2014.04.10

John McCumber

Understanding Hegel's Mature Critique of Kant

John McCumber, Understanding Hegel's Mature Critique of Kant, Stanford University Press, 2014, 216pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804785457.

Reviewed by Sebastian Rand, Georgia State University


In his most recent book, John McCumber draws on his thirty years' work on Hegel to make a characteristically readable, insightful, and original contribution to an important topic in the history of philosophy. His prose is lively and clear, his arguments engage the secondary literature extensively but not tediously, and his examples are many and apposite. These features make the book an excellent resource for both students and non-specialists seeking clarity on the issues that made, and continue to make, the Hegel-Kant relationship a source of philosophical provocation. But there is a great deal here for specialists as well. As the title suggests, McCumber restricts his attention to the criticisms of Kant that can be found in the Logic, Encyclopedia, and Philosophy of Right, with occasional corroboration from Hegel's lectures and his earlier texts. This restriction, rare for a field that understandably tends to a developmental approach grounded in Hegel's earlier Jena period, gives the book special interest. Moreover, the specifics of McCumber's interpretation challenge dominant trends in the current literature, giving us a Hegel who is in some ways more Kantian, in others more of a naturalist, and in still others more sui generis than most any Hegel out there.

In sum, McCumber's book is required reading for students of the period and for specialists in the field, and is highly recommended for anyone with an interest in the history of philosophy and its relevance to current debates.

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The very first public questions about Hegel's philosophy were questions about his relationship to the idealists who preceded him, and as Hegel emerged from the shadows of Fichte and Schelling, his relationship to their common master became a theme both of his own self-presentation and of the contemporary reception of his philosophy. After his death, the Hegel-Kant tie was still strong enough that when it decided to purge itself of Hegelianism, German academic philosophy could think of no better strategy than to go back to Kant. In the years since, the tie has remained strong enough that each Kant revival typically finds itself followed shortly by its Hegelian double, itself promptly denounced by the Kantians in turn. It was therefore perhaps not surprising that the resurgence of Anglophone interest in Kant brought about by (among others) Strawson, Rawls, Sellars, and Korsgaard should have conjured once more the specter of Hegel; but perhaps it was surprising when the Hegel who floated up this time was Kantian almost to a fault. The "post-Kantian" Hegel found in Robert Pippin, Terry Pinkard, Sally Sedgwick, and others offered criticisms of Kant not from the perspective of a pre-Kantian metaphysics or of a quasi-divine Romantic intuition, but from Kant's own grounds. This Hegel predictably alarmed not only the Kantians but the more traditional Hegelians as well, and each group sought, either by undermining Hegel's criticisms of Kant, or by presenting a competing Hegel who rejected the core of the Kantian critical project, to re-establish a safe distance between the two. And so our potted history arrives at the current state of play in Anglophone Hegel studies, featuring, among other things, a small but growing set of books devoted to re-examining the Hegel-Kant relationship through a focus on Hegel's explicit and implicit attacks on various Kantian doctrines.[1]

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Aside from the actual conclusions he reaches (about which more below), McCumber's contribution to this re-examination project is noteworthy on a number of points. First, as already mentioned, he focuses exclusively on Hegel's "mature" writings, whereas much of the extant literature on this theme draws heavily on Hegel's earlier work. Second, he devotes roughly equal time to Hegel's discussions of Kant's theoretical and practical philosophy and presents an appealingly unified vision of the Hegelian critique in both areas. Much of the extant literature focuses on one or the other domain. Third, McCumber depicts a Hegel whose naturalism, such as it is, seems closer to contemporary varieties than to the more Aristotelian naturalism attributed to him by, e.g., Pinkard.[2] Fourth, he pursues his analysis using a somewhat nonstandard conception of "critique." Whereas this usually means internal critique -- a process akin to argument by reduction, exposing inconsistencies in the target position -- McCumber takes Hegelian critique to be a kind of transformative and limit-setting (thus "critical") appropriation, incorporating a modified version of the target position into a distinct systematic context. This conception of critique obligates McCumber to establish that distinct context ahead of time and independently. Thus the fifth noteworthy feature of his contribution is the general view of Hegel with which it operates, a view McCumber characterizes as a "definitionalist" interpretation. It attributes to Hegel a linguistic idealism drawn from his readings of Hamann and Herder. This idealism aims to generate a purified philosophical vocabulary on a presuppositionless, and therefore free, basis -- a vocabulary later coordinated with existing natural language to provide a means for genuinely autonomous thought, discourse, and action.

The definitionalist interpretation is highly contentious and complex, and McCumber gives only its most general outline and main points here, directing curious readers to the full presentation found in his The Company of Words.[3] Given the role this interpretation is assigned by McCumber's understanding of critique, it would be natural to suspect that readers averse to the unfamiliar definitionalist line might find the criticism of Kant it motivates uninformative, or at least distant from their own concerns. But in fact the book loses nothing for readers unconvinced by the definitionalist interpretation. McCumber does not employ Hegel's objections to Kant as case studies in support of his view, but rather uses that view to give us, as it were, a map of the Hegel-Kant landscape drawn according to a definitionalist projection schema -- a map that reveals new passages through some difficult terrain.

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After a helpful introduction in which he motivates his approach, McCumber goes on in Chapter One to outline his criteria for a satisfactory interpretation of Hegel's relation to Kant, to summarize and evaluate by these criteria the two major extant views of this relation, and to locate the definitionalist interpretation as a third option. He makes some well-observed remarks about the shortcomings of both the "Hegel as a revocation of Kant" and "Hegel as a continuation of Kant" interpretations, while trying to differentiate each sharply from his own view. Yet it is also clear that he takes his view to be much closer to the continuation reading, especially in his discussion of the relation of the definitionalist interpretation to Pippin's influential "normative" version of the continuation reading.

In Chapters Two and Three, McCumber discusses the central themes in Hegel's critique of Kant's theoretical philosophy: the distinction between things in themselves and appearances (along with Kant's restriction of our knowledge of the latter), the nature and possibility of intellectual intuition, and the basic sense of "idealism." According to McCumber, Hegel's real objection to things in themselves is that they result from an incomplete process of abstraction Kant should have taken a step further, beyond his assumption of an absolute (that is, impossible to abstract away) distinction between subject and object. McCumber's Hegel takes that further step and, adding in some reflections on time, arrives at his conception of the "in-itself" as the intra-experiential but mind-independent component of objects of our cognition. In parallel fashion, says McCumber, Hegel argues that Kant's conception of appearances, stripped of the subjectivism Kant stopped short of abstracting away, yields Hegel's own view of the finitude of all objects of the understanding, where this finitude amounts to their having their ground of existence in another being. Such transformations of Kantian views, developed by abstracting beyond their Kantian limitations, yield the properly Hegelian sense of idealism as "the dynamic interdependence" of parts and whole. On this view, "to be 'ideal' is . . . to be a concrete whole whose parts are aufgehoben within, or 'moments' of, it" (81).

Thus although McCumber's Hegel insists that we have a greater capacity for abstraction than Kant can endorse, this abstraction leads him to see the concrete contents of experience both as beyond our full cognitive mastery (even in their possible categorial structure) and as the starting points of the speculative system -- and hence leads him to drop Kant's apriorism entirely. Our theoretical cognition is idealistic on this view not insofar as it identifies and articulates a priori conditions of experience, but insofar as it consists in an activity of concept-formation. This activity, conceived by Hegel as an inwardization or "Erinnerung," is presented by McCumber in largely naïve-empiricist terms: our concepts, developed through repeated exposure to similar stimuli, "automatically capture what is permanent in [things] and so what is 'essential, inner, and true'" about them (86); our theoretical cognition "accepts sensory beings as they are" and then "reduce[s] them to components" of a larger whole (83). Finally, in rebuilding those concepts -- that is, our philosophical language -- into a system based in the purely abstract beginning of the Logic, we attain (an almost unrecognizable variety of) intellectual intuition, now linguisticized, stripped of its apriority, and turned into a kind of cumulative product of our cultural history.

In Chapters Four and Five, McCumber turns to Hegel's critique of Kant's practical philosophy, presenting it against the background of a highly original reading of Hegel's theory of the will. What makes McCumber's reading of the Philosophy of Right so striking is his emphasis on the role Hegel assigns to our natural drives, and on the idea that for Hegel, ethical theory must explain how these drives can be purified and ordered, or rationalized, so as to achieve genuine human autonomy. Such a rationalization of the drives is the practical equivalent of the theoretical process of purifying and systematizing the deliverances of the senses -- that is, the "Erinnerung" treated in Chapter Three. While the idea of ethical formation as rationalization of drives was not unknown in post-Kantian practical philosophy (despite McCumber's inexplicable omission of any mention of Fichte's System of Ethics), and is indeed the topic of several sections of the Introduction to the Philosophy of Right, it has not (to my knowledge) been made the centerpiece of any extended interpretation of that book. But McCumber makes a compelling case for understanding Hegel's ethical theory as the articulation and development of a system of principles for such rationalization -- principles both concrete, because concerned with particular drives, and general, because concerned to unify these drives, in their purified form, at the most universal level.

With this reading of the Philosophy of Right in hand, McCumber argues that the real Hegelian attack on Kant's moral theory is directed not against the strict formality of the categorical imperative per se, but rather against the more basic idea that the task of a moral theory consists solely in locating such a principle. In fact, says McCumber, Hegel endorses the categorical imperative wholeheartedly, precisely in its role as the most universal and empty principle, and thus as the principle for discerning which maxims are in fact in accordance with the level of universality and necessity Kant seeks. But here again McCumber's Hegel discerns a shortcoming in Kant's process of abstraction: because he stops short at an absolute distinction in kind between inclination and duty, Kant misses the chance to ask about motivation more generally, and thus to provide a robust action theory of the sort Hegel develops as part of his theory of the drives. That theory allows for a distinction only in degree, not in kind, between particular and universal motives, holding that respect for the moral law is simply the most rationalized and purified drive of all. Seen this way, other motives are not amoral or immoral, but simply less moral, and the categorical imperative is a standard used in the rationalization process, through which process itself the moral law comes into view as part of a larger set of drives, commitments, and institutions making up ethical life as a whole. The goal of Hegelian practical philosophy is thus very similar, on McCumber's view, to the goal of theoretical idealism: ethical theory seeks to take our desires, motivations, and needs as they are, reducing them to moments in a larger whole, and reappropriating them for the project of freedom through their systematization.

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The Hegel who emerges from McCumber's account is both a master of abstraction and an advocate of the concrete -- indeed, it is his more thoroughgoing abstraction, in both theoretical and practical philosophy, that shows us our need for and dependence upon the concrete, even as we work to appropriate and transform, to universalize, the given material of experience through systematization. This Hegel is also in some sense a naturalist, happy to discuss the sensory and perceptual origins of our concepts, and the origins of our ethical and moral principles in natural drives of the most varied sort. In addition, he is an idealist, pushing us to see our most rationalized drive -- the drive for freedom -- as demanding a reconstruction of our vocabulary from out of our own purified, rationalized resources, while revealing all our experience as itself constituted through that vocabulary. And he is arguably a Kantian, at least insofar as thinking Kant had some good points makes one a Kantian.

What this Hegel is not is a patient reader or critical thinker, at least not in the dominant, "internal critique" sense. The Hegel of the Phenomenology or even the Logic, carefully exploring and teasing out the fine inner structure of positions not his own -- this Hegel is nowhere to be found in McCumber's book. Instead we have a Hegel whose engagement with Kant is of a different, and somewhat hard to pin-down, kind: his most central commitments are quite distant from Kant's transcendental concerns, his greatest philosophical efforts are aimed at a radically innovative, and radically un-Kantian, linguistic-terminological project, and even when he speaks of Kant directly, he doesn't really bother to examine his position clearly. But yet he does speak of Kant, repeatedly, and is eager to incorporate bits and pieces of Kant's system into his own, while often transforming them almost beyond recognition. That McCumber can make such a Hegel seem so eminently reasonable, so contemporary, and in many ways so preferable to the conceptual vivisector we are all more familiar with, is a testimony to his persuasive skills, and to the power of his insights into Hegel's immensely complex relationship to Kant's philosophy.


[1] Other recent books in or around this area include William F. Bristow, Hegel and the Transformation of Philosophical Critique (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007), reviewed in NDPR, 2008.08.13; Sally Sedgwick, Hegel's Critique of Kant: From Dichotomy to Identity (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012), reviewed in NDPR, 2013.04.01; and Brady Bowman, Hegel and the Metaphysics of Absolute Negativity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013), reviewed in NDPR, 2013.12.23.

[2] See Terry Pinkard, Hegel's Naturalism: Mind, Nature, and the Final Ends of Life (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012), reviewed in NDPR, 2012.10.30.

[3] John McCumber, The Company of Words: Hegel, Language, and Systematic Philosophy (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1993).