2014.03.13

Felix Ó Murchadha

A Phenomenology of Christian Life: Glory and Night

Felix Ó Murchadha, A Phenomenology of Christian Life: Glory and Night, Indiana University Press, 2013, 252pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253010001.

Reviewed by Ian Leask, Dublin City University


This book should be read by anyone interested in the so-called 'theological turn' in recent phenomenology. However, it constitutes far more than a work of commentary or exegesis; instead, the book stands as a substantial and important contribution in itself. In so many respects, it is a singular achievement that should be regarded as a primary rather than secondary source.

At once sympathetic and provocative, Ó Murchadha aims to describe (and redescribe) the particularities of Christian life that other recent phenomenological accounts have neglected -- specifically, what it means for Christianity to be both divine and worldly, to be "an acosmic instance in the midst of the world" (33). Necessarily, such description entails certain genealogical, as well as phenomenological, commitments. It also puts phenomenology to work for a theological purpose, the lineaments and contours of which are beyond the remit of a philosophical assessment -- even accepting that one of Ó Murchadha's central purposes is to challenge such demarcations and enframings. Critical observations in this review are, accordingly, restricted to certain philosophical issues and implications.

Unsurprisingly, the Introduction serves a central purpose in orientating our reading. Here, Ó Murchadha's 'situatedness' within contemporary phenomenology is made plain; but so, too, is the need (quite literally) to transcend what he takes to be the "logic of purity" operative in so much recent theologico-phenomenological discourse. (The book enacts a certain transcendence, as well as describing one.) Thus -- and despite the inspiration he finds in those thinkers who have sought sheer phenomenality unbound by any metaphysical regime -- Ó Murchadha will suggest that the overall stress upon some (putative) unsullied telos of "Gnostic escape in angelic peacefulness" (34) renders problematic so much of the 'theological turn'. Roughly put: the ultimate unworldliness of Levinasian alterity seems to drain it of fundamental significance; Michel Henry's neo-Gnostic depiction of Life as a direct relation with God voids the significance of creation (and Incarnation); and Jean-Luc Marion's insistence upon the polar opposition of icon and idol is pursued to the point where the former becomes hopelessly dematerialized. Throughout, it seems, the great phenomenological Fathers can only "glorify" whatever "opposes the glory of the world" (31); and so, despite the monumental significance of their labours, they serve further to separate divine and human, visible and invisible, spirit and matter, and so on. Ó Murchadha's task, accordingly, is to put phenomenology to work for a quite different cause -- the delineation of Christian phenomena as thoroughly "contaminated", as not of the world yet still within it. And hence his two guiding principles: glory, taken as the sheer weight or viscosity of the world, in all its splendor; and night, taken as a kind of positive displacement, in which the soul is forced to confront its radical passivity and powerlessness.

Throughout, the principal antagonist in Ó Murchadha's "experiment" (xii) -- structured around these principles of 'glory' and 'night' -- is 'Greek' (and specifically Platonic) philosophy. Thus, in what seems a central move, the Ascent from the Cave -- which is taken to be paradigmatic for all Western speculative effort -- becomes subject to a radical overturning. Plato's "hierarchy of light" (74) is opposed by a Christian emphasis on the 'dark night' in which, "through being acted upon, and acted upon in secret, that is, away from the light of the world . . . the soul finds itself" (87); the result is the revelation of the sheer glory of doxa, of that which appears in the world yet "escapes the boundaries" (109) of episteme. Likewise, incarnation opposes the 'Platonic' denegation of matter (in favour of spirit): it is only creation, understood as an act of gratuitous love, that can properly account for worldly being (and its true significance). Similarly, death is not the other of life, for which the philosopher must spend her time preparing: rather, Christianity subsumes and contains death, makes it "already past" (139) -- manifest in the bones and relics entombed within churches and cathedrals (rather than in some putative 'decontaminated' space beyond the polis). And, finally, time is not merely the image of a quasi-mathematical eternity: instead, Christianity posits the eternal as the extra-worldly that still enters and intervenes, kairologically, in the temporal; the result is "a process of mutual contamination" (193) that demands a reorientation of the believer's life. Overall, then, Christian living is shown to be "radically incommensurate with the Greek ideal" (3).

Needless to say, the above sketch of Ó Murchadha's self-styled "experiment" hardly begins to do justice to the verve and depth of his account. In the course of eight fecund chapters, he gives us brilliant meditations on issues as diverse as desire, the nature of faith, nothingness, prayer, ascetism, play, and the body -- as well as a reformulation of Heideggerian 'being-in', a radical expansion of what Merleau-Ponty's 'flesh' might mean, and the presentation of a kind of Christian aesthetics. Throughout these explorations, Ó Murchadha proves himself a phenomenological talent of the first rank: this is a work that wants to do (rather than provide yet another commentary on) phenomenology.

Nonetheless, and perhaps inevitably, given its ambition, there are important philosophical questions we can ask about some of the shaping assumptions and principles that undergird Ó Murchadha's book. The bulk of these reduce (as it were) to the portrayal of "the totalizing ontologies of the philosophical heritage" (33), and, more specifically, to whether Ó Murchadha's account betrays a certain Procrustean zeal; at times, Christianity's putative 'opponent' seems to have been built from straw.

First, the Platonism depicted seems almost puritanical: as Ó Murchadha would have it, "[Plato's] logic is one of separation and protection from contamination. It is a logic which abhors mixture" (6) -- a depiction that seems structurally necessary for a work that will promote Christianity's (contrasting) ability to tolerate the sheer messiness of life. But such a version of 'Platonism' is only possible, it seems, if we ignore later Platonic dialectic, especially as articulated in the Sophist, Philebus and Parmenides: in these works, it is precisely the issue of sumploke, admixture or synthesis, that dominates Plato's thinking. Whether it be Identity and Difference, Parmenidean stasis and Heraclitean flux, Limit and Unlimit, the One and the Many, or Being and Non-Being, the older Plato's consistent, persistent aim is to show how both reality and its description necessarily entails mixture, co-mingling, even a certain sprawl.

This issue, in itself, would seem to have a foundational significance for Ó Murchadha, given that Western philosophy, overall, is depicted as being a series of continuing 'Platonic' reverberations (whether negative or positive). But, arguably, even more pressing issues arise in terms of Ó Murchadha's specific depictions of modern thought (and beyond).

Throughout, modernity is understood in quasi-Heideggerian terms as a "history of loss" and a "history of forgetting" of the basic, inner, motivation of knowledge: the desire to know is simply assumed, or presupposed, rather than properly articulated. All of which can be taken as further evidence of the consolidation of the modern subject's (assumed) self-standing: "The movement of the subject toward the object is accepted as a given, and is then interpreted imperiously" (41). Roughly speaking: as the subject empowers itself, so the 'allure of the world' becomes increasingly the function, or index, of subjectivity itself; what might draw us toward the things of the world is concealed by our hubristic self-certainty.

However central to the overall architectonics of Ó Murchadha's narrative, such a depiction seems open to question. For example: conceptual events such as Hobbes' passions, Spinoza's conatus, even Leibniz's petites perceptions, may all raise almost limitless critical issues; but they hardly suggest the kind of blindness regarding motivation that Ó Murchadha imputes to modernity. So many others could equally well be cited: Machiavelli, Hume, Schiller, Nietzsche, even (perhaps especially) Hegel are all thinkers for whom the impulse of and behind reasoning is a central, philosophical issue. Whether modernity's speculative efforts tend in general to bolster the subject no doubt remains a live issue; but this is quite distinct from that of 'simply' avoiding the question of the motivation to knowledge.

Perhaps the most significant instance of this occasionally unnuanced (and perhaps even 'totalizing') attitude towards modern philosophy comes -- unsurprisingly -- in the context of Ó Murchadha's discussion of Kant. The main thrust of the Critical philosophy is summed up thus: "knowledge . . . is not founded in the nature of things, but rather in the understanding" (45) -- no doubt a perfectly accurate account, in part. But of course the first Critique also opposes "the absurd conclusion that there can be appearance without anything that appears" (CPR, Bxxvii), eventually positing the transcendental object as the theoretically necessary outcome of sensibility qua receptive. This aspect of Kant's thought never features in Ó Murchadha's account; neither does the role of Gemüt, or Geist, or even spontaneity -- all of them points that would seem to problematize the claim that, faced with the question 'why does knowledge begin in experience?', "Kant can answer, if at all, only psychologically" (45).

The discussion of Kantian aesthetics raises similar questions. For sure, beauty seems subject to a kind of ontological evacuation, leaving disinterested taste "in a state of pure epoché" (43), as Ó Murchadha's nice phrase has it; but his discussion here gives no attention to the remarkable claim in the third Critique that aesthetic judgement refers to "something in the subject itself and outside it" (CJ, s.59) -- namely, the 'supersensible' that, for Kant, grounds all else. (Such suggestions were crucial, of course, in bringing into being full-blown German Idealism). Meanwhile, to read the Kantian sublime as confirming the superior, original, status of the spectator, and as reducing nature to a mere occasion for sublime judgement, is hardly mistaken or 'wrong'; but it seems incomplete, as an account, without addressing how, for Kant, the unrepresentable, uncontrollable sublime also signals an outrageous failure of imagination, and a contravention of judgement.

Of course, Ó Murchadha's book is not supposed to be a work of Kantian exegesis (or, for that matter, an in-depth survey of modern understanding of philosophical motivation). Nonetheless, his self-imposed detachment from Critical Philosophy seems to raise a particularly significant question for his project: how far can phenomenology -- i.e., one of philosophy's essentially post-Kantian forms -- distance itself from a Kantian basis without ceasing to be phenomenological?

This issue is pressing enough in terms of Ó Murchadha's genealogical project. But, arguably, it becomes more urgent, not so much regarding his relationship to the philosophical tradition, but regarding the phenomenological practice that makes up so much of his effort. Roughly put: it seems that, too often, the main data of this engrossing text -- namely, doctrinal, Scriptural and Patristic evidence -- are treated as 'straightforward' phenomena, when their status as such is not at all self-evident; as a result, too often the distinction between neutral presentation of 'the things themselves' and theological assertion becomes somewhat blurred. To claim, for example, that "the event of Christ in having occurred draws all of time together in a moment, turns human and natural history as on a pivot" (103) may well be perfectly legitimate, theologically; but how can phenomenological intuition be involved here? Likewise, "faith in Christ is a faith in an existent whose being is nothing other than his mission" (49); or "Christ is an event, the event which radiates in its own singularity, the singularity of a gift of love, which only love and faith can recognize" (82); or "god is nothing of the world, but is in everything in the world" (123); etc.

Ultimately, it seems that, within the contours of the 'theological turn' itself, A Phenomenology of Christian Life makes a hugely important, redressive, contribution: as Ó Murchadha demonstrates, Christian Life needs to be treated, not in terms of some imagined purity, but in all of its "contaminated" worldliness. It is less obvious, though, that this brilliant, generous and engaging text overcomes more foundational concerns: Janicaud's polemical complaint that 'theology and phenomenology make two' remains alive.