2014.03.11

Bruno Latour

An Inquiry into Modes of Existence: An Anthropology of the Moderns

Bruno Latour, An Inquiry into Modes of Existence: An Anthropology of the Moderns, Catherine Porter (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2013, 486pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674724990.

Reviewed by Val Dusek, The University of New Hampshire


Bruno Latour's book is the positive supplement to his negative account in We Have Never Been Modern.[1] It makes the former work, which ranged far beyond science studies,seem relatively modest in comparison. Latour treats a number of modes of experience. These include science, fiction, psychic beings of metamorphosis technology, religion, politics, economics, and organizations. He gives entities in all these areas ontological status. The narrative is presented as the investigation of The Moderns by a female anthropologist. The book is accompanied by a website that contains and encourages discussions, supplements, and criticism.

Latour uses his actor network theory, treating existents in terms of networks of relations. He rejects the existence of a unitary Science, Society, Matter, or Technology and prefers to speak of sciences, materials, and individual associations, concentrating on individual events, their assemblages and their networks. He claims the notion of matter is a mistake of mixing modes. In Latour's extremely pluralistic metaphysics ("pluriverse") the demons and spirits of non-modern peoples as well as the phantom public of politics and the beings of fiction all have ontological status, which Society, Language, Nature, and Matter do not.

In previous writings Latour has praised Whitehead's process philosophy and panpsychism. Latour's Beings of Reproduction [REP] in this book are event chains. His account of the development of continuity, for instance, uses Whitehead's claim that there is a becoming of continuity but there is no continuity of becoming, and he more frequently refers to William James' radical empiricism and describes his own approach as radical empiricist. The "bifurcation of nature" and the mind/world and mind/matter splits are rejected, as is the distinction between primary and secondary qualities.

Each of the modes is claimed to have appropriate prepositions. This is meant to emphasize the relational as opposed to substantive nature of existence. However, particular prepositions that are relevant to the different fields are never identified. Latour bases himself on Étienne Souriau's work,[2] from which he also takes the term "modes of existence." Souriau himself, followed by Latour, refers to James' discussion of prepositions in his radical empiricism, emphasizing that experience itself contains relations, rather than sensations being unified by the mind.

Influenced by the sociologist Harold Garfinkel's ethnomethodology, Latour rejects, often contemptuously, hidden social forces and ideology. Nothing is hidden. There is no false consciousness. There is nothing beyond the actors' awareness of their situation. The social analyst has no deeper or truer insight into the situation than the participants.

Latour opposes the critical approach because it presupposes a hidden true realm on the basis of which common opinion and belief can be criticized. He rejects Marxism and other sociological theories that claim that there are hidden social forces accounting for what is thought. Similarly, the whole intellectual movement of criticism or critique is dismissed as one of the negative developments of modernity. One criticism of science studies as a field has been of its refusal to make evaluations of the social situation of the activities it describes. Latour's approach makes a virtue of this indifference to evaluating common belief and to attempting to look behind it for motives or social tendencies. However, in seeming contradiction to this, Latour frequently claims that the moderns are in a terrible state.

Throughout the work Latour calls his foil "Double-Click" (after the computer mouse), who demands immediate, direct reference. Latour sometimes calls him the Cartesian evil demon, who claims "free, indisputable, and immediate access to pure, untransformed information." (93)

Latour makes extensive use of Ryle's notion of category mistakes. These arise in the crossings of different modes of existence. In contrast to such inappropriate mixing or misidentification of genres, Latour talks about fostering "diplomacy" between different forms of existence. In some ways Latour's modes of existence resemble Wittgenstein's language games, insofar as they have distinct languages. Similarly one can mistakenly mix different languages leading to category mistakes. However, the language games are not and should not be hermetically sealed from one another as some Wittgensteinians have held.

Latour rejects all reductionisms, but he also rejects larger organizations, society and individuals, even sometimes jocularly citing Margaret Thatcher's claim that society does not exist.[3] One cannot call Latour a methodological individualist, since his units are not human individuals. But he is a sort of event reductionist. Events or acts exist, while alleged larger scale entities do not. One could deny this is reductionism, as Latour does, but one could call it replacement rather than reduction, or designate it a disappearance theory similar to the treatment of mind originally of Paul Feyerabend and later of Paul and Patricia Churchland. The purported large-scale entities do not exist. Talk about them should be replaced by talk about individual events and their networks.

Latour claims that his felicity conditions for the various modes of discourse are loosely analogous to Austin's speech act theory; however, he does not give a detailed analysis of felicity conditions of the sort given by Austin, his followers, or his critics. A major theme of the work is that the utterances of all but one of the modes should not be evaluated in terms of a correspondence theory of truth. Religion and politics, for instance, should not be judged in terms of the truth of their utterances. Latour uses the term 'veridiction' rather than truth for the adequacy appropriate to the different modes.

In correcting social constructivism Latour wishes to replace the term with Souriau's 'instauration'. He criticizes constructivism for portraying the construction of entities as a kind of projection from the self or society. Also, the action involved in the instauration differs from construction in that it is judged to be good or bad. Instauration emphasizes that the production of something also depends on the nature of the object and is contingent. The end result is unknown and involves taking risks.

In chapter 6, on correcting construction, there is a discussion of the attribution of fetishism to other cultures and the rejection of fetishism by the moderns. Latour claims that other cultures are quite aware that they themselves have made their idols but judge them ill made or well made. According to him iconoclasm, which he lumps with critique, or what he calls "iconoclash," is performed by Christianity against other, indigenous religions, and it is also performed by secularism against religion in general. The rejection of idols is said to have kept constructivism from succeeding. One surprising omission of Latour as sociologist is of a discussion of Comte's portrayal of fetishism as the earliest stage of intellectual development, but his use of the "great fetish," the earth, in the "religion of humanity," is perhaps relevant to Latour's writings on Gaia in relation to religion. Likewise, there is no discussion of Marx's critique of the "fetishism of commodities" that would seem to fit nicely into Latour's rejection of both Marx and of iconoclasm.

Like many French philosophers Latour counterposes his views to those of Descartes, but, like many French thinkers, he is heavily influenced by Descartes in the alternatives he poses. He rejects the notion of matter, which he several times identifies with Cartesian res extensa. Yet in discussing Beings of Reproduction (things as event sequences), Latourrefers to lines of force as an alternative. This apparently novel treatment neglects that since the eighteenth century Kant, Roger Joseph Boscovich, and others have already presented a force theory of matter different from Descartes' res extensa.

The chapter on beings of metamorphosis [MET] mainly concerns itself with psychic being and metamorphosis. Latour basis himself on the ethnopsychiatry of Tobie Nathan and ignores other accounts of inner forces or components of the psyche, such as those of Jungians and of Gilles Deleuze. Demons, witches and other entities utilized by other cultures to deal with emotional crises are given ontological status along with the psychic beings of western psychiatry, although relegation of the latter to the mind by western psychology is rejected. There are hints that beings of metamorphosis encompass far more than psychic or emotional forces and are on a par in the range of what they include with habits and beings of reproduction (285-288), but this is not developed. The chapter on beings of metamorphosis focuses solely on emotions and psychic transforming forces, whether personified, as they are in many cultures, or treated as subjective by moderns.

In an article/interview about how he "came out" as a philosopher[4] Latour mentions that his earliest work was criticism of Rudolf Bultmann's "demythologization" of Christianity. The treatment of religion is perhaps the weakest part of the work. Latour limits religion to personal speech. The analogy Latour uses for religious speech is that of the expression of love between two lovers, which does not involve communication of information. It involves personal transformation. The message of religion is "good news." In transforming our feelings this good news does not take the form of facts or information content. Latour also rejects the notion of belief as relevant to religion, since religion is not really propositional. However, he nowhere articulates the reasons for this rejection. He also claims the notion of God is not relevant to contemporary religion, and suggests it be replaced by "the assumptions of common life." He thinks the social aspects of religion--ritual and institutions--are not the its core, and describes them as moribund. On the other hand, in his book on religion, Rejoicing, Latour suggests that we must accept all of the trappings of religion, including the Immaculate Conception and the authority of the pope, or none.[5] His discussion of religion in Inquiry focuses on Christianity, and in Rejoicing on Catholicism. Although he discusses fetishism in African indigenous religions and criticizes the modern misrepresentations of fetishism, he does not discuss either the Abrahamic religions other than Christianity or the major religions of South and East Asia.

As one might expect, Latour criticizes the various attempts to relate or oppose religion and science. These erroneous attempts include rejection of religion as a set of false factual statements competing with those of science, the attempt to elaborate science to give it religious connotations, and the strict separation of science and religion as dealing with different realms, with science dealing with the nearby material world and religion dealing with the realm beyond the universe. For Latour religion is not about a distant realm but about personal experience and interpersonal communication. It is science, not religion, that deals with realms distant from immediate experience.

The strongest chapter is the one concerning technology. This is an area Latour worked on extensively much earlier. Actor network theory started with technology. Latourcriticizes the identification of technological objects with beings of reproduction (natural objects). He makes use of the need for technological artifacts to be continually maintained and improved. "Sociotechnical systems" designates the heterogeneity of technology, but there is no realm of technology as such. Technology becomes invisible as soon as it is functioning successfully. He plays on Heraclitus with "Technology likes to hide." The language of form fitted to function is, according to Latour, as misleading as the correspondence between thought and things in reference. During a breakdown the extreme heterogeneity is most manifest. Latour identifies technology not with the artifacts but with the activity of technologizing. Technology is properly referred to not with a noun, but with an adjective or an adverb, and less commonly a verb. Technology is not an object, but the gaps of alterity in the network of tinkering.

Latour uses the mode of existence of habit to deal with crossings of modes. Habit is not explicit or general. (Latour criticizes Socrates' search for general definitions and essences.) In praise of habit he appeals to William James' "blessed habit." The tendency of technology to recede from our awareness once working is a case of the function of habit. With the notion of habit Latour claims we can give a more charitable version of Double Click. It also allows us to have a notion of institutions. Habit is the forgetting involved in proceeding with ordinary functioning without awareness of the background involved in any mode. Only when problems arise do we become focused on the background and apparatus that made the smooth functioning possible. Here Latour's account resembles the pragmatists' "problematic situation" and Heidegger on the hammer, despite his several remarks that in passing disparage Heidegger's concern with Being and account of technology.

Latour characterizes economics as involving "passionate interests," presumably referring implicitly to Albert O. Hirschman's The Passions and the Interests, though he makes no reference to Hirschman's account of how early moderns supported the interests as less disruptive of society than the passions. Latour's treatment of economics is far more negative than his treatment of any other field.[6] Part of this is similar to the rejection of formalist economics by economic substantivists, such as Karl Polanyi, in anthropology. Other parts of the rejection have partial resemblance to the criticism of formal mictroeconomics by the institutionalist economists (though, of course, Latour would reject the reification of institutions).

Latour astutely notes that law has suffered from less modernization than other fields. It retains its emphasis on chains of precedents and techniques of presentation. Law explicitly retains its own criteria of evidence and truth distinct from those of science. One complication of this happy situation that Latour does not discuss is that scientific methods of forensics, DNA analysis, and so forth have become important in the law, though it is true the scientific results are often treated differently in the law than they are in science itself. An example of these issues is the Daubert v. Merrell Dow Pharmaceuticals Supreme Court case,[7] according to which judges are supposed to evaluate the quality of scientific evidence, turning judges into amateur scientists.

Earlier in the work when discussing reference, Latour notes that, because politicians have to appeal to constituencies with conflicting beliefs, the politicians must bend their presentations. Politicians must continually recreate groupings of people by means of new turns of speech and new actions. Citizens come to see politicians as liars by attempting to impose inappropriate standards of reference to them. Politicians have to cobble together constituencies with conflicting views and complaints by means of speech. Politics cannot utilize scientific or political rationality. On the other hand, politics should not be rejected as totally irrational. Politics has its own felicity conditions involving language and action that unifies internally conflicting and disparate masses of people. It is a mistake of most political philosophers to advocate "straight talk" on the part of politicians. Politicians must speak in curves, use crooked talk. Unfortunately Latour is not specific and does not give examples of this proper political talk. One can guess that the half-truths that politicians utter in order to unify constituencies is what Latour means, but he does not specify.

In the conclusion of the chapter on "The Phantoms of Politics" Latour's understanding of politics is highly elitist, based on Walter Lippmann's "phantom public." There is not real public. What is called the public is mainly a bystander. Most political activity is undertaken by a small elite. Only in cases of widely recognized dysfunction and crisis do a large number of citizens actively engage in politics. Because of the diversity of disparate interests of citizens, there is ordinarily no public.

Ironically, Latour's attitude toward "the moderns" is surprisingly like that of westerners encountering so-called "savages" and their "superstitions." One problem with Latour'santhropological account of the moderns is that he continually emphasizes how they cannot live up to or even live with their ideals and theories. However, it is never explained why the moderns have these illusions. At one point he says this is the job of historians. However, he needs to say more about the status of these illusions. A problem for philosophies that make massive claims that our ordinary views are illusory is the explanation of why the illusion exists and persists. Latour as an anthropologist claims that moderns are no more different from non-moderns than any other group or culture is from another. However, it seems that neither Trobriand Islanders nor any other non-modern group have such illusory values and ideals impossible to live by as do the moderns. It would seem moderns really are different from peoples of other cultures for Latour, but not in the way in which moderns represent their own special nature in terms of the triumph of science and reason. Why the moderns are in this supposedly deplorable situation is never really explained.

Inquiry is a hugely ambitious work ranging over all of human activity. It is in various places evasive and ambiguous, though undoubtedly it will have many further developments. One's overall opinion of it will depend on the reader's acceptance of radical empiricism and rejection of scientific realism.

There is no index in the printed copy of the work, which makes tracing the cross-references between topics in various chapters difficult.


[1] Harvard University Press, Cambridge: 1993.

[2] Étienne Souriau, Les différents modes d'existence, (Paris, Presses Universitaires de France,1943; republished in 2009 with introduction by Isabelle Stengers and BrunoLatour).

[3] Bruno Latour, Reassembling the Social: An Introduction to Actor-Network-Theory, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005), 5.

[4] Bruno Latour, "Coming Out as a Philosopher," (Social Studies of Science 2010 40(4)): 599-608

[5] Bruno Latour, Rejoicing: the Torments of Religious Speech, (London: Polity), 63.

[6] Albert O. Hirschman's The Passions and the Interests: Political Arguments for Capitalism Before Its Triumph, (Princeton: Princeton University Press, Reprint edition, 2013).

[7] 509 U.S. 579 (1993).