In this wide-ranging collection, Ruth Groff and John Greco showcase what they take to be a new and exciting research program in philosophy. They never say precisely what the program is -- nor could they, since many of the contributing authors differ widely in their goals and sometimes disagree with one another -- but they gloss it with a compelling slogan: out with Hume; in with Aristotle.
Groff introduces the collection with an evocative, if simplistic, history (1). Humean assumptions, she claims, long ago displaced Aristotelian ones as the default settings for philosophers. Most importantly this happened in metaphysics, but by extension Humean assumptions came to pervade all other areas of philosophy as well. More recently, however, Aristotelian metaphysics has regained popularity, especially within the metaphysics of powers. Whereas the Humean tendency is to be antirealist or skeptical about irreducible powers in nature, a growing number of metaphysicians are now happy to admit, in Aristotelian fashion, that nature is replete with such powers, along with capacities, dispositions, tendencies, propensities and the like if they are something different.
Groff's (and presumably Greco's) goal is not to describe this revival of powers-based ontology precisely, nor to debate its merits, but rather to examine its consequences for the rest of the field (2). If Hume was wrong about powers, and if nearly all of us went wrong along with him, where does that leave all of our other projects -- e.g., in the philosophy of science, the philosophy of mind, epistemology, ethics, and social and political philosophy -- that we built on dubious Humean metaphysical foundations? What would philosophy look like if, while thinking about agency, the mind, duties, reasons, gender, and society, for instance, we had ignored the Humean scolds and freely availed ourselves of such things as powers all along? Groff thinks philosophy would look very different indeed and presents as evidence seventeen philosophical essays that collectively blanket the field and in some way or other make use of powers. Her claim is that, despite some dissenting voices and a great diversity of viewpoints, a "composite portrait" emerges from this collection, a portrait that at the very least confirms the thesis that "recent developments in metaphysics have implications for the full range of areas in philosophy that have been shaped by Humean rather than Aristotelian assumptions" (1).
Groff is right: though it may function as something of a Rorschach, an interesting composite portrait does emerge from these papers, and any metaphysician working on powers, as well as anyone interested in how the new ontology of powers is playing out more broadly in the field will find it useful. However, Groff's mini-history and the attending promise it offers of a new research program for philosophy is problematic in at least two ways. The first difficulty, of which the editors are obviously aware, is that real historical figures rarely map neatly onto contemporary debates, and in this case there may be a mismatch between the historical David Hume and the contemporary Humeanism that serves as the foil for Groff's emerging new research program.
Lynn Joy ("The Ineliminability of Dispositions in Hume's Rejection of Causal Powers") argues that the historical Hume is simply not the appropriate target for neo-Aristotelian proponents of powers. Yes, Hume famously expressed skepticism about intrinsic causal powers of things, the "hidden springs" of nature. But his analysis of the relation of cause and effect relied crucially upon what Joy calls "belief-determining dispositions" (75). Belief-determining dispositions are dispositions of an observer to form the idea of an effect after having the idea of its cause, or to have "a more lively idea of an effect after having the impression of its cause", and for Hume it is only these dispositions that distinguish causation from mere succession (75). According to Joy, belief-determining dispositions are not eliminated or reduced to something further, but consist in "a non-representation functional role" that serves as bedrock in Hume's philosophy of mind (75).
Joy's argument is too complicated and, from a contemporary perspective, too idiosyncratic in its terminology for me to engage here, but she succeeds in showing that Hume himself is probably not the best target of the pro-powers movement. How Hume's metaphysics of powers aligns with contemporary Humeanism is at best a vexed interpretive question; at worst, it may turn out that the historical Hume was strikingly "anti-Humean".
The second difficulty with Groff's introductory remarks is that they may be read either loosely or strictly. On a loose reading, Groff is merely saying there is a revival of Aristotelian metaphysics and, in particular, a revival of theories that appeal to dispositions or powers. Read this way, her thesis is unobjectionable, for each of the essays is in some way or other "inspired by Aristotle", and no doubt the revival of powers ontology has spurred dispositional accounts across the discipline.
But if Groff's thesis is simply that Aristotelian views are resurgent, the collection lacks the interest and the unity one might have thought it had. What philosophical connections tie together all of the broadly Aristotelian views presented here? Are they simply exercises in the well-worn strategy of mining the work of that great philosopher for "new" views, with the qualifier that they are, in some way or other, powers-connected? What is so central, so important, about the metaphysics of powers?
If we read Groff's "Introduction" strictly, however, and take the collection to be a demonstration of the philosophy-wide implications for an Aristotelian metaphysics of powers, or a demonstration of what is made possible, throughout the discipline, by way of such a metaphysics, then it definitely qualifies as both interesting and unified. Read in this strict way, however, another problem arises: many of the essays simply do not fit the bill. Several of the theories appearing in the volume seem to be independent of the metaphysics of powers; indeed they seem perfectly compatible with an underlying anti-Aristotelian, neo-Humean ontology.
For example, in her excellent "Gender Essentialism: Aristotle or Locke", Charlotte Witt contrasts two approaches to questions of essence: a Lockean asks what the members of a kind have in common, whereas an Aristotelian asks what functionally organizes and unifies a thing. She then argues that the Aristotelian approach is both distinct from, and more useful than, the Lockean approach (309). Witt further claims that gender is the functional principle that organizes and unifies all of our other social roles, and therefore, since we are social beings, gender serves as our Aristotelian essence (314-315). Gender norms, Witt argues, "are prior to, prioritize and inflect an individual's other social roles" (315); gender systematically structures our agency by determining the social positions we occupy and what is socially expected or appropriate behavior, thereby shaping all of our other socially-determined powers.
Two examples illustrate Witt's thesis: (1) more female than male faculty take parental leave; (2) women practice medicine differently than men, "valuing compassion over competence" (312). These examples show gender in case (1) as trumping, and in case (2) as structuring, a professional role. By focusing on the powers and expectations that come with gender roles, Witt argues that feminists can stop pursuing the metaphysical dead end of determining what all women have in common, and instead answer the very pressing question of how gender roles shape our lives and, in particular, how those roles disadvantage women (315).
Witt's paper holds appeal as metaphysics and as social philosophy. What is missing, not from Witt's perspective but from the editors' perspective, is any connection between Witt's thesis, or, for that matter, the complications that one might raise for her thesis, and the metaphysics of powers. Though she is defending an Aristotelian conception of essence over a Lockean one, and though she is talking about the powers conferred by one's social roles, I cannot see any reason why a contemporary Humean would object to any of the metaphysical assumptions required by Witt's proposal. For example, nothing in the fundamental metaphysics of David Lewis, the standard bearer of neo-Humeanism, would prevent him from acknowledging that there are social roles, nor that such roles shape our agency, nor that gender is the master role, dominating and shaping all the others.
Linda Zagzebski's "Powers and Reasons" is a crisply-written and insightful essay in epistemology that, like Witt's, is Aristotelian in spirit, but also compatible with a neo-Humean treatment of powers. Zagzebski begins by distinguishing what she calls "theoretical" from "deliberative" reasons (271). Theoretical reasons for believing a proposition are propositions that either entail or raise the probability of the target proposition. Since logical or probabilistic relations are objective and third-personal, these theoretical reasons are easily shared. Deliberative reasons for believing a proposition, by contrast, are irreducibly first-personal, un-shareable psychic states. For example, having a certain experience may give a person a deliberative reason for believing a proposition, and though one can share the fact that one had a certain kind of experience -- which is a theoretical reason -- one cannot directly share the experience itself, the deliberative reason.
Sensory experiences give one deliberative reasons for belief, but so do memories, belief states, intuitions, and emotions (272). The most fundamental kind of deliberative reason, Zagzebski argues, is self-trust, which includes both the belief that one's epistemic powers are truth-conducive and also a feeling that holds doubts about one's abilities at bay (273). This doxastic-affective state, which is to some extent "up to us", she argues, is more basic than any theoretical reason one can identify, because any recognition or employment of theoretical reasons relies on one's taking what appear to be theoretical reasons to actually be indicators of truth; it is thus only by virtue of trusting oneself that one can use reasons of any kind.
Zagzebksi's distinction between deliberative and theoretical reasons is both plausible and promising as a way of approaching the problem of disagreement and other issues in epistemology. But I cannot find any connections between the epistemology and a neo-Aristotelian metaphysics of powers. Yes, according to Zagzebski, knowledge requires that one trusts oneself, and such trusting is an exercise of a power, or an ability, but it seems a Humean about fundamental metaphysics might very well agree with her.
Much the same could be said for other essays in the volume. Jesper Kallestrup and Duncan Pritchard raise a criticism of virtue epistemology. They argue that Gettier cases will plague any analysis of knowledge as the exercise of an ability, due to the contribution of the environment to knowledge, and illustrated by certain "twin-Earth" possibilities (260). None of their considerations, or considerations that might be raised against them, draws upon anything in the literature on powers. Likewise, Kelvin Knight usefully compares John Searle's and Alasdair MacIntyre's theories of social relations and institutions. The comparison alludes to powers and, in fact, to the different conceptions of powers in play, but again, I could not find anything to which a contemporary Humean would object, at least in the metaphysics of powers.
A recurring theme in the collection is emergence. In "Emergence and Social Causation," Tony Lawson asks what methodology is appropriate in the social sciences, and spells out the sort of causation that characterizes the social realm. Every one of his issues is, so far as I can tell, orthogonal to the metaphysics of powers. William Jaworski sets out a hylomorphic theory of mind and an accompanying Aristotelian theory of emergence, and then mounts a spirited defense of his view against causal overdetermination objections. His view carries a commitment to the existence of organizing structures and requires denying that emergent properties are caused by lower-level properties, but does not require that one posit primitive causal powers of the sort familiar from the dispositions literature. Eleonore Stump carefully sets out a Thomistic form of emergentism and shows how it is distinct from, and in certain respects better than, contemporary theories. Again, while Stump's Thomistic emergentism, (which embraces top-down causation in a certain qualified sense and, like Jaworski's, emphasizes the importance of functional organization to causal explanations) is perhaps not a natural fit with contemporary Humeanism. I do not see why one would have to posit primitive powers in order to subscribe to it.
It is easy enough to conjure an emergentist who believes the properties of wholes are more than the sum of the properties of their parts, and who believes that wholes possess distinctive causal powers, yet who also reduces all powers and dispositions to counterfactuals, and then reduces counterfactuals to facts about categorical properties and laws or simply to the similarities in the global distribution of categorical properties, some of which would obviously be emergent properties of wholes. Emergentism, then, loosely fits the Aristotelian theme, but does not clearly support the stronger contention that an Aristotelian metaphysic of powers changes everything.
Thus far, I have registered complaints about the articles that fit a loose, but not a strict reading of the "Introduction" on which a metaphysics of powers yields a flowering of new theories throughout philosophy. However, a core of articles does actually fit the strict reading. Stephen Mumford's "The Power of Power" is a brief intellectual autobiography and a sketch of how powers-based ontology has lead him to different theories of mind (anti-Rylean), properties (power-tropes), laws (there aren't any, since powers suffice), causation (powers are truth makers for causal claims), experience (we perceive powers), and people (we take pleasure both in the exercise of our powers and in watching others exercise their powers, as evidenced, he claims, by sport and sex) (9-23). Mumford obviously shares Groff's enthusiasm for the potential of a powers-based revolution in philosophy, and it is clear that metaphysics has driven Mumford's own innovations in a number of areas. Still, though thecausal links are clear in his personal philosophical development, the epistemic and theoretical connections between his various positions are harder to discern, at least from this brief autobiographical sketch.
Mumford also co-authors "Dispositions and Ethics" with Rani Lill Anjum and Svein Anders Noer Lie. They set out to apply their powers-based metaphysics to ethics (235). Their argument is that the central notions in ethics (like agency, intentionality, autonomy, normativity, and value) all display what they call "the dispositional modality". Dispositional modality is a modal status somewhere between pure necessity and pure contingency (235). A disposition can always be overridden, and therefore dispositions never necessitate their manifestations, but only tend towards them (235). What a disposition disposes a thing to do is thus not purely contingent, but not purely necessary either. Because of this in-between modal status, one cannot infer, just because an object has a disposition to M in C and is in C, that it will M: maybe some other factor, I, will prevent it from M-ing.
Causation displays the dispositional modality, because causes tend to produce their characteristic effects, but do not necessitate them. And many of the notions in ethics (e.g., agency, responsibility, and autonomy) are causal, and therefore display the same dispositional modality. But Anjum, Lie, and Mumford also note that the normatively required, much like the disposed, itself falls between what they call pure necessity and pure contingency. "That one ought to do X does not necessitate X," but at the same time
if one ought to be considerate, then this says more than that consideration is one possible way of behaving: merely one among many possibilities. It is favoured or selected in some way: targeted as the special subset of all the possible actions to which one's actions should be aimed. (242)
They conclude that "We have, therefore, the same dispositional modality, for ought requires something that is more than purely contingent but less than necessary" (242).
I think Anjum, Lie, and Mumford are unwarranted in labeling every modal status between what they are calling pure necessity and pure contingency "dispositional", and therefore unwarranted in seeing a revolution in ethics courtesy of metaphysics. That one ought to do X does not necessitate doing X, of course. It is also true, of course, that the doing-X possibilities are singled out ("favored," "selected," or "targeted") in some way as special by norms. But doing-X possibilities are not singled out by a norm as something that will tend to happen or that an agent is disposed to do (unless of course that agent is disposed to do as she ought, which is a separate matter). If one ought to do X, then the doing-X possibilities are singled out by what might be termed the "normativity modality", namely, something that one ought to do, but which may or may not actually happen or even tend to happen. The way in which possibilities are singled out is precisely what distinguished norms from tendencies: they are things one ought to do, not necessarily things that tend to happen. I see no reason to conflate these two ways of "singling out" possibilities, nor to assimilate one way to the other. In fact, if assimilation were the right way to proceed, there is no reason for prioritizing dispositions over norms: the authors are no more justified in saying that ethics displays the dispositional modality than that dispositions and causes display the normative modality.
The essays on agency, by E. J. Lowe, Brian Ellis, and Groff, also fit a strict reading of Groff's introduction, and are more convincing as a test case. To cite only one example, Lowe characterizes human will as an "active, non-causal power" (174). By "active", he means that the power is spontaneous, rather than being triggered by something else (174). By "non-causal", he means that the power does not cause a real (i.e., non-mere-Cambridge) change in anything other than what has the power (174). Lowe argues that for neo-Aristotelians the radioactivity of a radium atom is one such active, non-causal power, so the active, non-causal powers of an agent are not without parallel in the natural world (174). One feature that distinguishes our non-causal, active powers from those of a radium atom, however, is that our power is "two-way": we have the power to act and simultaneously the power to refrain from acting, whereas the radium atom only has the power to decay, and not the power not to decay (177). One may or may not be attracted to Lowe's account, but I am doubtful that it could be mated with a neo-Humean theory of powers. For how would the neo-Humean draw the sorts of distinctions Lowe's theory requires, e.g., the distinction between one-way and two-way powers?
Alexander Bird is a "dissenting voice", and my review echoes many of his doubts about the extent of the implications of a realism about powers. Though Bird is a well-known proponent of a neo-Aristotelian metaphysics of powers, in "Limitations of Power", he warns that many dispositional theories in philosophy are independent of the underlying metaphysics. "Powers", according to Bird's nomenclature, applies only to fundamental properties, whereas "dispositions" applies to non-fundamental properties (27-30). Bird says that whereas neo-Aristotelians alone can embrace what he calls powers, neo-Humeans are free to make use of what he calls dispositions, which themselves are possessed in virtue of other properties, e.g., the categorical properties of their parts (30).
Bird points out that Humeans have tended to analyze dispositional locutions in terms of counterfactuals and, in particular, that David Lewis did so (39). These counterfactual analyses have proven problematic due to the now-familiar phenomena of finking, masking, and mimicking. Though new variants of these analyses still have proponents, they have largely been abandoned. However, Bird claims (rightly in my view) that there is simply no direct link between the prospects for counterfactual analyses of dispositional locutions and fundamental metaphysics. No inferences should be drawn, therefore, about fundamental metaphysics from the success or failure of conditional analyses of dispositional locutions (40).
Groff is not persuaded by Bird's argument, just as I suspect she would not be moved by my contention that many of the collection's theories float free of fundamental ontology. Groff's first claim is that Bird's own metaphysics, though it is often referred to as "pan-dispositionalism" is in fact still very much Humean: Groff actually calls Bird's view "passivism" (220-223). Bird, she claims, says that fundamental properties are "powers" but by "powers" Bird means only to say that fundamental properties are necessarily and uniquely paired with stimulus-response sequences of the form: "x is disposed to M when S, represented as D, s,m [x]" (221). That pairing is consistent with the belief she attributes to Bird that the world is not inherently active; the properties themselves are not dynamic enough, not forceful, but just so happen to be related in the right sort of way to what happens (222). True neo-Aristotelian proponents of new powers-based theories of agency, on the other hand, she calls "anti-passivists" who embrace and make explicit use of the active nature of powers.
Secondly, Groff claims that Bird's passivism, and the anti-passivism of neo-Aristotelian theorists of agency like Ellis and Mumford, contrast in ways that undermine Bird's argument that fundamental ontology and theories of agency are independent (224). Genuine anti-passivism makes possible genuinely new theories of agency not available to the neo-Humean about powers. For instance, Mumford's view is that agents have powers that are just as real and just as powerful as the powers of fundamental things, and Ellis likewise puts human beings on a par, power-wise, with fundamental particles, whereas Bird consigns agents and exercises of agency to non-fundamental status, but without any explicit argument. When Bird complains that theories of agency are merely about derivative powers, which he calls "dispositions", and concludes that those theories of agency are independent of fundamental metaphysics, he begs the question.
Indeed, I think Groff is right to argue that agency is a toehold for her general thesis that the metaphysics of powers matters to philosophy generally. As mentioned above, it is hard to see how a Humean could accommodate all of the distinctions required by Lowe's view of agency, or invoke a fundamental relation of manifesting a power. The neo-Humean does not have any fundamental relation of power-manifestation at her disposal, and therefore cannot accommodate a neo-Aristotelian theory of agency that claims humans stand in such a relation to their actions.
Note, however, that theories just like Ellis's or Mumford's -- except for the claim that the manifestation relation is fundamental -- could be advocated by a Humean. And at least some of the considerations for or against these theories are independent of whether the powers of the agents are fundamental. One might, then, take the helpful upshot of the debate between Bird, Mumford, and Groff to be a new desideratum for proponents of neo-Aristotelian theories: be clear, when offering your theory, about whether the powers involved are supposed to be fundamental, and be clear about what work fundamentality itself is doing in the arguments for your theory. It may be that dispositional theories, across the discipline, differ widely with respect to the role fundamentality plays. For instance, while Groff may be right about Ellis' and Mumford's theories of agency, it may be that other dispositional theories do not require fundamentalism about the relevant powers. For instance, I see no reason to think the powers that gender roles confer are metaphysically fundamental, or that their manifestation is primitive. Or, if gender-endowed powers are primitive, nothing in Witt's arguments hinges on that fact.
In a more extreme challenge to Bird, Anjum, Lie, and Mumford argue, with a nod to Groff's work elsewhere, that if Humeanism were true, no one would be responsible for anything, since "Deflationary theories of causation weaken agency so much that, if that were all we had at our disposal, it would no longer be justified to call us agents" (238). Agency requires genuine causation, which Humeans do not provide. Therefore, only anti-Humeanism can provide a theory of agency.
If we grant this sort approach, then of course powers ontology in some sense "changes everything". For causation crops up everywhere in philosophy, and if Humeans are wrong about causation then they are, in some sense, wrong about most everything. By Anjum, Lie, and Mumford's reasoning, only anti-Humeans could provide theories of pretty much anything in philosophy.
But what really does follow about how to philosophize in other areas if we grant conditionals like: if there were only constant conjunction, there would be no causation and therefore no agency? Very little, I think. Suppose in the debate between nominalists and realists, a realist becomes convinced that without universals there could be no true predication. It would follow, on common assumptions anyway, that nominalism is incompatible with most phenomena that philosophers, and indeed scientists, investigate. But would it follow that realism about universals thereby underwrites a new rubric for research across all the issues impacted? Not that I can see. Debates about universals might still be largely separable, in practice, from debates about many of the theories that make use of true predication, e.g., geology, despite the fact that metaphysicans are actively arguing about conditionals such as: if there are no universals, then there is no true predication, and in particular, no true predication in geology. Geologists need not stop the presses while metaphysicians work out the truth about universals. Likewise, even though it is a matter of debate whether, if the only powers are Humean powers, there are any such things as agency, reference, intentionality, knowledge, or for that matter, persons, perhaps the issue of powers ontology can be dialectically separated off from many of the issues concerning agency, reference, intentionality, personhood, etc. Breadth of entailment does not equal breadth of dialectical entanglement.
As a metaphysician who thinks about the nature of fundamental properties, I wish for nothing more than that the theories I work on would prove to be a wellspring of insight for everyone else, yielding innovations across all areas of philosophy. But I am not convinced, at least not by these seventeen essays, that my wish is likely to be fulfilled. It may be, instead, that some neo-Aristotelians have recently come into possession of a new (but also ancient) hammer, and in their excitement see every issue in philosophy as a nail.
 Groff and Greco co-edit the collection, but Groff is the sole author of the Introduction.
 One wonders what, exactly, the trumping and structuring relations are supposed to be, and whether gender actually serves what Witt calls "the mega social role" (312). As I'm sure she would acknowledge, the two examples cited above are not conclusive. In her case (2), rather than starting with the class of all medical doctors and then examining the different expectations and powers of male and female doctors, Witt might as easily have begun with the class of all women, and argued that the expectations and powers of women who are also medical doctors differs greatly from the expectations and powers of women who are not medical doctors. Would this observation support the thesis that the professional role of medical doctor is shaping or dominating the gender role? Presumably not. The case of differential parental leave is more persuasive, because in that case gender and professional roles seem to be competing directly -- each calls for different behaviors -- and the gender role seems to win out. But it is difficult to say when social roles are actually in competition, and it is an empirical question whether gender always wins out when they do seem to compete. Social roles do not sum like vectors, but interact in highly complicated and sometimes unpredictable ways, yielding quite distinct new roles when they overlap. Which roles dominate others, or even what it means to make that claim, strikes me as an important, but also extraordinarily difficult question of intersectionality.
 When epistemic peers disagree about some proposition, perhaps they share all of the same theoretical reasons, including the facts about what each party to the disagreement believes, but they cannot share the same deliberative reasons, due to their irreducibly first-personal nature. Thus, the peers always have different reasons for belief and there is no rational imperative for their doxastic convergence.
 Note that Zagzebski's theory, mated with a powers-based theory of agency such as those on offer from Ellis, Mumford, and Lowe, discussed below, would be unavailable to the Humean, but nothing in her essay requires such a theory of agency.
 If we simply ask what Anjum, Lie, and Mumford mean by "something between pure necessity and pure contingency" we can see the problem clearly. Suppose one is not disposed to do X, yet one ought to do X. Doing-X is not necessary, of course, so it is not "purely" necessary. Is it "purely" contingent? One might have thought so. It is purely contingent in the sense that it is not necessary, and further, in the sense that nothing is disposing it to happen. It also does not have a high probability of happening. But it is "singled out", of course, as something that ought to be done. Perhaps, then, that is all that is meant by saying it is not "purely contingent": it is singled out by something or other from other possibilities. Suppose so. And suppose we say that anything that is not purely contingent in this sense "displays the dispositional modality". Then of course norms display the dispositional modality. But to note this is not to advance philosophy, for it merely reminds us that whatever ought to be done is "singled out by" something, in this case a norm, i.e., it tells us only that whatever ought to be done is special in that it ought to be done. Likewise, if for some notion to "display the dispositional modality" is just for certain arguments involving that notion to be subject to antecedent strengthening, then it is not terribly enlightening to find out that ethical notions "display the dispositional modality", for we already knew the logics of "ought" and "is a reason for" are nonmonotonic.
 Groff slightly mischaracterizes Bird in her argument that he is a "passivist". She writes: "The concept of 'dispositional' is defined (in a non-technical sense of the word define) with reference to subjunctive conditional predicates regarding stimulus-response sequences. Such predicates take the form 'x is disposed to M when S', represented as 'D s,m [x]' (220-221)". In fact, Bird is careful to hew closely to dispositional, not subjunctive conditional, locutions. The formulations cited do not involve any "subjunctive conditional predicates" and Bird explicitly disavows a commitment to subjunctive conditional analyses.
 I am grateful to Sam Kennedy for helpful conversations and comments on an earlier draft.