2013.10.26

Saul Kripke

Philosophical Troubles: Collected Papers, Volume 1

Saul Kripke, Philosophical Troubles: Collected Papers, Volume 1, Oxford University Press, 2011, 388pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199730155.

Reviewed by Mark Crimmins, Stanford University


That four of the most admired and discussed essays in 1970s philosophy are here is enough to make this first volume of Saul Kripke's collected articles a must-have. That these gems are accompanied by three very interesting pieces published in the last decade and by six previously unpublished papers -- most having been worked up with "considerable rewriting" from manuscripts and lecture transcriptions dating from across four decades, and one written expressly for the collection -- brings the volume to major event status. The reader's delight will grow as hints are dropped that there is a great deal more to come in this series being prepared by Kripke and an ace team of philosopher-editors at the Saul Kripke Center at The Graduate Center of the City University of New York.

The '70s classics are "Identity and Necessity," "Outline of a Theory of Truth," "Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference," and "A Puzzle about Belief." If you have found your way to this review not having heard of any of these, I can only say, "Hi, Dad." They are among analytic philosophy's Greatest Hits, are lastingly important contributions to the philosophies of language, logic, mind, metaphysics, and epistemology, and have spawned literatures so large that even all of your basement shelves, cleared of the antique house paints, could not hold them.

I will supply brief descriptions of the newer essays (most of which have already attracted attention in print), dwelling on a few.

"Russell's Notion of Scope," (2005) one of the three more recently published pieces, is a rewarding collection of historical, logical, and linguistic remarks centering on "On Denoting."

"Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference: Some Exegetical Notes" (2008) supplies answers to two important challenges to Frege's theory, answers meant to be consonant with Frege's deepest commitments. The first charge (raised by Russell in the tortured Gray's Elegy argument in "On Denoting") is that it's a mystery how -- under what higher-order senses -- we think about senses when we think about thoughts. The answer is that we think about senses by being directly acquainted with them; that is a way to think about them, and so it is a mode of presentation (and so a sense, and also another thing that we can become directly acquainted with, and so on down a virtuous regress). The second charge (raised by John Perry) is that Frege, in trying to accommodate "essentially indexical" thoughts about oneself or the present time, is cornered by his theoretical commitments into the very implausible idea that we think about such things using idiosyncratic senses -- each of us grasps a distinct sense for ourselves, and a new sense for the present at every moment. The answer here again is that these "incommunicable" modes of presentation are cases of direct acquaintance: I'm directly acquainted with myself and with the present time. This proposal does little to diminish Perry's worry that we are being offered different modes of presentation (needed to determine different references) where there really is cognitive sameness; the view that different selves and nows are necessarily presented differently still seems a theoretical corner better avoided.

Kripke's own account of first-personal thought (in "The First Person," new here but based on a 2006 talk, and a companion to the Frege piece) does without the distinct modes of presentation but retains the idea that everyone is directly acquainted with herself (as a person "in the ordinary sense"), an idea which Kripke defends against Hume and Anscombe, whose views he finds incredible. He also suggests that direct self-acquaintance is integral to the meaning of the word "I," so that David Kaplan's semantic account of that "indexical" as referring to the agent (typically, the speaker) in any context is incomplete. The argument for this seems to be that Kaplan's account does not provide instructions that would enable someone who lacked a self-concept to use the expression. A theme of the paper is that there is no good reason to theorize only in a non-indexical, third-person "'scientific language' spoken by no one" (300); we can instead formulate rules in "the common language." Kripke proposes that, perhaps in addition to Kaplan's scientific-language rule, "it is a rule of the common language that each of us fixes the reference of 'I' by the description 'the subject'" (304). Doubts about the commonness and the meaning of that description aside, it is not clear to me how that rule would remedy self-conceptlessness, and it would not seem to be needed for anyone normally provisioned. (Most disturbingly of all, adding that rule would muddy a neat Kaplanian account of the car-window scribble, "Wash me!")

Also in "The First Person," Kripke argues that the apparatus of centered possible worlds is not needed to explain "essentially indexical" attitudes about oneself in a possible-worlds framework. The details of the proposal are a bit hard to make out, but apparently it is a version of the idea that the propositional content of a first-personal belief, say, that my pants are on fire, is the same as that of the belief that Crimmins' pants are on fire, the distinctive first-personality being a matter of how that content is represented (if I have that right, then the view is in its structure similar to Perry's in "The Problem of the Essential Indexical").

"Presupposition and Anaphora: Remarks on the Formulation of the Projection Problem" (2009) explores examples in which expressions like "too" or "again" come with presuppositions that derive from "looking back" to expressions in previous clauses or utterances, much as anaphoric pronouns look back for their reference.

Ancestors of some of the newly published pieces have seen stealth-dissemination by all manner of communicative chains: mimeograph, xerox, recording, and certainly word of mouth. The Surprise Examination and the Dogmatist (who knows that p and reasons that he should therefore ignore any future apparent counter-evidence) are treated in "On Two Paradoxes of Knowledge" (from 1972). "Vacuous Names and Fictional Entities" whets the appetite for Reference and Existence (originally the 1973 John Locke Lectures; newly published by Oxford this year). And one leaves "Nozick on Knowledge" (from 1986) feeling immense pity for the counterfactual analysis that has been subjected to a merciless barrage of ingenious counterexamples, including the widely-discussed red barn.

"Unrestricted Exportation and Some Morals for the Philosophy of Language" (new) contests the following counterintuitive view, attributed to various philosophers: for any description "the F" that denotes something, if someone believes that the F is a G, then there is a thing (the F, of course) that they believe to be a G. This principle has been motivated in two ways by those Kripke criticizes. First, our readiness to describe people as having ("de re") beliefs about things does not seem to obey any stable criterion that would furnish a natural distinction between the "really" de re and merely descriptive beliefs. Second, what vague and shifty intuitions we have that do seem to suggest some such distinction can be explained as driven by truth-conditionally irrelevant pragmatic mechanisms such as implicature. Kripke complains that here pragmatics is treated as a "wastebasket" for uncomfortable facts about usage that deserve more respect. And he recommends optimism that ordinary usage is sufficiently well-behaved that systematic, truth-conditional semantics can hope to explain it in an intuition-friendly way. This seems wise counsel, even if it leaves untouched the question of whether that talk will be explained as tracking some distinction or distinctions that are of theoretical interest, say, to epistemology or the philosophy of mind.

Finally, the new "A Puzzle about Time and Thought" presents and ponders a semantic/reflexive paradox: if I'm now thinking about those times t at which I'm not thinking of t, am I thinking about the present time?

Readers fond of the Greatest Hits will devour this book. You will not be disappointed in expecting savory new servings of philosophical substance sweetened by a familiar charm and wit.