John P. Burgess


John P. Burgess, Kripke, Polity, 2012, 219pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780745652856.

Reviewed by Gary Ostertag, The Saul Kripke Center, The Graduate Center, CUNY and Nassau Community College





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John Burgess's book is a gem: an accessible yet nuanced introduction to the work of one of our greatest living philosophers. While the book can serve as a selective introduction not only to Kripke's thought, but also more generally to core topics in contemporary analytic philosophy, it also has much to offer seasoned Kripke scholars. The discussions of Kripke on modal epistemology, on Wittgenstein on rules, and on a posteriori necessities involving natural kinds -- to mention just three topics -- will be read with interest by anyone working in the relevant areas. More than that, the book is eminently readable, witty -- in fact, downright funny in places -- and both tells a compelling story about Kripke's place in the history of philosophy and shows how central themes of his oeuvre interrelate. The chapters concern, in order: names, necessity, identity, rules, belief and the mind.[1] Along the way, Kripke's views are illuminated by numerous examples drawn from biology, classics, history, logic and mathematics.

And although undeniably an admirer of Kripke, Burgess is also forthright in his criticisms, showing, for example, where the arguments in the published work are incomplete and require further elaboration. One virtue of the book, in keeping with its intended purpose (as an introductory survey), is that, while it points out areas where work needs to be done or clarification might be called for, it does not attempt to endorse alternative accounts to Kripke's or to advance a positive neo-Kripkean agenda. It is, in the best sense of the term, a critical reconstruction of Kripke's views and arguments in their historical context. There are, however, several cases where Burgess tracks a trend that reassesses the conventional Kripkean wisdom. A particular area where this is so -- where Burgess says more than strictly needs to be said (again, without necessarily endorsing a position) -- is in the area of proper names and the semantics of belief. I will first discuss a recent alternative to Kripke's treatment of proper names that Burgess considers in some detail. Then I discuss, respectively, Burgess's treatment of the "mystery of modality" and the skeptical paradox Kripke finds in Wittgenstein.

The New Metalinguisticism

Naming and Necessity is commonly held to have undermined the once-popular view -- the so-called Frege-Russell theory -- that a proper name abbreviates a definite description, or perhaps a cluster of definite descriptions. Kripke's modal argument showed that such an approach gets the modal profiles (i.e., possible-worlds truth conditions) of ordinary assertions involving proper names disastrously wrong. The proposition expressed by 'Michelle's husband jogs' and that expressed by 'Barack jogs' clearly have different possible-worlds truth conditions, so taking the former sentence to analyze the latter would seem hopeless. Equally hopeless would be analyzing the latter as: 'The bearer of Barack jogs.' After all, the proposition expressed by 'Barack jogs' is true at worlds at which the actual referent -- Obama -- does not bear the name 'Barack'.

However, it has seemed to many that the triviality of 'Barack is called Barack' reflects a feature of the semantics of that name. Indeed, Jerrold Katz (1994) claimed that such a sentence is analytic, and argued on this basis that its sense structure contains a metalinguistic sense. In particular, 'Barack' is taken to mean: 'the contextually definite bearer of Barack.' Names, on Katz's view, are effectively incomplete descriptions.

These intuitions notwithstanding, metalinguistic theories have not fared well in responding to the modal argument. Some descriptivists have followed Michael Dummett's (1973) early lead in claiming that names should be analyzed as descriptions that take obligatory wide scope with respect to modal operators and obligatory narrow scope with respect to believes and other attitude verbs. I will set these approaches aside here, as Burgess omits discussion of them. Rather, I will consider a descendent of the "actualized descriptions" approach, due to Ora Matushansky (2008). While Burgess stops short of endorsing this approach, he takes seriously the suggestion that it provides a genuine alternative to the view, still dominant among philosophers (if not linguists), that names are semantically simple expressions, lacking descriptive content. One intriguing aspect of his proposal is that, while it provides a descriptivist alternative to the direct reference theory -- an approach that, although not endorsed by Kripke, provides the most natural implementation of his overall approach -- it also incorporates an important Kripkean element: namely, that the reference of a name is partly determined by its causal-historical pedigree.

What we might call "the naïve metalinguistic theory" takes a name such as 'Barack' to abbreviate a definite description of the form 'the bearer of Barack'. One way to address the problem concerning modal profiles is to rigidify the description. Let's assume for simplicity that no one besides Obama bears the name 'Barack'. Then we can say that 'Barack jogs' abbreviates 'the actual bearer of Barack jogs.' While this analysis gets the modal profile right, it has, as Burgess notes, unacceptable consequences when we consider counterfactual attitudes. Let's say that Mary doesn't believe that Barack jogs, but that she might have believed this had she seen him jogging or had she read about his jogging. On the current theory, in reporting her counterfactual attitude we attribute to Mary a belief about the actual world -- that the bearer of 'Barack' at it -- the actual world -- jogs. This seems bizarre. Surely Mary, qua occupant of world w, need not have any belief -- even by description -- about our world for her to believe, at w, that Barack jogs here![2]

The general point is that a theory of names must not only provide an adequate treatment of the modal profiles of simple sentences; it must also provide an adequate treatment of the ascription of counterfactual attitudes. That is, it is not enough to assign the right modal profile to a simple sentence such as 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' -- one must also show how this embeds in larger constructions without violating certain obvious desiderata. Consider, for example, (1):

(1) If the Greeks had never learned the results of Babylonian astronomy, Aristotle   would have believed that Hesperus and Phosphorus were distinct.

The actualized-descriptions view assigns a proposition to the that-clause that we can assume to have the correct modal profile (setting aside for the moment concerns about the uniqueness of the implied descriptions). The problem, however, is that (1)'s truth would have Aristotle entertaining a proposition that makes reference to the actual world -- in particular, that the bearer of 'Hesperus' at the actual world is not the bearer of 'Phosphorus' at the actual world. But this is deeply implausible.

As Burgess notes, metalinguisticism thus forfeits any advantage it might have over the direct reference theory. To get the right truth conditions for (1), the advocate of the metalinguistic approach would seem forced to resort to a direct-reference analysis, namely:

(2) Consider on the one hand Hesperus, i.e., Venus, and consider on the other hand, Phosphorus, i.e., Venus. If the Greeks had never learned the results of Babylonian astronomy, Aristotle would have believed that the former and the latter were distinct.

And this just has Aristotle counterfactually believing that Venus is not Venus -- hardly an advance over direct reference. What is needed, and

what descriptivism seemed originally to promise us, was intuitively speaking a de dicto reading of [(1)] that has Aristotle in the counterfactual possible world saying to himself, 'Is Hesperus identical with Phosphorus? I don't believe so' (or the Greek equivalent) and meaning by it what Homer in the actual world meant by it. (95)

Burgess notes that an analysis that is de re not with respect to Venus but to the names 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' must also fail to give the desired reading (95­-96). But it points the way to what appears to be an adequate treatment:

(3) Consider the names 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' as used in the tradition to which our own usage belongs. If the Greeks had not learned the results of Babylonian astronomy, Aristotle would have believed that the object bearing the former and the object bearing the latter were distinct.

Here, the analysis is de re with respect to the "traditions of usage" of the two names. This gives the correct modal profile, since appealing to our tradition of usage of (say) 'Hesperus' is both Hesperus-involving and at the same time sufficiently fine-grained to get us the right use of the name.

On the version of the metalinguistic theory being floated, then, the proposition that 'Mary believes that Barack jogs' is de re with respect to an implicitly referred-to naming convention. This proposition is true just in case Mary believes, of the convention in virtue of which Barack is called 'Barack', that the bearer of 'Barack' according to it jogs.

As indicated, the general form of approach -- what I'll call "the hidden-indexical theory of proper names" (HPN) -- is due to Matushansky (2008). On HPN, sentences containing names in subject position make implicit, contextually-determined reference to a naming convention. Accordingly, 'Barack' is analyzed as:

(4) The bearer of 'Barack' by virtue of the naming convention R

The rigidity of proper names as they occur in argument position is held to be a result of this contextual supplementation.[3] This needs to be qualified, however. The proposition that Barack jogs is true at w just in case Barack jogs there. HPN fails to capture this intuitive datum, for there are worlds at which Barack jogs but where the HPN proposition assigned to 'Barack jogs' as we use it must be false -- either Barack is not there so-called, or he is so-called but in virtue of some convention other than the actual one. Thus, the proposition expressed by 'that guy is Barack' will not be necessarily true, even when true. While not a decisive consideration against the proposal, it is certainly worth noting.

A more pressing concern relates to the fact that the description piggybacks on a pre-existing naming convention. It is hard to see how this could be so without the relevant name functioning as a name. That is, if (4) is adopted, then 'Barack jogs' is true just in case the bearer of 'Barack' by virtue of the naming convention R jogs. It thus follows directly that there exists a convention, namely R, according to which 'Barack' refers to Barack. If so, then we are faced with the consequence that 'Barack' -- independently of abbreviating a description of any sort -- is also a name of Barack.

Why is this a problem? Well, if we adopt (4), then 'Barack jogs' expresses a descriptive proposition, one true just in case the individual satisfying the description jogs. But according to (4), the denoted individual is a bearer of 'Barack' in virtue of R, which entails that there is a separate relation between Obama and 'Barack', one not mediated by a description. If this is so, then we can ask: What is the content of 'Barack jogs' when 'Barack' occurs as a name? It certainly cannot be the proposition that (4) would assign to it -- namely, that the bearer of 'Barack' according to R jogs. Since 'Barack' qua name refers to Obama in virtue of a naming convention, it would make no sense to say that the name in fact refers to Obama via his satisfying an associated metalinguistic description, even less via his satisfying a description that refers relative to a naming convention.[4]

A related worry is that the proposal commits what Barwise and Perry call "the fallacy of misplaced information": "The idea that all information in an utterance must come from [the proposition expressed]" (1983, 38). The analysis appears to conflate the meta-semantic claim that the bearer of 'Barack' is so-called in virtue of R and the semantic claim that 'Barack' means 'the bearer of Barack in virtue of R'.

To see this, consider a theorist who analyzes the obviously ambiguous term 'bank' as: the bearer of 'bank' according to C (where C is a convention for using the term). This would take 'bank' to be an unambiguous term, but one whose content varied from context to context, depending on which use-convention (as indicating a financial institution vs. the sloping edge at the side of a river) was salient. The idea is absurd, of course: The information that enables us to disambiguate senses of 'bank' is not properly speaking contextual information, at least as that notion is normally understood. But then one wonders why the information that enables us to disambiguate senses (or uses) of 'Barack' gets elevated to this status.

It seems that the most natural way of incorporating Kripke's meta-semantic proposal about how reference is determined is not to adopt a hidden-indexical theory, in which naming conventions enter into the content of what is said, but rather to see the salient conventions as (merely) determining what is said. (Although not in the sense in which what is said is a function, in Kaplan's sense, of the naming convention.) To incorporate that convention into what is said seems to mislocate the relevant phenomenon. Moreover, one might ask: If linguistic conventions are part of the content here, why not elsewhere? Such conventions could just as easily enter into the content of 'bank'. Since it is obvious that they do not, we need an answer to the question of why they enter into the analysis only of proper names.[5]

Modal Mystery

Kant writes: "Experience teaches us that a thing is so and so, but not that it cannot be otherwise." The mystery of modality is how we can learn that a thing cannot be otherwise (when indeed it cannot be). It can be framed as the question: 'How is a priori knowledge possible?' In the case of analytic truths, the answer -- at least for Kant -- was not particularly elusive: It is because the concept of the predicate is -- in some way to be made clear -- contained in the concept of the subject. But the residual question -- 'How is synthetic a priori knowledge possible?' -- remained unanswered. By the middle of the twentieth century the question of the mystery of modality had been re-conceived: the most pressing cases of putative synthetic a priori knowledge -- that is, the truths of arithmetic -- were reclassified as analytic. All else was either analytic (and thus a priori) or synthetic a posteriori. Moreover, the analytic itself had been rendered entirely un-mysterious, since these were truths known on the basis of linguistic convention. This latter move was coupled with the assimilation of the necessary to the a priori, so that at one stroke the mysteries of necessity and a priority were solved.

Kripke's entry onto this scene, as Burgess notes, involved reversing the thumbnail sketch just provided, "thus reinstating the mystery of modality, previously erroneously thought to have been dissolved. . . . According to Kripke, the whole line of thought from Kant to Frege to Carnap went wrong at its very first step" (6). The error was in supposing that, since experience is never sufficient to show us that something cannot be otherwise, it is also never necessary to show that something cannot be otherwise. But there are many examples Kripke provides that show this to be false: there are truths (that water is H­0, that Hesperus is Phosphorus, etc.) that are, while necessary, only ascertainable as such via sense experience.

As Burgess argues, this raises a mystery of its own. The question now is: "How is a posteriori knowledge of necessity possible?" Kant is clearly wrong that we cannot come to know a necessary truth via experience -- most people who know that Fermat's Last Theorem is true know this based on the testimony of mathematicians or science journalists. What allows such people to know this truth, Kripke claims, is that they know a priori, not that the theorem is true, but that, if the theorem is true, it is true necessarily. (The "a posteriori" part is learning that the theorem is true via testimony.) In an addendum to Naming and Necessity, Kripke makes a similar claim for the non-mathematical cases:

All the cases of the necessary a posteriori advocated in the text have the special character attributed to mathematical statements: Philosophical analysis tells us that they cannot be contingently true, so any empirical knowledge of their truth is automatically empirical knowledge that they are necessary. (159; quoted in Burgess, p. 76)

The picture that emerges is that the layperson's knowledge that Fermat's Last Theorem (or Goldbach's Conjecture, to use Kripke's example) is true -- and thus necessarily true -- although not itself a priori, is guided by a priori knowledge that the claim "cannot be contingently true". There thus remains a crucial, if diminished, role for a priori knowledge to play. The remaining mystery is to discover the a priori principles at work here. Commenting on the above quotation, Burgess writes:

In the case of each of Kripke's examples, he suggests, there is an a priori element, telling us that something is either necessary or impossible. Across the range of examples there are a range of a priori principles playing the role that in the Goldbach example is played by the principle that mathematical facts couldn't have been otherwise. Perhaps the principles at work are something like these: Whatever parents a person actually had, any character having different parents wouldn't count as that person; whatever composition a natural substance actually has, any stuff having a different composition wouldn't count as that substance; whatever genus or family or order or class or phylum a species belongs to, a group belonging to a different one wouldn't count as that species; and so on. (77; emphasis omitted)

These are plausible principles, but the question now raised is: How do we come to know such principles? There is little to go on here, beyond what has already been quoted. Burgess conjectures that Kripke had in mind that the principles are "analytic, ultimately resting on rules of language" (77), basing this interpretation on the fact that, for Kripke, "philosophical analysis" ultimately grounds our ability to detect the sort of truth conditions that mathematical statements have – i.e., non-contingent.

However, it seems to me doubtful, given his general hostility to conventionalist views, that Kripke would invoke linguistic rules at this point. This, after all, would be a significant, and surprising, concession to the Carnapian.[6] Thus, while Burgess is right to note that more needs to be said to get to the bottom of the mystery, the suggestion that the solution lies in the analysis of language is implausible.

Skeptical Paradox

Burgess's treatment of Kripke's Wittgenstein in Chapter 5 ("Rules") is concise and pointed. After introductory discussions of conventionalism, the relation Kripke's Wittgenstein (popularly,"Kripkenstein") bears to the Wittgenstein of the Investigations, and an illuminating comparison of the former with Hume, he discusses, in order, the skeptical paradox and the skeptical solution. The setup of the paradox is swift and includes a subtle discussion of the nature of the meaning-constituting fact that is at the heart of the paradox. The key question is: What fact is it about me that determines whether, in the past, I meant plus by '+' and not, say, quus (where the latter is just like plus for pairs each of whose members are less than 57, but which otherwise yields 5 as value)?

If there is such a fact, it is somehow determined by my past usage. One possibility is that I have, in learning how to use '+', internalized a rule. The problem here is that representing the rule involves other concepts -- counting, combining, and so on. And each of these is such that a quus-style alternative is available and cannot be discounted (perhaps I mean quounting by 'counting', where the result of quounting two heaps, one of which has more than 57 elements, will invariably be 5). Of course, there might be a further rule that determines the meaning of 'count' -- a rule to interpret the original rule -- but there is no reason to think that this will not itself either involve the original addition rule, and thus be circular, or end in a regress of rules.

Thus we arrive at Wittgenstein's crucial paragraph: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule" (1953: §201). The upshot is that "the 'meaning fact' we have been looking for is not to be found in rules and interpretations, but must be sought elsewhere, in what 'is exhibited' when a rule is obeyed or gone against" (117).

There are two possibilities here: What is exhibited is (i) exhibited to the subject -- e.g., the "feeling" that one is being "guided" -- or is (ii) exhibited to the observer -- e.g., behavioral dispositions. I will here focus on (ii).

The standard objection to the dispositionalist analysis of meaning is that it fails to reflect the normativity of meaning. Consider the fact Φ that determines that, in the past, I meant plus by '+'. Knowledge of Φ would allow me to determine that I ought to answer '125' in response to 'What is 68 + 57?' If we accept the dispositional analysis, Φ concerns my dispositions to answer questions of the form 'how much is n + m?' Accordingly, knowing Φ -- that I am disposed to answer questions of the relevant form in such-and-such a manner -- would provide me with grounds for responding correctly to the above question. I should, at least in principle, be able to derive how I ought to respond from how I have responded. But it is clear that I can be disposed to make a mistake here and there, and thus that I could, for example, derive that I should respond with '5' to the question asked above. If so, the dispositional fact fails to ground the normativity constraint.

Burgess conveys Kripke's dialectic in admirably clear terms, recapitulating the essential features of his complex discussion. The summary of the skeptical solution is also crisp. The transition (from discussion of the problem to discussion of the solution) involves the recognition that the case of meaning ascription is not somehow special. That is, the question concerning the "superlative fact" that makes true the claim that I meant plus in the past by '+' is echoed by questions that have nothing to do with meaning ascriptions:

there is something dizzying in trying to hold onto the view of declarative sentences as in other cases still depicting or reporting facts when it is conceded that sentences about what a given speaker means by a given sentence -- sentences about which fact a given speaker takes a given sentence to depict or report -- do not themselves depict or report facts. (120-21).

This requires a "whole new theory of meaning", to which he then turns.

To keep things manageable, Burgess considers the lineaments of such a theory only in application to meaning ascription. The rough idea is that meaning ascriptions no longer are seen as depicting or representing facts. Rather, "an account of the meaning of a declarative sentence should include an account of its assertability conditions and its application" (121-22). Thus, to say that Jones meant plus in using '+' is to say that Jones' usage has been observed to conform to the community's usage. Burgess is quick to point out that this move is not business as usual:

Above all, the statement that Jones means plus by 'plus' is on Kripke's interpretation emphatically not a picture of the fact that Jones has internalized certain assertability conditions, any more than it is a picture of the fact that Jones has internalized certain truth conditions. (196 n.16; see also Kripke 1982: 111)

It remains to ask what the move to "assertability conditions" gets us. Surely, a skeptical challenge can be raised here as well: Jones' usage can conform to the community's usage and yet depart for numbers greater than a certain integer. "But what matters . . . is only that members of the community generally do not in practice disagree on how the rules apply. It does not matter that a skeptic might in principle do so or pretend to do so" (122-23).

Burgess is not satisfied with this "solution". As he writes:

the language-game of meaning ascriptions that has been given so far is too crude and only amounts to a first approximation. It hardly distinguishes the role of 'Jones means plus by "plus"' from the role of . . . 'Jones is, as regards what causally underlies his use of "plus," in the same kind of state as we are.' But there certainly is supposed to be a difference. (123)

What Burgess has in mind here is that the knowledge of the former -- that Jones means plus by 'plus' -- warrants an answer to the question, 'How should Jones respond to the question, "What is 68 + 57?"' But if we cannot distinguish the former ascription from the latter, then no answer is warranted and the normativity constraint is unsatisfied.

Burgess ends with some conjectures as to why Kripke rejects the Wittgensteinian approach just sketched, admitting however that the remarks are merely speculative and that he is "unable to supply what we really want here, Kripke's own statement of his objections to the Wittgensteinian 'skeptical solution,' and above all, Kripke's own account of his solution to Wittgenstein's 'skeptical paradox'" (127).

I do wish that Soames' (1997) response to the skeptical problem had been mentioned here, if only because it provides a (broadly speaking) Kripkean response to the problem. Recall that the dispositional account fails the normativity constraint, since I am unable to justify my answer to the above question based on an appeal to the truths characterizing my dispositions. What Soames considers, however, is the possibility that some set of non-intentional truths -- perhaps not restricted to truths concerning my dispositions -- necessitates that I meant plus by '+' even though they do not figure in an a priori proof of this fact. That is, even if knowledge of the relevant dispositional facts does not put me in a position to know how I should answer the above question, there is some set of facts about my past arithmetical behavior -- facts that can be described in terms devoid of semantic or propositional-attitude vocabulary -- from which it is a necessary (if not a priori) consequence that I should respond with '125'.

Thus Kripke's distinction between two kinds of necessity -- metaphysical and epistemic -- can be used to respond to the skeptic. Whether or not one accepts this response, it is an important move in the overall dialectic. The fact that the move depends essentially on a Kripkean innovation (however unrelated) would make it worth mentioning in this context, if only to show the power of the insight.


There is much I have not touched on, including, in chapter 3, a useful clarification of Kripke's "backtracking" method in evaluating the metaphysical status of certain modal claims, as well as an important challenge to his approach to natural kind terms. I have also omitted entirely, for reasons of space, discussion of the final chapter, on the philosophy of mind. While Kripke is not a systematic philosopher in the standard sense of that term, his writings are nonetheless illuminated by the careful, systematic exposition provided here. Burgess has given us a book that reflects Kripke's thought in all its richness and complexity -- one that does not shy away from pointing out lacunae and loose ends, but one that is also appreciative of Kripke's sense of "puzzlement and mystery" in the face of questions that stubbornly resist further clarification.[7]


Barwise Jon, and John Perry. 1983. Situations and Attitudes. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Dummett, Michael. 1973. Frege: Philosophy of Language. London: Duckworth.

Katz, Jerrold. 1994. Names without Bearers. Philosophical Review. 103(1): 1-39.

Kripke, Saul. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Kripke, Saul. 1982. Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Matushansky, Ora 2008. On the Linguistic Complexity of Proper Names. Linguistics and Philosophy 21(5): 573-627.

Soames, Scott. 1997. Skepticism about Meaning: Indeterminacy, Normativity, and the Rule-Following Paradox. In Ali A. Kazmi, ed. Meaning and Reference. Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Supplementary vol. 23: 211- 49. Reprinted in Philosophical Essays, Volume 2: The Philosophical Significance of Language (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2009).

Soames, Scott. 2002. Beyond Rigidity. New York: Oxford University Press.

Wittgenstein, L. 1953. Philosophical Investigations, Trans. G.E.M. Anscombe. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

[1] There are also two valuable semi-technical appendices  --  on "Models" and "Truth". The former contains a brief history of the model theory of modal logic, showing "why and how Kripke's contribution was the decisive one", as well as a useful discussion of the Barcan Formula. (The section title, "The Curse of the Barcan Formula", gives a sense of Burgess's overall orientation. The typo in the statement of the formula on p. 151 might suggest that the curse has not been lifted.)

[2] As Burgess indicates, the point is due to Soames (2002).

[3] According to Matushansky, "naming verbs are essential to our understanding of the syntax and semantics of proper names" (574). (Matushansky makes use of a wealth of cross-linguistic data in arguing for this claim.) She thus proposes a uniform treatment of names  --  one that makes sense of their occurrence in both argument position as well as in the complement to a "naming" construction such as (i). In (i) 'Mick' occurs as an argument to the "named" ("appointed") relation and 'Michael' as complement:

i. Mick was named/christened Michael.

As a complement, 'Michael' is analyzed as 'the bearer of Michael relative to a naming/christening convention R,' with R bound by an external quantifier:

ii. ∃(R is a christening convention & Mick was named 'Michael' in virtue of R)

Part of what motivates the analysis of names as they occur in argument position is that it coheres with the occurrence of names in the naming construction, as well as with explicitly predicative uses of names, such as 'Most Alfreds live in Berkeley.'

[4] It might also be asked, why the content 'Barack jogs' has when 'Barack' occurs as a name isn't the content of the sentence, rather than the HPN-approved content, on which it states that the bearer of 'Barack' relative to R jogs?

[5] Another worry concerns the treatment of Kripke's Puzzle (discussed in Chapter 4), which I'll just mention. Recall that Kripke has us suppose that Peter, unaware that his beliefs concern a single person, believes that Paderewski the pianist is musically gifted but that Paderewski the statesman is not. Thus (i) and (ii) are both true:

i. Peter believes that Paderewski is musically gifted.

ii. Peter disbelieves that Paderewski is musically gifted.

But note that it is not essential to the description of the puzzle that there exist two naming conventions regarding Paderewski  --  the puzzle can arise merely because Peter thinks there are. If so, then we seem to get the result that Peter believes and disbelieves  --  believes the negation of  --  one and the same proposition: that the bearer of 'Paderewski' relative to naming convention R is musically talented.

[6] In fairness to Burgess, Kripke does, in the above-quoted appendix, claim that analysis "tells us" that truths of essence and identity must be true of necessity and adds that these cases "may give a clue to a general characterization of a posteriori knowledge of necessary truths" (159). So there seems to be some tension in Kripke's work on this point.

[7] Thanks to Ray Buchanan, Jeff Buechner, Rosemary Twomey and Monique Whitaker for helpful comments on an earlier draft.