2013.11.21

James P. Sterba

From Rationality to Equality

James P. Sterba, From Rationality to Equality, Oxford University Press, 2013, 228pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199580767.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


In this book James Sterba sets out to answer two central questions in moral philosophy: (1) Why be moral? and (2) What does morality require? (see Sterba's Preface and Introduction, esp., pp. 1-2). He understands (1) to be the question (1a): Are we always rationally required to do what we are morally required to do? However, I think the fundamental question is (1b): Is there always most reason to do what we are morally required to do? I may be rationally required to take a pill that I have overwhelming epistemic reason to believe will save my life when I am really not dying and the pill will actually kill me (imagine some doctor wants me dead and has presented me with conclusive evidence to make me believe that I am dying and that the pill is my only hope for survival). But in this case what there is most reason to do is to refrain from taking the pill even though the rational thing to do is to take the pill. I think what we want to know when we ask, "Why be moral?" is whether there is always most reason to do what is morally required. We want to know whether it is necessarily true that there ismost reason to do what is morally obligatory, not whether it's necessarily true that we are justified in believing that there is most reason to be moral.

I. Why be moral?

Sterba gives two arguments to answer the "Why be moral?" question. The first goes as follows

1. There are egoistic and altruistic reasons to act.

2. It would be question-begging to hold that egoistic reasons always take priority over altruistic reasons, and vice versa.

3. We should not beg the question.

4. Not begging the question in this context requires recognizing that high-ranking egoistic reasons take priority over low-ranking altruistic reasons, and vice versa.

5. Therefore, we should recognize that high-ranking egoistic reasons take priority over low-ranking altruistic reasons, and vice versa. (I'll call this the High-Low Thesis for short.)

The first worry is that a similar argument might be given by someone who is trying to reconcile the views of a racist and sexist. Suppose the racist concedes to the sexist that differences in gender provide some reason to act (say, that being male is some reason to prefer a male job applicant to an equally qualified female), and the sexist concedes to the racist that differences in race provide some reason to act (say, that being white is some reason to prefer a Caucasian job applicant to an equally qualified African American). Suppose, further, that each party has a way of ranking racist and sexist considerations, the racist, say, including blonde hair and blue eyes as being further reasons to prefer a Caucasian to an African American, and the sexist, say, including masculine features and size of male genitals as further reasons to prefer a man to a woman. The person trying to reconcile the views of the racist and sexist might argue as follows:

1.* There are racist and sexist reasons.

2.* It would be question-begging to hold that sexist reasons always take priority over racist reasons, and vice versa.

3. We should not beg the question.

4.* Not begging the question in this context requires recognizing that high-ranking sexist reasons take priority over low-ranking racist reasons, and vice versa.

5.* Therefore, we should recognize that high-ranking racist reasons take priority over low-ranking sexist reasons, and vice versa. (I'll call this the RS High-Low Thesis for short.)

Where has this argument gone wrong? Well, the most obvious place to start is with (1*). Why should we accept the claim that there are racist and sexist reasons? But that question makes us wonder why anyone, including the egoist, should accept (1) in the original argument. The racist-sexist argument makes us wonder why we should think that there are either egoistic or altruistic reasons since we think that there are neither racist nor sexist reasons. When it comes to the question of why we think there are both racist and sexist reasons, the answer can't be, "Because it would beg the question to assert that there are only racistor only sexist reasons, there must be both sorts of reason." Yet a parallel argument seems to be one of Sterba's arguments for believing that there are both egoistic and altruistic reasons. After saying that the view that there are only egoistic reasons and the view that there are only altruistic ones would beg the question, Sterba writes,

Consequently, in order not to beg the question, we have no alternative but to grant the status of prima facie reasons for action to relevant self-interested and moral or altruistic considerations and then try to determine which of these reasons for action we would be rationally required to act upon, all things considered. (p. 34; my italics)

Perhaps the egoist who already accepts that there are self-interested reasons to act would have to accept that there are moral and altruistic reasons, too, but someone coming to the question without prior commitments about practical reasons would not have to do that in order to avoid begging the question.

Sterba gives another argument for (1), the claim that there are both egoistic and altruistic reasons. He notes how "virtually all of us have [the general capacity] to act on both self-interested and altruistic reasons" (p. 40). He then concludes,

From this, we should conclude that both sorts of reason are relevant to rational choice and then ask the question which reasons should have priority. (p. 40; my italics)

But even if "virtually all of us" had the general capacity to act on both racist and sexist considerations, it is not true that we should conclude that there are both sorts of reason.

In the end, I think the only reason for thinking that (1) is true, but (1*) is not, is that there are certain examples that evoke intuitions that justify us in believing that there are both egoistic and altruistic reasons but no examples that evoke intuitions that there are either racist or sexist reasons. For instance, it seems intuitively obvious that I have a reason of self-interest to have a doctor set my broken arm and that everyone has an altruistic reason to save a drowning child if he can easily do that. So I think we are justified in believing (1), but not (1*), but not for the reasons Sterba gives.

Why would the egoist beg the question if he then went on to deny that high-ranking altruistic reasons ever outweigh even the lowest ranking egoistic reasons? Roughly, William James thought that pragmatic reasons are relevant to what we should believe only when evidence and epistemic reasons do not tell us what we should believe, and it's important for us to have a belief on some issue because there is a lot at stake for us. Perhaps altruistic reasons are relevant only when egoistic ones do not tell us what we should do and so their relation to egoistic reasons is like the relation of pragmatic to evidential reasons on James' view (as I've construed it) about what we should believe. Or perhaps egoistic and altruistic reasons are incommensurable. Many people think that epistemic and pragmatic reasons to believe are incommensurable, that it is impossible, say, to weigh evidential reasons against belief in God against pragmatic reasons for belief in God. If either this sort of view or the Jamesian view were correct when it comes to practical reasons, then it would not be true that high-ranking altruistic reasons outweigh low-ranking egoistic ones even though there are both sorts of reason. Maybe altruistic reasons come into play only when egoistic ones are silent, or maybe there just is no way to combine the two sorts of reason to determine what, all things considered, we should do. The epistemological analogies shift the burden of proof onto the opponent of the egoist who recognizes altruistic reasons but denies that they can ever trump egoistic reasons.

Once again, I think that Sterba will have to appeal to intuitions to defeat these views about the relation between egoistic and altruistic reasons. Isn't it intuitively obvious that there is more reason for me to throw a drowning child a life preserver than to uninterruptedly enjoy my walk along the beach on a sunny day? Isn't it intuitively obvious that there is more reason to give my delicious drink to a child who needs it to save her from an agonizing death than to gulp it down myself for the pleasure it gives me? I think that clearly the answer to these rhetorical questions is "yes." So the Jamesian and incommensurability views about the relation of egoistic to altruistic reasons must be incorrect. A person begs the question if and only if she asserts some premise that requires justification without providing it.[1] In light of intuitions evoked by examples like those I just presented, anyone who denied without reason that high-ranking altruistic reasons ever outweigh even the lowest ranking egoistic reasons would beg the question. This, I believe, constitutes a sound defense of premise (4) in my reconstruction ofSterba's argument.

I think that Sterba has a good argument for his conclusion, that is, a valid argument whose premises are justified, but I do not think that his conclusion, what I have called the High-Low Thesis, will get him what he wants. There are infinite ways to weight egoistic against altruistic reasons that respect the High-Low Thesis. If morality is a compromise between these two sorts of reasons, as Sterba maintains, which weighting (or range of weightings) does morality require? Sterba later tries to answer this question when he addresses the second central question in moral philosophy, "What does morality require?", and later I will discuss his argument meant to answer that question.

For now, assume that we can answer the question of how morality weights egoistic against altruistic reasons. The next question to ask is whether practical reason requires in all cases the weighting (or range of weightings) that morality requires. Since practical reason has only been shown to imply the High-Low Thesis, it might require us to weight egoistic and altruistic reasons differently than morality in areas not involving high-low conflicts.

Assume that among egoistic reasons for action, the satisfaction of basic needs is a high-ranking (H) reason for action; of luxury needs (such as a multi-million dollar house or yacht), a low-ranking reason for action (L), and of intermediate needs (such as the need for a new car, a nice house, or a vacation overseas), an intermediate-ranking reason for action (I). Suppose we can rank altruistic reasons similarly so that some altruistic considerations constitute high-ranking; others, low; still others, intermediate, reasons for action. Then the following matrix illustrates possible combinations of different egoistic and altruistic rankings of reasons for action.

 

 

 

Altruistic Reasons

 

 

 

Low

Intermediate

High

Egoistic Reasons

High

(1)

(2)

(3)

 

Intermediate

(4)

(5)

(6)

 

Low

(7)

(8)

(9)

The High-Low Thesis says that reason requires acting according to the rankings in (1) and (9), but so far says nothing about the rankings in (2)-(8). Further, what guarantees that morality ranks considerations that fall in cells (2)-(8) the same as practical reason ranks them? Professional rules of conduct might prohibit types of action that morality permits. For instance, the professional rules of conduct governing psychiatry might prohibit sexual relations between a psychiatrist and his patient even long after that patient has ceased being his patient. Nevertheless, we can conceive of situations where a loving and sexual relation would be morally permissible (say, where after many years of therapy genuine love develops between psychiatrist and patient, a love that lies dormant after therapy ends until much later when a chance meeting between patient and therapist serves as a catalyst for a romantic relationship between them). Similarly, morality may prohibit actions that practical reason permits (say, failing to vote in an important election in a democracy where the likelihood that your vote will decide the issue is close to zero).

Later I'll return briefly to the question of whether practical reason always requires what morality requires, but now I want to turn to the arguments Sterba gives to answer the second central question in moral philosophy, "What does morality require?"

II. What does morality require?

Sterba gives two different arguments to the conclusion that morality requires a kind of equality. He claims that the first of these arguments rests on the view that "ought" implies "can"; the second, on the prohibition against begging the question. Here is an argument that is relevantly similar to the one that Sterba gives, though it makes reference to mutual relinquishing of liberties and can be construed as arguing directly for what Sterba calls a positive welfare right that the rich owe the poor, that is, a right the poor have against the rich to help them satisfy their basic needs, not just a right against the rich that they not interfere with the liberty of the poor to take some of the luxury surplus from the rich. Because it is relevantly similar to Sterba's actual argument, the objections I will raise to it are similar to ones that apply to Sterba's actual argument.

1. If a person ought morally to do something, then it is reasonable to require him to do it ("ought" implies "can" in the sense of "can reasonably do").[2]

2. Without getting something in return, it would be unreasonable for the poor to give up their liberty to take from the luxury surplus of the rich what they need to fulfill their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts, pp. 113 and 127) and that would otherwise be spent by the rich on luxury needs (goods).

3. It would not be unreasonable for the rich to give up their liberty to spend their wealth on luxury needs (goods) in order to meet the basic needs of the poor, at least if in exchange the poor give up their liberty to take from the rich what they need to fulfill their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts, pp. 113 and 127).

4. A moral resolution to a conflict requires that it be reasonable (or at least not unreasonable) for everyone affected to accept it. (p. 112)

5. There is a severe conflict of interest between the rich and the poor where the poor can meet their basic needs (honorably and with self-respect) only if the rich make some sacrifice to help the poor meet those needs.

6. Reason requires the rich to give up at least some of their liberty to meet some of their luxury needs so that the poor can meet their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts), provided the poor give up their liberty to take from the luxury surplus of the rich what is required for the poor to meet their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts) and that would otherwise be spent by the rich on luxury goods. Further, reason requires the poor to give up that liberty provided the rich give up the liberty to meet all of their luxury needs. (p. 112) (I do not find explicitly in Sterba these provisos about the mutual relinquishing of liberties, though their addition, I believe, strengthens rather than weakens Sterba's argument.)

7. So morality requires the rich to give up at least some of their liberty to meet some of their luxury needs so that the poor can meet their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts) and that the poor give up their liberty to take from the luxury surplus of the rich what is required for the poor to meet their basic needs (that they cannot meet honorably and with self-respect through their own efforts) and that would otherwise be spent by the rich on luxury needs (goods). (from 4, 5, 6) (Note that premise (1), the "ought" implies "can" principle, plays no role in this argument, unless somehow it provides support for (4).)

Of course, an egoist might object to (6) on the ground that it may not be in the self-interest of the rich to give up any of their liberty to meet their luxury needs. It might be more in their self-interest to hire security guards to protect that liberty than to compromise with the poor. But here is where Sterba's earlier argument for what I have called the High-Low Thesis comes into play, for it implies that the low-ranking egoistic reason of the rich in luxury goods is trumped by the high-ranking altruistic reason to help the poor meet their basic needs, regardless of whether it is in the interest of the rich to hire security guards.

Sterba points out that strictly speaking the conclusion of his argument does not imply that the rich have a moral obligation to help the poor meet their basic needs. It only establishes that they have an obligation not to interfere with the liberty of the poor to take what they need from the luxury surplus of the rich (pp. 118-19). He gives other supplementary arguments based on the likelihood that the rich will violate the right of the poor to take from their surplus if they do not help the poor meet their basic needs, and on pragmatic grounds, to conclude that the rich also have a positive duty to help the poor. But if the argument is constructed as I have above, it will follow directly that the rich have a positive duty to help the poor meet their basic needs provided the poor give up their liberty to take from the luxury surplus of the rich. Practical reason requires not only that the rich not interfere with the liberty of the poor but that theyalso help them to meet their basic needs. That seems like a reasonable exchange if the poor give up their liberty to take from the rich.

Sterba's second argument to the same conclusion as his "ought" implies "can" argument rests on his non-question begging premise. Basically, it will be invoked to justify acceptance of (6) in the above argument. He will contend that it would beg the question to maintain that the liberty of the rich to spend their wealth as they please, including on luxury goods when others cannot meet their basic needs, outweighs all other liberties, including the liberty of the poor to take from the surplus of the rich. He maintains that the liberty of the rich to spend their money on luxury goods will be a low-ranking liberty and that of the poor to meet their basic needs a high-ranking one. So the only way to avoid begging the question is to rank them appropriately.

So far Sterba has only argued for welfare rights, that is, a right for the poor to have their basic needs satisfied. That is a long way from arguing for equality because meeting that right is compatible with huge inequalities between the rich and the poor; providing a minimal "floor" for the poor is compatible with the rich having a level of wealth way above that "floor."Sterba argues for equality by first arguing that distant people and future generations have a right to have their basic needs satisfied and then citing various empirical considerations to show that this right of distant people and future generations can be satisfied only if we use up no more resources than are needed to meet "our own basic needs, thus securing for ourselves a decent life but no more" (p. 130).

But the conclusion of the argument for welfare rights only says that the poor have a right to take from the rich what the rich require to satisfy their luxury needs, that is, to take from the rich what we might call their luxury surplus. According to Sterba, "Basic needs, if not satisfied, lead to significant lacks and deficiencies with respect to a standard of mental and physical well-being" (p. 183; my italics).[3] Between basic needs and luxury needs are what we might call intermediate needs. Owning a sixty-foot yacht might be a luxury need for some rich person, but owning an eighteen-foot speed (water-ski) boat would be neither a luxury nor a basic need. Owning a mansion might be a luxury need, but owning a very nice house would be neither a luxury nor a basic need. For someone living in a rural area, owning a car might be a basic need and owning a very expensive car a luxury need, but owning a moderately priced new car would neither be a luxury nor a basic need. So why think that anyone, either currently existing people or future generations, have a right against the rich, or anyone else, to give up what they require to meet their intermediate needs?

Sterba's arguments established a High-Low Thesis, not a High-Intermediate Thesis. Could they be extended to establish a High-Intermediate Thesisthat is, the view that high-ranking reasons take priority over intermediate-ranking ones, whether egoistic or altruistic? Cell (6) in the matrix I offered above represents cases where intermediate-ranking egoistic reasons conflict with high-ranking altruistic reasons. Suppose, for instance, that the rich have been taxed to help meet the basic needs of the poor to such an extent that they no longer can meet their luxury needs. They no longer have enough money to afford a mansion or a yacht or to travel year round all over the world. Suppose that many people still have enough money to afford a nice house, a moderately priced new car, and a yearly vacation for a week overseas. However, imagine that for the basic needs of all the poor to be met people who are moderately well-off still would have to give up all of their wealth except what is required for them to meet their basic needs. Would they be required by morality and practical reason to do that?

I think Sterba would argue that they would. Assume that those moderately well-off, as well as the poor, have worked hard in morally respectable jobs to acquire what they have. The poor challenge the moderately well-off to justify why they should have more while they, the poor, are so badly off. I think Sterba would say that it would beg the question for the moderately well-off to answer that they earned what they have "fair and square" so there is no adequate reason that requires them to give any of it up to meet the basic needs of the poor. The rich would beg the question if they said that they earned what they have "fair and square" so that there is no adequate reason that requires them to give any of it up to meet the basic needs of the poor. So why is the "fair and square" response of the moderately well-off any better than that of the rich when challenged to defend their being better off than those whose basic needs are not being met? I think Sterba would say that the same burden of proof is on the moderately well-off as on the rich when the only way for the poor to meet their basic needs is for the moderately well-off to give up what they have beyond what is needed for them to meet their basic needs.

Perhaps those whose intermediate needs are met could argue that no one can be required to sacrifice what she needs to lead a decent life, and if her intermediate needs are not satisfied, she cannot live a decent life. But the notion of a decent life is extremely vague. Some might think that if a couple has a two-room apartment with heat, enough money to buy food, a small TV, an old but running car, health care coverage, and access to public education, they can lead a decent life. Other couples will say that they could not lead a decent life if they did not have two new cars, two cell phones, a cottage up north in Michigan, and enough money to travel to see their grandchildren and visit Europe. So what are people required to sacrifice to meet the basic needs of the poor, those who are really badly off? The two new cars, the cell phones, etc., or the two-bedroom apartment, the one running car, etc? And if you say not the latter, why not? The very poor argue that they are even worse off having no warm place to stay, no car, no TV, etc. They say it begs the question to assert that a couple with a two-bedroom heated apartment, a small TV, an old but running car, etc., are not required to make sacrifices to help the really badly off. Where do we draw even a fuzzy line between what is needed to lead a decent life and what are just luxury goods? And even if we could draw such a line, why shouldn't those who have what they need to lead a decent life be required to sacrifice even more for those that are really badly off?

I don't think Sterba has answered these questions, but I also do not think that they are answerable. The question of what is a decent life is like the question: when is a bunch of beans piled on top of each other a heap, and when isn't it? Suppose something important turned on how many beans a person has. The question of why people who have a decent life should not be required to sacrifice more for those who are really badly off is like asking why those who do not even have a heap of beans should not be required to sacrifice some of the beans they have to help others who have even fewer beans. I think any answer to that last question will rest on intuitions about how much sacrifice reason requires when that sacrifice is needed to help those very badly off. How many beans must a person give up to help others, regardless of whether giving them up will leave one with a decent life or put one below that floor, but still well above others? I believe that question does not have a determinate answer.

So what should we do? As a practical matter, we should do all we can to increase the amount of renewable resources and to limit the size of the world's population so that there is enough to go around for everyone to lead a decent human life even on the highest interpretation of that notion. It would be even better if there were enough for some to lead even more than a decent human life. Neither practical reason nor morality requires equality, certainly not at the level of the most basic human needs, if there is a way to guarantee equality at a much higher level and even allows for inequalities beyond that.[4]



[1] Sterba says that the principle of non-question-beggingness “is a requirement of fair argumentation. It proscribes arguments, irrespective of their validity, where the conclusion is explicitly or blatantly in the premises, but not arguments where the conclusion is implicitly or subtly contained in the premises” (p. 56). If begging the question proscribes arguments where the conclusion is explicitly or blatantly in the premises, it is because arguments of the form, “P; therefore, P” do not provide any justification for P since P cannot justify itself. So even an argument that contains the conclusion “implicitly or subtly” in the premises will beg the question if those premises are not themselves justified. For instance, an argument that contains the premises: P and if P, then Q, and then concludes Q, will beg the question if one of those premises stands in need of justification, regardless of whether the conclusion is explicitly and blatantly, or only implicitly and subtly (say, because P and Q are complex propositions), contained in the premises.

[2] Sterba says in footnote 15, p. 112 that this is the contrapositive of what he calls the “ought” implies “can” principle.  

[3] In footnote 2, p. 5, Sterba lists “needs for food, shelter, medical care, protection, companionship, and self-development” among our basic needs. What I call intermediate needs go beyond these but at the same time do not seem to involve luxury needs or goods. Though Sterba did not explicitly refer to this category of needs, there is nothing in his view that prohibits his recognizing this category explicitly and considering its relevance.

[4]I want to thank Jim Sterba for the many valuable discussions we have had on earlier drafts of this review. I think the review has improved considerably as a result, though I do not expect Jim to agree with everything I have written here. In conversation Jim suggested the importance of limiting, perhaps even reducing, total population to insure that everyone now and in the future can lead a decent human life.