2014.06.17

F. Thomas Burke

What Pragmatism Was

F. Thomas Burke, What Pragmatism Was, Indiana University Press, 2013, 233pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253009586.

Reviewed by Robert B. Talisse, Vanderbilt University


Charles Peirce introduced the term pragmatism in the early 1870s at The Metaphysical Club. Peirce meant to name the methodological doctrine articulated in what has since come to be known as "the pragmatic maxim." That maxim first appeared in his 1878 essay, "How to Make Our Ideas Clear"; there one finds a standard formulation: "Consider what effects, that might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object." As is well known, the point of the maxim is to achieve a degree of clearness in thought that goes beyond Cartesian "clear and distinct" ideas. It is less often noticed that Peirce did not use the term pragmatism in that essay, nor does it appear in its companion piece, "The Fixation of Belief."

The pragmatic maxim (like the term pragmatism) went largely unnoticed until the publication of William James's 1898 essay "Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results"; there, James applauds Peirce for coining the term and proposing the maxim. But James's praise is promptly undercut when he revises the maxim, claiming that Peirce expressed it too narrowly. Due largely to James's influence, by 1905 the term had become so unruly that an exasperated Peirce surrendered it; he rebaptized his philosophy pragmaticism, a term he thought so ungainly that no one would dream of robbing it. The battle over pragmatism has been raging ever since. Thus pragmatism today comes with hyphens and qualifiers: classical pragmatism, neo-pragmatism, neo-classical pragmatism, everyday pragmatism, analytic pragmatism, semantic pragmatism, epistemic pragmatism, holistic pragmatism, and so on. (There's even a book presently being written promoting a view called skeptical pragmatism. Go figure.)

There is considerable irony in the fact that the meaning of the pragmatic maxim should itself be the focus of longstanding philosophical disputation. At the very least, a philosophical doctrine devoted to making our ideas clear should be itself clear. And although it may turn out in the end that some degree of vagueness in the term pragmatism is ineliminable, clarity is surely worth trying for. Otherwise, even its hyphenated and qualified deployments are in danger of being insignificant.

In What Pragmatism Was, F. Thomas Burke makes an important contribution to an emerging genre within the pragmatism literature. His approach stands in stark contrast with the standard way of writing about pragmatism. This standard approach tends towards an unnerving nostalgia for a fictitious Golden Age when Dewey reigned supreme in the profession and the American consciousness. The account continues that this Golden Age was lost sometime in the 1930s, and philosophy in America was then taken over by the alien forces of logical positivism and analytic philosophy. Accordingly, the aim of historical writing in this standard mode has been to regain what was lost, and, importantly, to reestablish Dewey as America's philosophical king and intellectual conscience. These aims require that the history be unificationist, presenting Dewey as the culmination of truths only incompletely grasped by Peirce and James. Unificationism in turn calls for a narrative that downplays the fundamental disagreements between Peirce and James. Most importantly, the standard approach also calls for a kind of hostility towards post-Deweyan philosophy. As the close of the Golden Age must be seen as a loss of the philosophical Promised Land, subsequent trends must be either assimilated as Things Dewey Would Have Said Better, or rejected as simpleminded errors to be gotten over.

The standard approach embodies a wide range of vices. Its unificationism favors a shoddy reading of the historical texts. Further, like the Golden Age image that provides its motivation, the standard approach relies upon an equally fictitious portrait of post-Deweyan American philosophy. The advances made by mid-century pragmatist giants like Lewis, Goodman, Sellars, and Quine (not to mention those outside of the U.S. like Carnap and Ramsey) are either ignored or caricatured, despite the fact that these developments were most frequently proposed explicitly in the name of pragmatism. These two tendencies in the standard line encourage another, namely, a principled insularity towards contemporary philosophy. Once one is convinced that philosophy was completed by the 1930s, all that's left to do is bury oneself in scripture, preach to the choir, and patiently wait for the Second Coming. Meanwhile, real world philosophical problems come and go without mention.

Burke's book refreshingly eschews these tendencies, and there is a lot in this text that is worth discussing, including Burke's insightful treatments of Jane Addams's settlement movement and emerging topics in pragmatist social philosophy. In this review, however, I will focus on what I see as the book's two-stage central project: first, Burke provides a compelling account of pragmatism's conflicted historical core; second, he offers a fascinating, though to my mind problematic, account of how contemporary pragmatists might devise a "constructive, inclusive synthesis" (36) in a "double-aspect pragmatist stance" (48; cf. 7, 131).

I start with Burke's account of what pragmatism was. Burke begins with the uncontroversial claim that pragmatism is essentially a two-part program composed of closely related conceptions of belief and meaning (1). The pragmatist conception of belief holds that beliefs are formed in response to doubt, and are to be individuated according to the habits of action that they produce. The pragmatist conception of meaning is articulated in the pragmatic maxim, which, as Burke summarizes it, claims that "a clear definition of a given word or concept will be in terms of the rules of action that would be constitutively involved in believing that the concept applies in a given case" (143). The conflict at the heart of pragmatism lies in an "ambiguity" in the maxim that generates "at least two distinct readings": one "operationalist," and the other "inferentialist" (1-2). The first is the one favored by Peirce, and the second is the one championed by James. Burke further alleges that the Jamesian/inferentialist understanding of the pragmatic maxim is the one that has proven most influential on subsequent philosophy, including the more recent pragmatisms of Sellars, Putnam, Rorty, Robert Brandom (44-45) and Susan Haack (56).

The difference between the operationalist and inferentialist interpretations of the pragmatic maxim concerns the scope of the "practical effects" of an idea or concept (43). The inferentialist reading holds that among the "practical effects" of a belief are its "repercussions" (41) and "implied consequences of holding a given belief when conjoined with other standing beliefs" (143); crucially, the inferentialist includes among the practical effects that fix a belief's meaning its impact on the believer. The operationalist reading, by contrast, restricts an idea's "practical effects" to the "tangible effects of interactions with objects alleged to fall under a given concept" (143); the operationalist, then, holds that meaning is to be analyzed in terms of the experimental manipulation of objects. Thus the inferentialist employs a broader conception of an idea's practical effects than the operationalist. To point to a famous example (45-46), James defended the doctrine of transubstantiation on the pragmatist (by his lights) grounds that the idea of feeding on divinity satisfies our deepest psychological needs, while Peirce referred to the doctrine as "senseless jargon." Burke sums up this difference tidily; he says that the operationalist ties meaning to "how things in the world behave" while the inferentialist sees meaning as in part a matter of "how we behave in the world" (45).

Although inferentialism and operationalism look flatly opposed, and were taken as such by Peirce and James, the core of Burke's book consists in a proposed reconciliation. Burke's idea is to adopt the operationalist version of the pragmatic maxim, but then add, as a "fourth grade of clearness" (54), the inferentialist idea that clarity of thought requires systems of belief to be integrated. In order to achieve this kind of integration, each of our beliefs must be understood not only operationally, but also in inferentialist terms, that is, as elements within a well-ordered doxastic system. In order to make our ideas clear, then, we need not only to make explicit the ways in which the objects of those ideas behave and interact (Peirce's third grade of clearness), but also how our beliefs behave and interact with each other as elements of the same system or belief (the inferentialist "fourth grade" of clearness).

The suggestion is intriguing. However, difficulties loom, and in the remainder of this review I will discuss only three.

First, Burke presents his as an irenic program that provides "balance" between two "equally important aspect[s]" of pragmatism (2); he affirms that although inferentialism and operationalism are "obviously different," we "do not have to make an exclusive choice as to which is the correct version" (47), because "Both are essential" (131). Yet it should be noted that the proposed reconciliation does reject the central inferentialist commitment that a concept's meaning is exhaustively given by its inferential relations. On Burke's proposal, inferential-meaning is a kind of add-on; the fourth grade of clarity is necessary for achieving full clarity, but not sufficient. In fact, on Burke's analysis, the fourth (inferentialist) grade of clarity rides piggy-back on the third (operationalist) grade; one cannot achieve the fourth without having first achieved the third. Thus, Burke holds that the very semantic concepts that inferentialism claims are disposable or derivative are in fact necessary in order to make sense of meaning. So Burke's reconciliation will look to the inferentialist pragmatist as an unconditional surrender. That's a kind of reconciliation, I suppose.

Second, Burke rightly spends many pages explicating operationalism, and the book contains a fascinating chapter on measurement and perception, both of which aim to demonstrate that operationalism "is getting at something that is deeply rooted in our animal nature" (73), namely, that both observation and ordinary perception are "enactive" or "rooted in activity -- all the way down" (80). Burke's touchstone is James Gibson's ecological psychology (82), and he spends two chapters (6 and 7) as well as one appendix (A) laying out Gibson's framework and showing how it complements the operationalist version of the pragmatic maxim. Trouble arises though when Burke suggests that the enactivist conception of perception is a presupposition of the pragmatic maxim, and thus of clear thinking as such (80). For example, he writes, "Much of the force of the pragmatic maxim lies in the fact that animal experience (including perception) is not just rooted in action but constituted by it" (115); later, he says, "A Peircean brand of pragmatism . . . would have to acknowledge [that] . . . . perception itself is active" (129).

The worry is that Burke has confused an important result of inquiry for a presupposition of inquiry. Surely the Gibson results are themselves products of clear thinking and proper inquiry. And surely we would want to preserve the sense that claims like "animal experience (including perception) is not just rooted in action but constituted by it" (115) are hypotheses to be tested in ongoing inquiry. But if all clear thinking presupposes enactivism, then enactivism itself cannot be a subject for well-ordered inquiry. Although one would not know it from Burke's discussions, there is significant dispute among inquirers regarding the correctness of Gibson's views, and a pragmatist account of clear thinking had better be able to recognize that. Identifying a contestable theory of perception as a constitutive feature of the pragmatic maxim is ill advised.

Finally, a more general point emerges. Pragmatists have always teetered between two distinct self-conceptions. On the one hand, pragmatism is a methodological or second-order proposal only, a rule for conducting inquiry that by itself implicates no first-order substantive philosophical results. On the other, pragmatism is a distinctive philosophy, complete with its own core of first-order commitments. The history of pragmatism is largely the story of some extremely clever minds trying to navigate the tension between these two philosophical personae. Burke correctly perceives that no philosophical methodology can remain fully neutral at the first-order. James's famous image of pragmatism as the impartial "corridor" where all other intellectual projects meet and interact is chimerical. Yet Burke seems to draw too grand a lesson from James's error; he seeks to build into his conception of the pragmatic maxim entire theories of perception, experimentation, action, and even of objects themselves. Under the guise of a methodological principle, operationalist pragmatism becomes a complete philosophical system where many of the traditional first-order issues are resolved, allegedly on methodological grounds alone. This route seems no less chimerical, and moreover it is arguably disingenuous.

Many of the mid-century pragmatists that Burke criticizes in Chapter Five for being too enamored with traditional empiricism take a different, and I think more promising, strategy. They attempt to sustain a pragmatist methodology while keeping their first-order presuppositions sparse. Hence Quine's appeal to "surface irritations" and such does not, as Burke alleges, express a preference for "an ivory-tower conception of experience" (66); it rather reflects a pragmatically prudent ambition to do as much philosophy with as few elements as possible. That Quine could develop a viable naturalism from relatively meager and uncontroversial empiricist starting points is a pragmatic feature of his view, not, as Burke suggests, a bug. And I take it that this same "do-more-with-less" ambition is what motivates much of the current inferentialism. The aspiration there is clearly that of accounting for meaning and communication without having to produce a theory of reference. Burke's operationalist pragmatism, by contrast, requires such a theory, as well as a full-blown metaphysics.

That Burke's operationalism does not aspire to avoid some of what pragmatism has traditionally been in the business eliminating is by itself no criticism. But it strikes me as a significant flaw in that, although Burke frequently notes that most pragmatism has been inferentialist, he does almost nothing to explain why this is the case. In some places he suggests that inferentialism has dominated simply because operationalism has been "ignored" (63) and off the "radar screen" (56). That's no explanation. It seems plausible to say that the inferentialist reading of the pragmatic maxim has been dominant because inferentialism itself is a well-motivated program that seems an especially happy complement to traditional pragmatism's anti-metaphysical tendencies. It also seems likely that inferentialism has dominated because the operationalist alternative invites metaphysical bloat and in any case requires first-order constitutive commitments that pragmatists understandably might want to avoid. At the vey least, a more perfect book would have addressed some of the sensible motivations for inferentialism, as well as some of the philosophical costs of operationalism.

Still, What Pragmatism Was makes an important contribution to our understanding of pragmatism. Burke's prose is lucid and precise, and his scholarship is first rate. His book is to be strongly recommended to those interested in pragmatism and its history. It would also be useful as secondary reading for undergraduate and graduate classes in Pragmatism.