2014.02.08

Christy Mag Uidhir

Art and Art-Attempts

Christy Mag Uidhir, Art and Art-Attempts, Oxford University Press, 2013, 222pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199665778.

Reviewed by Sherri Irvin, University of Oklahoma


In this book, Christy Mag Uidhir derives a number of interesting implications for theories of art from one simple and widely agreed-upon claim: that artworks are the product of human intentions. Mag Uidhir does not himself advance a theory of art; instead, he aims to offer a test that any theory of art must pass if it is to be minimally viable.

A central thread of Mag Uidhir's argument is that for art to be the product of human intentions, in a meaningful sense, is for it to be the product of certain kinds of attempts that could, in principle, fail. An entity does not become art by fiat, or by being thought into arthood: the artist must successfully make the right sort of attempt, namely an art-attempt, in order for her product to be an artwork. When an art-attempt is unsuccessful, its product is failed-art (which is a variety of non-art). A viable theory of art ought to tell us what sorts of attempts count as art-attempts, and what counts as success or failure for such an attempt.

Each chapter discusses the ramifications of the art-attempt view for a specific domain of art theory. In chapter 2, on authorship, Mag Uidhir argues that involvement in the production of an artwork is not sufficient for authorship: the latter requires being the, or at least a, "source of the intentions directing the activities constitutive of the successful art-attempt of which that particular artwork is the product" (45). Since some participants in production defer to the intentions of others rather than being the source of the relevant intentions, they will not merit authorship credit on Mag Uidhir's view. Moreover, authorship is relative to a work-description: if I am an appropriation artist and successfully create a work composed of someone else's painting, I may be the author of a conceptual artwork, but I will not be the author of a work of painting, for I am not responsible for a successful painting-attempt.

Chapter 3 discusses what it is for a certain avenue of human activity, such as painting, poetry or photography, to count as an art form. Mag Uidhir argues that photography can be an art form only if the way in which something satisfies the criteria for being a photograph is, or can be, sufficient for its satisfying the conditions for being an artwork. Painting is an art form, since many works of painting satisfy the conditions for being artworks by virtue of the way in which they satisfy the conditions for being paintings: that is, successful painting-attempts often just are successful art-attempts. He denies that photography is an art form, however. I'll return to this later.

Chapter 4 derives implications for the ontology of art. The central argument of the chapter is the most straightforward in the book: it boils down to deriving the conclusion that artworks cannot be abstract objects from the premises that (1) artworks must be the product of successful art-attempts, (2) abstract objects cannot participate in causal relations, and (3) anything that cannot participate in causal relations cannot be the product of an art-attempt (since being the product of an art-attempt is a causal-intentional notion). Since he takes abstract and concrete entities, standardly construed, to be the only ontologically respectable options, Mag Uidhir concludes that artworks must be concrete entities.

The conclusion of chapter 4 creates a pickle for theorists of repeatable artworks (e.g., poems or musical works) who see them as abstract structures that can be tokened in particular printings or performances. Chapter 5, which aims to resolve this pickle, is, for my money, the most philosophically interesting part of the book. Mag Uidhir develops an account of repeatable artworks that defines them in terms of a relation of relevant similarity. Two poems (that is, two concrete poem-printings) are relevantly similar artworks if and only if they are the product of a single successful art-attempt, or of two art-attempts that are substantively the same: that is, "if and only if the way in which one satisfies the conditions for being a poem just is the way in which the other satisfies the conditions for being a poem" (185-6) or "if and only if there is no intention-directed activity constitutive of the successful art-attempt of which one is the product that is not also constitutive of the successful art-attempt of which the other is the product." (197) If I copy down the words of Gwendolyn Brooks's The Bean Eaters, I am causally responsibly for the existence of the resulting poem (i.e., the concrete poem-printing), but I am not thereby the author of any poem, for my copying activity does not constitute a successful art-attempt or a successful poetry-attempt. The responsibility for the way in which my copy of The Bean Eaters is a poem, and for the way in which it is an artwork, lies with Brooks, not with me: it is Brooks whose successful art-attempt explains the arthood of the relevantly similar poems we collect under the title The Bean Eaters. Mag Uidhir's view does not imply that two artworks involving the same string of words must be relevantly similar: in Borges's famous example, Cervantes and Menard made distinct-art attempts involving distinct forms of intention-directed activity, and the resulting works, though involving tokens of the same string of words, are not relevantly similar. Likewise, a printing of Sherrie Levine's appropriation of a Walker Evans photograph and a printing of the Evans original are the products of very different art-attempts, and are thus not relevantly similar despite their similar appearances.

I'm going to examine the book's central argument with some care, since it is from this argument that so many of the book's conclusions are derived. It begins thus:

1. Theorists of art widely agree that intention-dependence is a necessary condition for art, and mention this fact prominently in their theories.

2. They thus agree that intentions are a substantive necessary condition for arthood. (22)

3. For something to be a substantive necessary condition for art is for it to be "a member of the minimal set of necessary conditions taken jointly to be sufficient for being art," and not merely "coincident with or entailed by that minimal set itself or some substantive member thereof." (42)

4. A condition that is widely agreed upon by theorists of art is one we should accept as a constraint on adequate theories of art.

5. Therefore, any adequate theory of art will hold that art is substantively intention-dependent, i.e., that "being the product of human intentions" is among the minimal set of necessary conditions taken jointly to be sufficient for being art.

In my view, the move from (1) to (2), if "substantive necessary condition" is understood in accordance with the definition given in (3), is too quick. To consider intentions important, even crucial, to some domains of art theory, one need not hold a view in which they belong to the minimal set of necessary conditions for arthood. Theorists of art often consider the implications of their theories for art interpretation, and many currently prominent views hold that interpretation involves, at least in part, discerning or hypothesizing about the author's intentions. Thus, a reasonable theorist might well mention intentions as important even if the intention-dependence of art is entailed by some other substantively necessary condition she embraces.

The move from substantive intention-dependence to the art-attempt theory also merits scrutiny. The argument proceeds as follows:

6. Art is substantively intention-dependent.

7. Intentions cannot "transform things outside the head into artworks." (23)

8. Thus, "For a thing to be art, that thing must be in a substantive sense the product of intentional action." (23)

9. A thing can be in a substantive sense the product of intentional action only if intentions direct "the actions or activities of which that thing is the product." (23)

10. For intentions to direct "the actions or activities of which that thing is the product" is for "the way in which that thing comes to satisfy the conditions for being art . . . [to] be the product of intentional action." (23)

11. Therefore, for art to be substantively intention-dependent is for the way in which a thing satisfies the conditions for being art to be the product of intentional action.

12. The relevant intentional actions constitute attempts that can succeed or fail.

13. Therefore, for art to be substantively intention-dependent is for it to be the product of intentional actions that constitute attempts that can succeed or fail.

Mag Uidhir goes on to argue that art-attempts are a subclass of attempts, and that artworks are the product of successful art-attempts. Failed art-attempts result in failed-artworks, which are not artworks but may nonetheless inform us about the boundaries of art. He assumes throughout the book that "art theories incompatible with [his] account of failed-art are ipso facto false." (44)

I worry that this argument offers a false dilemma between the idea that intentions "have magical transformative powers" (23) and the idea that art can only be the product of intentional activity that constitutes a successful art-attempt that could, in principle, have failed. Consider a view like Jerrold Levinson's, according to which to be an artwork is to be intended for a mode of regard that has been appropriately applied to artworks in the past. Mag Uidhir complains that art is not substantively intention-dependent on this view: since Levinson doesn't require that the work succeed in securing the regard for which it is intended, there is no way for the art-attempt in question to fail. Because it is incompatible with Mag Uidhir's theory of failed-art, Levinson's view is "ipso facto false." But it is precisely the point of Levinson's view -- which is one of those Mag Uidhir cited in the first place to make the case that theorists widely agree that art is substantively intention-dependent! -- to hold that the artist has authority over art-status, such that imbuing art-status, unlike pole-vaulting, isn't a domain in which intentions can fail. One wishes, then, for further justification for (12). This doesn't mean that there are no art-regarding intentions that can fail. Levinson elsewhere allows that intentions about the work's meaning can fail, and would surely also embrace the notion that intentions about its quality can fail.

Must one believe in magic to hold that there are some kinds of intentions that cannot fail? I don't see why. My son, Zed, likes to make drawings for friends and family. If I ask him, "Who is that Darth Vader drawing for?" and he says, "It's for Sarah," there is nothing further that he must do to make it the case that it's for Sarah. Even answering my question was not necessary. His intentions are decisive regarding whom the drawing is for. We don't have to suppose that intentions have magical powers in order to grant this.

Suppose that the maker's intention is necessary and sufficient to determine whom the drawing is for. In this case, the "being for" relation clearly is substantively intention-dependent in Mag Uidhir's original sense: intentions figure in (indeed, exhaust) the minimal set of conditions that are necessary and jointly sufficient for "being for S." So we may doubt that art's being substantively intention-dependent in that sense, combined with the view that intentions aren't magic, gets us Mag Uidhir's further conclusions about the role intentions must play in governing art-attempts that are subject to the possibility of failure.

Of course, this leaves us with the question of whether imbuing art-status is more like pole-vaulting or more like determining whom your drawing is for. I won't try to settle that here, but I hope I've shown that the move from substantive intention-dependence to the failed-art view is not seamless.

I'd like to look at two other interesting discussions in the book. One is the argument that photography is not an art form, though some photographs are artworks. This is because being a photograph, unlike being a painting, doesn't require being the product of human intention: to be a photograph is just to be the product of the right sort of chemical process, one that could, in principle, happen naturally or accidentally. According to Mag Uidhir, this means that a chance photograph and a similar-looking photograph that is the product of intentional activity may satisfy the conditions for being a photograph in just the same way; and thus the way in which something satisfies the conditions for being a photograph cannot be the way in which it satisfies the conditions for being art. An object might well satisfy both the conditions for being a photograph and the conditions for being an artwork, but it won't satisfy them in the same way, and for that reason photography isn't an art form.

Advocates of photography as an art form might put pressure on this argument in one of two ways. First, they might deny that the purely chance product of a chemical process is a true photograph, just as Mag Uidhir would deny that the purely chance product of an encounter between a can of paint and a tornado is a true painting. Second, they might challenge the claim that a chance photograph and a similar-looking photograph by Cindy Sherman both satisfy the criteria for being photographs in the same way (simply by virtue of being the products of a certain kind of chemical process). In developing his notion of relevant similarity, Mag Uidhir appears to suggest that two prints satisfy the criteria for being prints in the same way only if "there is no intention-directed activity constitutive of the successful [print]-attempt of which the one is the product that is not also constitutive of the successful [print]-attempt of which the other is the product." (183) Thus, simply satisfying the same criteria for being a print isn't sufficient for satisfying those criteria in the same way: if two works satisfy the same print-related criteria by virtue of very different forms of intention-directed activity, they have not done so in the same way. The advocate of photography as an art form might attempt to extend this sort of analysis to explain why Sherman's work can satisfy the criteria for being art by virtue of the way in which it satisfies the criteria for being photography (i.e., by virtue of being the product of a sophisticated, intention-driven photography-attempt), even if a similar-looking chance photograph has no prospects of being art (because not the product of any sort of attempt at all).

As a final point, chapter 4 would have merited a more serious exploration of the possibility that standardly construed concrete and abstract entities don't exhaust the panoply that we might legitimately invoke in our ontological thinking. While Mag Uidhir dismisses the invocation of other art-ontological kinds as ad hoc, there is reason to think that a variety of human practices involve things whose existence is caused and bounded in time, whose features are determined by human activities, and which are not plausibly concrete entities. I am thinking here of things like games and laws: the game of chess was created in time, has the features it has by virtue of human activities, and normatively governs certain kinds of concrete events, but it is not itself plausibly a concrete event or class thereof. Must we be fictionalists or eliminativists about the game of chess, since it is neither concrete nor abstract? I don't see why that is a more attractive option than exploring the possibility that distinctly human practices require an ontology better suited to the social realm, as philosophers Sally Haslanger, John Searle, Barry Smith and Amie Thomasson (among others) have been doing for some time now. Musical works, which receive little attention in Art and Art-Attempts, may require a similar sort of analysis. Mag Uidhir suggests, remarkably, that if it's not possible to analyze composed works of music as concreta, we should simply give up the idea that they are artworks. To my mind, he thereby avoids biting a bullet by ingesting a missile.

Disagreements aside, Art and Art-Attempts is a stimulating contribution to philosophical discussions of the theory of art. It is not the easiest read, but philosophers working on relevant topics will want to grapple with its arguments. The discussion of relevant similarity, in particular, should be of interest to those working on the ontology of art, whether or not they have nominalist sympathies.