2014.05.04

Chris Tucker (ed.)

Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism

Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 357pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199899494.

Reviewed by Elijah Chudnoff, University of Miami


In "The Skeptic and the Dogmatist," Jim Pryor defended the thesis that, "whenever you have an experience as of p, you thereby have immediate prima facie justification for believing p."[1] Pryor is talking about perceptual experiences, and this is dogmatism about perceptual justification.[2] In Skepticism and the Veil of Perception Michael Huemer defended the thesis that, "if it seems to S as if P, then S thereby has at least prima facie justification for believing that P."[3] This is phenomenal conservatism. The two theses appear to be related as follows: dogmatism about perceptual justification is just phenomenal conservatism restricted to perceptual seemings.[4][5]

Both dogmatism about perceptual justification and phenomenal conservatism have been prominent views in the epistemological literature of the last decade and a half.  This volume collects 15 new papers that deepen and extend the discussions from this literature. Chris Tucker should be congratulated for editing an excellent volume. The individual contributions are all high quality. I expect some to become mandatory readings on their topics. More than that, however, altogether the volume constitutes a coherent and truly illuminating exploration of fundamental issues about epistemic justification and its grounds. Anyone interested in these issues should read it.

In this review I will focus on three questions.

1.     Are seemings ever justifiers?

2.     If some seemings are justifiers, then does the justification that derives from them meet internalist standards?

3.     If some but not all seemings are justifiers, then what makes the difference?

Many, though not all, of the contributions can be seen as addressing one or another of these questions. More significantly, however, these questions are all tied to the nature of seemings. This is an issue that runs throughout the volume. The plausibility of phenomenal conservatism (the view I will focus on) largely depends on the nature of seemings. This is one of the things reading the volume most impressed on me. Further, I was struck by the regularity with which the contributors chose to conceive of seemings along lines that, in my view at least, weaken rather than strengthen the position.

Seemings as Justifiers

Contrast two theses:

(A)  Often if it seems to you that p, then you have prima facie justification for believing that p.

(B)  Often if it seems to you that p, then you thereby have prima facie justification for believing that p.

Claim (B) implies that seemings are justifiers. But claim (A) does not. For all it says seemings themselves might never be what makes you have justification for a belief.

Phenomenal conservatives believe both (A) and (B). But Earl Conee, Robert Audi, and Michael Tooley all argue for views that favor (A) over (B). In "Seeming Evidence" Conee distinguishes between seemings and evidence. Often when it seems to you that p it does so because you have evidence that p. The evidence -- not the seeming -- prima facie justifies you in believing that p. Hence (A), but not (B). In "Doxastic Innocence," Audi distinguishes between seemings and deliverances of the traditional basic sources of belief -- perception, consciousness, memory, and intuition. Often when it seems to you that p it does so because of some deliverance from one of the traditional basic sources of belief. The deliverance -- not the seeming -- prima facie justifies you in believing that p. Hence (A), but not (B). In "Michael Huemer and the Principle of Phenomenal Conservatism," Tooley distinguishes between seemings and phenomenally qualified mental states. Often when it seems to you that p it does so because you are in a phenomenally qualified mental state representing that p. Perhaps the phenomenally qualified mental state representing that p -- not the seeming -- prima facie justifies you in believing that p. This is not quite Tooley's view however. His view seems to be that the phenomenally qualified mental state prima facie justifies you in believing that you are in it and that belief plus some other belief about its evidential bearing on p jointly prima facie justify you in believing that p. Either way there is reason to believe (A), but not (B).

One might find all of this rather puzzling. For one might think seemings just are evidence, deliverances of the traditional basic sources of belief, and phenomenally qualified mental states. This is what I thought. But Conee, Audi, and Tooley are responding to a conception of seemings that is prevalent throughout the volume and that is difficult to reconcile with such an identification.

Suppose you look around. You have some visual experiences. Some propositions visually seem to you to be true. How are these related? One view is that they are identical:

Identity Thesis: For it to visually seem to you that p is for you to have a visual experience part of whose content is that p.

One might hold analogous identity theses for other sorts of experiences and seemings -- e.g., tactile, auditory, intuitive, introspective, etc. Call this conception of seemings the Identity View. Suppose the Identity View were true. Then plausibly seemings would be evidence, deliverances of the traditional basic sources of belief, and phenomenally qualified mental states. We'd have reason to go along with the phenomenal conservative in accepting both (A) and (B). I think Conee, Audi, and Tooley would accept this point. What they deny is the Identity View. Michael Bergmann (157), Berit Brogaard (276), Andrew Cullison (33), Michael Huemer (333), and Tucker (7) all also deny the Identity View.

Suppose the Identity View were false. Then how would visual experiences and visual seemings be related? There are different options one might explore, but they are all likely to be variants on the following:

Composition Thesis: For it to visually seem to you that p is for you to have a visual experience and for it to seem to you that p and for these to be suitably related.

The Composition View includes analogous composition theses for other sorts of experiences and seemings. Further, unless there is some special reason to think seemings always occur conjoined with experiences, the Composition View implies that there are states of mere seeming: sometimes it just seems to you that p -- not visually, aurally, tactually, intuitively, introspectively, etc.

It is these non-experiential seemings that bother Conee, Audi, and Tooley. Audi puts the point well:

suppose that, when realizing someone may wonder why I believe p, I rationalize p by saying to myself, "It seems true to me," where a proposition's seeming true to me is constituted simply by a seeming that p, embodying the relevant kind of affirmative sense toward it. If there is nothing more to say that connects the seeming to a source like perception, I would surely have failed. (193)

I'm sympathetic. I'm inclined to think that Conee, Audi, and Tooley raise considerations that -- in conjunction with other concerns that will emerge below -- support thinking that if the Identity View were false and something like the Composition View were true, then at most (A), not (B), would be true, and we should reject phenomenal conservatism.

But rejecting the Identity View is optional. The considerations against it are not compelling. One consideration comes from the speckled hen:

(1)  When you see a hen with 48 speckles you have a visual experience part of whose content is that there is a hen with 48 speckles.

(2)  But when you see a hen with 48 speckles it does not seem to you that there is a hen with 48 speckles.

Another consideration comes from the expert/novice distinction:

(3)  When an expert and a novice look at an elm they have visual experiences with the same content.

(4)  But it seems to the expert that there is an elm and it does not seem to the novice that there is an elm.

Another consideration comes from blind-sight:

(5)  If a blind-sighted person judges there to be an F in his blind spot, it is because it seems to him that there is an F there.

(6)  But if a blind-sighted person judges there to be an F in his blind spot, he does not have a visual experience part of whose content is that there is an F there.

These examples are scattered throughout the volume.[6] A full discussion of them is beyond the scope of this review. But here are a few thoughts.

First, neither (1) nor (2) is mandatory. When you see a hen with 48 speckles you might have a visual experience part of whose content is that there is a hen with a speckle there1, and a speckle there2, and a speckle there3 . . . and a speckle there48 without having a visual experience part of whose content is that there is a hen with 48 speckles. The first conjunctive proposition implies the second numerical proposition, but in general even if p implies q one might represent that p without representing that q. On the other hand, why not think that when you see a hen with 48 speckles it does seem to you that there is a hen with 48 speckles? One point is that you are not inclined to believe there is a hen with 48 speckles. But seemings are different from inclinations to believe. Another point is that if you do wind up forming the belief that there is a hen with 48 speckles, still it would be unjustified. But this is doxastic justification. Maybe you do have propositional justification for such a belief but cannot properly base a belief on it.[7]

(3) is controversial. Some philosophers think that perceptual experiences have high-level content.[8] They would say that the novice and the expert have visual experiences with contents that largely overlap -- hence the manifest similarity -- but that the expert's visual experience represents something that the novice's visual experience does not, namely that there is an elm. Brogaard engages with this issue, but as we'll see, there is a way of accommodating what she says while rejecting (3).

On the other hand, one might deploy the ideas developed against (2) against (4). Maybe in the relevant sense of seeming it does seem to the novice that there is an elm and the novice does thereby have propositional justification for believing there is an elm. The distinction between the expert and the novice might be at the level of inclinations to believe and capacities to form doxastically justified beliefs.

Claim (5) is puzzling. I would have thought all parties agree that seemings are phenomenally conscious. For many phenomenal conservatives think it is their phenomenology that endows seemings with epistemic import. And if they are not phenomenally conscious it is unclear how they might count as internalist justifiers. But the informational states that enable blind-sighted judgment have generally been construed as paradigm examples of phenomenally unconscious -- though perhaps, at least in imaginary cases, access conscious -- mental states.[9] Brogaard (280) and Tooley (313) make similar observations.

In light of all this I'm inclined to think that rejecting the Identity View in favor of the Composition View unnecessarily weakens the phenomenal conservative position.

Seemings and Internalism

One of the focal points in the recent literature on internalism is Bergmann's dilemma for internalism. Here is how he presents it in "Phenomenal Conservatism and the Dilemma for Internalism":

(1)  "An essential feature of internalism is that it makes a subject's awareness of some justification-contributor a necessary condition for the justification of any belief held by that subject" (163).

(2)  "the awareness required is either strong awareness or weak awareness," where strong awareness "involves conceiving of the object of awareness as being in some way relevant to the justification or truth of the belief," and weak awareness does not (163).

(3)  "requiring strong awareness leads to one sort of problem" -- namely regress (164-165) or irrelevance (166).

(4)  "Requiring weak awareness leads to another sort of problem" -- namely the belief's truth "being an accident from the subject's perspective" (168).

(5)  "if internalism leads to either problem, we shouldn't endorse it" (163).

One might think that seemings provide a way out. Suppose it visually seems to you that there is a red light ahead. You do not form any thoughts about this seeming. But you do take it at face value and form the belief that there is a red light ahead. Then the following seem plausible: you are aware of your seeming just in virtue of having it; you are not strongly aware of it in Bergmann's sense; but it is not an accident from your perspective that there is a red light ahead, since this is exactly how things look to you.

Bergmann calls the condition on justification indicated in (4) SPO after "Subject's Perspective Objection":

If the believing subject isn't aware of what her belief has going for it, then from her perspective, it is an accident that the belief is true, in which case the belief isn't justified. (168)

Bergmann invokes SPO in discounting seemings as internalist justifiers: its seeming to you that p does not make p non-accidentally true from your perspective since you might not be aware that its seeming to you that p indicates that p is true (173). More on this below.

In "Does Phenomenal Conservatism Solve Internalism's Dilemma?" Matthias Steup accepts SPO and agrees with Bergmann that seemings fail to meet SPO. He rejects Bergmann's dilemma however. Steup suggests that seemings plus relevant data from memory jointly meet SPO in a way that circumvents both horns of the dilemma. He defends a view he calls internalist reliabilism:

Necessarily, S is justified in believing p if and only if (i) S believes that p; (ii) S has a seeming that p of kind K; (iii) S's seeming that p is undefeated; (iv) S's memory data support the attribution of reliability to kind K seemings. (147)

Condition (iv) is supposed to meet SPO, but since it does not require that S actually reflect on the memory data and form the belief that seemings of kind K are reliable it is also supposed to avoid the problems indicated in Bergmann's premise (3). Bergmann's paper contains a plausible reply.

In "Phenomenal Conservatism Über Alles," Huemer distinguishes between SPO as Bergmann and Steup interpret it and a weaker condition. On their understanding, SPO requires that "the subject have positive grounds for believing that his belief-forming method is reliable," but the weaker condition just imposes a negative condition, "if S believes or has grounds for believing [P is at best accidentally true], then S is not justified in believing P" (337). Huemer rejects SPO as Bergmann and Steup interpret it, endorses the negative condition, and notes that it is compatible with phenomenal conservatism and taking seemings to meet internalist standards.

One point that goes unremarked in all of these discussions is the extent to which Bergmann's claim, that its seeming to you that p is compatible with its being an accident from your perspective that p, depends on a certain conception of seemings. Suppose the Identity View is false. And consider its visually seeming to you that there is a red light ahead. Under what conditions is your seeming true? Presumably just in case there is a red light ahead. Seemings on this conception have minimal veridicality conditions:

Minimal Conditions: If it seems to you that p, then your seeming is veridical just in case p.

Suppose the Identity View is true. So for it to visually seem to you that there is a red light ahead is for you to have a visual experience part of whose content is that there is a red light ahead. No visual experience has just that as its content. In having a visual experience it seems to you as if you are in visual contact with your environment. As it is often put: visual experiences are presentational. And plausibly this makes a difference to their veridicality conditions. If the Identity View is true, then Minimal Conditions is not true.

What should we replace Minimal Conditions with? Well suppose you have a visual experience as of a red light ahead, there is a red light ahead, but you do not see that red light but one reflected in an interposed mirror. Then your visual experience is to some extent inaccurate. That you are in visual contact with the very red light that seems to be ahead is part of the content of your visual experience. So in this case we should say that if it visually seems to you that there is a red light ahead, then your seeming is veridical just in case there is a red light ahead and your visual experience puts you in contact with what makes it the case that there is a red light ahead.

Plausibly this presentational character is a general feature of experiences -- and so, given the Identity View, a general feature of seemings as well. We can put the idea like this:

Presentational Conditions: If it ψ-ly seems to you that p and your ψ experience has presentational character with respect to p, then your seeming is veridical only if p and your ψ experience puts you in contact with what makes p true.

Notice the relativization that allows experiences to lack presentational character with respect to parts of their content. I return to this point below.

Now reconsider what Bergmann says about seemings. If its seeming to you that p includes your seeming to be in contact with what makes p true, then can it really be an accident from your perspective that p is true? I'm inclined to think not. If this is correct, then one can accept a form of SPO stronger than what Huemer is prepared to concede but still think that seemings themselves independently of help from memory data or anything else can be internalist justifiers.

Restricting Phenomenal Conservatism

Phenomenal conservatism is an unrestricted thesis: whenever it seems to you that p, then you thereby have at least prima facie justification for believing that p. Matthew McGrath, Peter Markie, and Brogaard argue that phenomenal conservatism should be restricted: whenever it seems to you that p and condition C is met, then you thereby have at least prima facie justification for believing that p. They make different proposals about what condition C should be.

Before getting into that, however, let us review the motivation for imposing some restriction or other. The motivation comes from reflection on cases of cognitive penetration. Here is Markie's early example of the gold prospectors:

Suppose that we are prospecting for gold. You have learned to identify a gold nugget on sight but I have no such knowledge. As the water washes out of my pan, we both look at a pebble, which is in fact a gold nugget. My desire to discover gold makes it seem to me as if the pebble is gold; your learned identification skills make it seem that way to you. According to [unrestricted phenomenal conservatism], the belief that it is gold has prima facie justification for both of us. Yet, certainly, my wishful thinking should not gain my perceptual belief the same positive epistemic status of defeasible justification as your learned identification skills.[10]

In his contribution, Huemer makes a case for rejecting Markie's assessment. He argues that, "when the subject is unaware of an appearance's etiology, that etiology is irrelevant to what it is rational for the subject to believe" (344). I'm sympathetic, and I'm inclined to doubt that the difference in justification Markie detects is because of the difference in etiology. Still, there does seem to be some difference in justification. Just why might become clearer when we look at some of the proposed restrictions on phenomenal conservatism.

In "Phenomenal Conservatism and Cognitive Penetration: The 'Bad Basis' Counterexamples," McGrath distinguishes between receptive seemings and quasi-inferred seemings. Quasi-inferred seemings are seemings that result from psychological transitions that would count as inferences were they to result in a belief with the same content. Receptive seemings are seemings that are not quasi-inferred. McGrath proposes restricting phenomenal conservatism to receptive seemings. It isn't clear to me, however, that the notion of quasi-inference can do the work McGrath would like it to do. If quasi-inference is phenomenally manifest, then I doubt that any seemings are quasi-inferred since their phenomenology is that of something given. If quasi-inference is not phenomenally manifest, then I don't see why it should have any epistemic significance. Again, I agree with Huemer about the irrelevance of hidden etiology.

In "Searching for True Dogmatism," Markie makes what he calls the Knowledge How Proposal: "an epistemically appropriate perceptual seeming experience to the effect that something is Q is one that is had in the exercise of the subject's knowledge of how to perceptually identify something as being Q" (262). Suppose you see a shiny, yellow nugget and it looks to be gold. Now contrast two propositions:

(1)  That is a shiny, yellow nugget.

(2)  That is a gold nugget.

Markie focuses on (2). Maybe you require some know-how or background information to have justification for believing (2). But this seems implausible about (1). A variant on Markie's view, then, is that phenomenal conservatism holds for propositions like (1), but not propositions like (2). Huemer considers this view and worries that it introduces an unmotivated double standard (343). Another worry is that we lack a principle for drawing the distinction.

Brogaard's proposal in "Phenomenal Seemings and Sensible Dogmatism" suggests a principle. Like many of the other contributors, Brogaard distinguishes between experiences and seemings. But some seemings are intimately tied to experiences by the relation of content-grounding:

A seeming of the form [It seems to A as if q] is grounded in a content p of a particular perceptual, introspective, or memory-related experience e had by A iff [Reliably (if p is a content of e, then it seems to A as if q) and Reliably (if it seems to A as if q, then q)]. (277)

Brogaard thinks phenomenal conservatism should be restricted to content-grounded seemings. The relation to the variant on Markie's view is this: though both (1) and (2) might be contents of seemings, only (1) bears the content-grounding relation to a perceptual experience. So maybe there is a principle for making the distinction. And, pace Huemer, the motivation is just the intuitive verdicts about Markie's example cases.

Brogaard's view has the odd consequence that any seeming might be content-grounded in any experience so long as conditions ensuring the relevant reliable connection are in place. There is no internal relation between the seeming and the experience. It just depends on there being conditions of one sort or another ensuring the relevant reliable connection. One way to avoid this consequence is to reconsider the cognitive penetration cases in light of the Identity View and the associated Presentational Conditions introduced above.

Cognitive penetration cases illustrate a possibility anticipated in the previous section: visual seemings do not have a presentational character with respect to all of their contents. Suppose it visually seems to you that (1) that is a shiny, yellow nugget and (2) that is a gold nugget. These are two parts of the content of your visual experience. Plausibly, however, while your visual experience does seem to put you in visual contact with what makes (1) true -- with the shininess and the yellowness of the nugget -- it does not seem to put you into visual contact with what makes (2) true -- with the atomic number of the element out of which the nugget is made. At most it seems to put you into visual contact with evidence of such a composition. In general we should distinguish between those contents with respect to which an experience has presentational character and those contents with respect to which it does not. Given the Identity View, the same holds for seemings. One principled way to restrict phenomenal conservatism, then, is to restrict it to those propositions with respect to which seemings have presentational character: whenever it seems to you that p and your seeming has presentational character with respect to p, then you thereby have at least prima facie justification for believing that p. If it seems to you that p and your seeming lacks presentational character with respect to p, you still might have prima facie justification for believing that p, but, as the cognitive penetration cases suggest, it will depend in part on background information.

I've focused on a selection of issues from 10 out of 15 contributions. To give an impression of the volume's range, I'll conclude by briefly indicating the aims of the essays I have not discussed.

In "Seemings and Semantics" Cullison defends a Russellian view about the contents of seemings on the assumption that they are not the same as the contents of experiences. In "Immediate Justification, Perception, and Intuition" Jessica Brown explores how one might defend the view that intuitions immediately justify believing their contents on the basis of minimal epistemological and ontological assumptions about intuitions. In "Problems for Credulism" James Pryor develops a penetrating analysis of the well-known tensions between dogmatism and Bayesianism. In "Agent Centeredness, Agent Neutrality, Disagreement, and Truth Conduciveness" Michael DePaul makes a case for thinking that rational disagreements are possible on the basis of conflicting seemings. In "Phenomenal Conservatism and The Principle of Credulity" William Lycan explores how phenomenal conservatism might fit in with his own preferred form of explanationist coherentism. Finally, there is Tucker's "Seemings and Justification: An Introduction," in which he develops an insightful overview of the philosophical terrain covered by the volume.

REFERENCES

Block, Ned. 2002. "Some Concepts of Consciousness." In D. Chalmers (ed.), Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. OUP.

Hawley, Katherine and Macpherson, Fiona (eds). 2011. The Admissible Contents of Experience. Wiley-Blackwell.

Huemer, Michael. 2001. Skepticism and the Veil of Perception. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.

Markie, Peter. 2005. "The Mystery of Direct Perceptual Justification." Philosophical Studies 126: 347-73.

Pryor, James. 2000. "The Skeptic and the Dogmatist." Noûs 34(4): 517-49.

Siewert, Charles. 1998. The Significance of Consciousness. Princeton University Press.

Smithies, Declan. 2012. "Mentalism and Epistemic Transparency." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 90(4): 723-41.

Tolhurst, William. 1998. "Seemings." American Philosophical Quarterly 35: 293-302.

Tucker, Christopher. 2010. "Why Open-Minded People Should Endorse Dogmatism." Philosophical Perspectives 24: 529-45.


[1] (Pryor 2000), 536.

[2] This is a convenient fiction. Really Pryor meant dogmatism “to be the view that immediate justification exists even where it might be undermined by skeptical (or mundane) defeaters that one has no epistemically antecedent grounds for ruling out” (96).

[3] (Huemer 2001), 99.

[4] I hedge this claim because dogmatism about perceptual justification is about experiences and phenomenal conservatism is about seemings and, as we’ll see, one might think these are distinct.    

[5] (Tolhurst 1998) is another early defense of a view in the vicinity of these.

[6] See also (Tucker 2010).

[7] Cf. (Smithies 2012).

[8] See (Hawley and Macpherson 2011).

[9] See, for example, (Siewert 1998) and (Block 2002). In personal communication Tucker has clarified that he rejects this view of these informational states. The issue is too complicated to pursue at any length here.

[10] (Markie 2005), 356 – 57.