2014.05.13

Christopher Heath Wellman

Liberal Rights and Responsibilities: Essays on Citizenship and Sovereignty

Christopher Heath Wellman, Liberal Rights and Responsibilities: Essays on Citizenship and Sovereignty, Oxford University Press, 2014, 261pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199982189.

Reviewed by Kristen Hessler, University at Albany, SUNY


This is a collection of papers written by Christopher Heath Wellman over the last twenty years, including one written specifically for this volume, on a range of pivotal questions in political philosophy. As Wellman sees it, one important contribution of this collection is to show how a compelling and mutually supporting set of answers to a fairly wide range of problems in political philosophy can be grounded in a consistent and "relatively modest" set of normative commitments (2).

The first two essays defend the normative individualism characteristic of liberal political theory against associative views, which maintain that relational ties are "morally basic" sources of independent moral obligations. The next two defend Wellman's "samaritan account" of political obligation, according to which individuals have a duty (corresponding to the rights of their fellow citizens) to obey the law as their fair share of the burden of maintaining political society, thereby "rescuing" their fellow citizens from the perils of the state of nature. The next five essays address questions of international political theory, including the morality of secession, state sovereignty, and immigration, as well as questions of individual and group responsibility. The final two develop a rights-forfeiture account of the state's right to punish.

Wellman's work displays an uncommonly wide range of philosophical virtues. His writing is highly disciplined and systematic, his ability to construct and critique complex philosophical positions in a clear and accessible way is profoundly enviable, and the positions he develops are, more often than not, both compelling and provocative. These virtues undoubtedly account for the fact that so many of these papers helped to shape the philosophical debates to which they contributed. For my part, reading this collection has been extremely helpful not only as a way to become more familiar with the roots of Wellman's own positions on topics of political obligation and international justice, but also for his distinctive perspective on these broader debates over recent years.

For example, Wellman's rights-forfeiture view of punishment revives a disfavored position, so to defend it he responds systematically to seven prominent arguments against his view, in most cases summarizing the canonical version of the argument in the literature before providing his response. Similarly, his hybrid view of the morality of secession combines elements from the literature supporting consent-based views and teleological views, after convincingly critiquing prominent versions of each. Finally (but certainly not least), Wellman defends his samaritan view of political obligation with a fascinating argument that develops out of his critique of existing theories. In each case, while a reader might not agree with Wellman's assessment of the existing literature, his critiques are carefully constructed and demand serious consideration, as do his own positive views.

One unifying idea in Wellman's approach to the various questions addressed is the concept of "dominion." This is Wellman's oft-cited synonym for the sort of liberty that, in his view, animates liberal theories of justice. Wellman consistently explicates this idea as the ability to do what one wishes (at least as long as what one wishes to do does not violate the rights of others) without interference. The value of liberty-as-dominion functions for Wellman as a starting point, a presumptive value that stands unless and until it's defeated, and one which, he thinks, any genuinely liberal theorist must either honor or explain why not. This is apparent, for example, in the opening lines of Chapter 3 ("Toward a Liberal Theory of Political Obligation"):

Political obligation has been a significant and enduring problem for liberals because they place a premium upon individual liberty, and states restrict this liberty with coercive laws. . . . There is nothing logically inconsistent about both valuing individual autonomy and positing a duty to obey the law, but it is incumbent upon liberals to explain how citizens who normally enjoy a privileged position of dominion over their own affairs have acquired moral reasons to act as the laws of their country demand. (53)

That Wellman's liberalism has a decidedly libertarian flavor is clear from (among other things) the fact that he frequently takes John Simmons as one of his primary interlocutors, and political anarchism as the default conclusion towards which liberty-as-dominion leads,unless reasons can be found to divert the course of argument in another direction at some point along the journey. Wellman takes up this burden of proof with admirable success, defending not only the justifiability of a not-necessarily-minimal state against the anarchist and the strict libertarian, but also defending value individualism and an attractive range of individual freedoms against the communitarian and the nationalist.

Wellman occasionally seems to construct the problems he addresses in fairly stark, libertarian terms, only to introduce along the way much richer concepts which he then leans on to defend his own views -- which raises the question of why he started out with the stark construal of the problem in the first place. For example, Wellman's own "samaritan" account of political obligation centrally insists that "the most appealing as well as historically plausible understanding of liberalism" gives a central role to samaritan rights -- "positive rights to assistance rather than negative rights to mere noninterference" (68). I have no problem with this view, but it not obvious how we should square the existence of such rights with the dominion that Wellman attributes to individuals.

Similarly, the value of equality sometimes turns up in Wellman's chapters as a "core value of liberalism" (p. 30), though obviously not, in Wellman's view, quite as close to the core of liberalism as the concept of dominion. For example, in "Relational Facts in Liberal Political Theory", which convincingly refutes the associativist claim that special relationships have basic (foundational) moral value, Wellman argues that "liberalism's twin values of equality and liberty make its adherents allergic to viewing relational facts in this manner" (29). Given that liberal theory has long treated these values as competitors (as in Robert Nozick's libertarian rejoinder to "end-state" theories of distributive equality in his famous Wilt Chamberlain example), we might expect Wellman to offer a defense of equality in terms of liberty-as-dominion, or some indication of how to compromise these two values when they conflict. But I cannot see that he anywhere explicitly addresses this pressing question.

A related issue is a persistent slide of Wellman's arguments between, in Thomas Pogge's terms, considerations of ethics and those of justice, where principles of justice evaluate institutions, and principles of ethics evaluate the conduct of individuals or groups. Just making this distinction, even if it needs further elaboration, suggests that justice is not simply a matter of ethics-writ-large. While Wellman recognizes this point at key moments, there are times when it seems to go unnoticed, especially in his framing of the problems he addresses.

For example, in his consideration of the particularity requirement (why are citizens bound to obey the laws of the particular state of which they are citizens?), Wellman treats even justice as a kind of straightforwardly interpersonal ethical value. In the course of rejecting Jeremy Waldron's argument that individuals have obligations to support just institutions that themselves promote justice, Wellman constructs a thought experiment that involves a fictional institute established by Ted Turner, which promotes justice by rewarding the virtuous (83-4). Wellman asks: May this institute tax individuals to support its work? According to Wellman, Waldron must either admit that Turner may permissibly tax citizens to fund the institute, or deny that justice requires rewarding the virtuous, or admit that Turner's institute does support justice but find some way of distinguishing it from a legitimate government in order to justify taxation by the latter but not the former. While Wellman ultimately argues, and I agree, that a fully adequate response would explain the difference between Turner's institute and the legitimate government of a political state, I also think we should deny that rewarding the virtuous is relevant to the sense of justice that matters for political philosophy. To use an analogy of my own: there is a sense of justice according to which it is unjust of me not to call my loving and devoted mother on Mother's Day, but I take it that there is no sense in which this ethical consideration creates the presumption that political justice requires that our institutions either tax you to ensure that I call my mother or punish me for not doing so.

One strength of Wellman's writing is his creative use of vivid examples to illustrate his arguments. Sometimes this works admirably. One example supporting his samaritan view of obligation, for instance, involves a group of people, each possessing a component of a bus which an agent needs to commandeer in order to actually construct the bus and thereby rescue the entire group from some calamity. Importantly, because this example helpfully illustrates Wellman's idea that the "natural" duty of rescue among individuals can justify a very limited state, this example is ultimately a successful argumentative device. At times, however, his use of analogies between individuals and institutions threatens to reduce any analysis of political justice to the concepts appropriate for interpersonal ethics. For example, "Immigration and Freedom of Association" starts with a sketch of the problem that centrally features Wellman's basic premise that individuals have a right to "dominion" over their own affairs, including the right to decide whom (if anyone) to marry. Based on this analogy, Wellman presumes the same rights on the part of the state:

In light of our views on marriage . . . the case for a state's right to control immigration might seem straightforward: just as an individual has a right to determine whom (if anyone) he or she would like to marry, a group of fellow-citizens has a right to determine whom (if anyone) it would like to invite into its political community. And just as an individual's freedom of association entitles one to remain single, a state's freedom of association entitles it to exclude all foreigners from its political community. (182)

This analogy suggests that typical liberal freedom of association for individuals is an unproblematic starting point for thinking about institutional morality -- despite the fact (which Wellman wouldn't deny) that it has a deeply tarnished history of being used as the thinnest of disguises for excluding and subordinating disfavored groups such as women, racial minorities, and immigrants. What makes this not only unfortunate, but also more deeply perplexing, is the fact that Wellman goes on in this chapter to use Elizabeth Anderson's idea of relational equality to deflect criticism (from the direction of luck-egalitarianism) of his own view that states may permissibly close their borders. Indeed, at one point in this chapter he seems to refer to himself as a relational egalitarian, despite the fact that relational egalitarianism seems to sit poorly with his normative foundations (194).

Importantly, Anderson herself argues that accepting relational equality as an ideal requires not only re-thinking the value of freedom of association, but also redefining freedom itself. Anderson's own re-interpretation of liberty in light of the ideals of relational equality adopts Amartya Sen's idea of freedom as capabilities to achieve various functionings, both as a political agent and in civil society. Anderson's "equality in the space of freedom," then, is a far cry from liberty-as-dominion. How are we to make the two ideas fit comfortably within Wellman's understanding of liberalism? And, given his sympathy for the idea of relational equality, shouldn't he instead start his discussion of immigration with the idea that traditional liberal freedom of association is actually suspect, unless it can be shown to operate in concrete social situations in ways consistent with relational equality? Moreover, since Wellman ultimately argues, very reasonably, that restricting immigration specifically on racial or religious grounds is impermissible because it treats some people like second-class citizens, shouldn't he define liberalism in terms of, or at least in a way that makes obvious room for, a prohibition against constructing institutions that create social or political hierarchies?

In the end, it's not entirely obvious that Wellman's book illuminates as clearly as he would like how to defend a wide range of philosophical positions from a consistent and relatively modest set of normative commitments, since his commitments actually seem less modest, and perhaps less consistent, than advertised. I'm not at all convinced this is a shortcoming of the book, however. If the alternative is exhorting Wellman to consistently deploy only modest normative commitments, I would prefer instead to see this singularly creative philosopher reflect more deeply on the normative foundations of liberalism.