individual, that individual, and so on, whatever biological kind they belong to.

III

Anyone who has an interest in the debate between Aristotelians and Stoics will profit from reading Happiness for Humans. Russell's book is philosophically engaging precisely because for him this is very much a live issue. However, if you are not already pre-disposed to accept an Aristotelian or Stoic framework for thinking about ethics, this work is unlikely to be persuasive. I myself find many insights in Aristotle's moral philosophy.[1] But they are not the doctrines that Russell defends here.[2]


[1] For a recent presentation, see my "Human Diversity and the Nature of Well-Being: Reflections on Sumner's Methodology," in Res Philosophica 90, July 2013, pp. 307-322.

[2] I am grateful to the author for his comments on an earlier draft of this review.