2014.07.25

A. J. Bartlett, Justin Clemens, and Jon Roffe

Lacan Deleuze Badiou

A. J. Bartlett, Justin Clemens, and Jon Roffe, Lacan Deleuze Badiou, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 247pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748682058.

Reviewed by Adrian Johnston, University of New Mexico


The (in)famous French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan undeniably casts a long shadow over the past several decades of Continental philosophy. Particularly thanks to two of today's most prominent European philosophers, Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek, Lacanian themes and concepts have become central points of reference throughout sizable swathes of the theoretical humanities. Just within the philosophical sub-disciplines covered by Continentalists, a proliferating variety of explicit and implicit (post-)Lacanianisms now informs reflections concerned with, among other matters, metaphysics, ethics, politics, religion, and aesthetics.

In their timely book, A.J. Bartlett, Justin Clemens, and Jon Roffe trace the influences of certain lines of Lacan's teachings on recent Continental philosophy as represented by the two French metaphysicians Gilles Deleuze and Badiou. Although Žižek is both the most influential contemporary philosophical propagator of Lacanian ideas as well as Badiou's main interlocutor, he is aggressively sidelined in this study (a move to which I will return). The sequence of names forming this book's title signals the order in which its individual chapters proceed. After the introduction, each chapter of the main body starts with Lacan's perspectives on the given content under scrutiny and then moves through Deleuze's and Badiou's treatments of these areas of interest shared between the three thinkers in question. Of course, zeroing in on this particular triad raises the larger fraught issue of the rapport between psychoanalysis (Lacan) and philosophy (Deleuze and Badiou), something directly wrestled with by the authors (and about which I will say more below in conjunction with addressing the authors' marginalization of Žižek).

Furthermore, the authors' choice of Deleuze and Badiou, both of whom unfashionably rebel against the later-twentieth-century French post-structuralist/post-modernist inclination of many of their contemporaries to declare the "end of metaphysics" or the "death of philosophy," is of a piece with their productive focus on the more metaphysical implications of Lacanian theory. This choice also allows them to explore further the divergences and convergences between Deleuze and Badiou, an exploration warranted by the exchanges between these two very different giants of post-War French metaphysics. Some of Lacan's perhaps surprising legacies are his numerous contributions, both direct and indirect, to ongoing conversations amongst Continental philosophers and their fellow travelers in other disciplines about epistemology, ontology, materialism, realism, naturalism, and the sciences. This book helpfully adds to a thorough assessment of the Lacanian and post-Lacanian dimensions of these lively discussions.

After a general introduction, the authors proceed to address four topics arguably fundamental to Lacan, Deleuze, and Badiou: "Contemporary" (on the relations between the present and the past at both individual and collective levels); "Time" (on accounts of temporalities); "Event" (on occurrences involving creation, invention, newness, novelty, rupture, and the like); and "Truth" (on both the epistemological and ontological dimensions of knowing and not knowing). In the conclusion ("Polemos"), the authors bring their study to a close by staging a debate without a clear victor between their three selected intellectual gladiators, with Lacan critiquing Deleuze and Badiou, Deleuze critiquing Lacan and Badiou, and Badiou critiquing Lacan and Deleuze. This manner of concluding prompts readers to consider how they might position themselves with respect to the unresolved, open-ended disagreements between the members of this particular triumvirate.

With three authors writing about three sophisticated, prolific thinkers in the space of just under 250 pages, the results are unsurprisingly mixed. That is to say, overall, I feel quite ambivalent about the book..

On the positive side, the book deserves reading by anyone invested in Lacan, Deleuze, Badiou, and/or recent Continental philosophy. First of all, the authors are adept at showing how and why Lacan's theories have become such important inspirations for contemporary Continentalists. The themes chosen obviously are preoccupations not only of Deleuzians or Badiouians -- across the diverse Continental philosophical landscape, the historical, the temporal, the evental, and the truthful all are major foci of attention. Hence, in illustrating what Lacan uniquely contributes to conceptualizations of these notions, Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe assist in further establishing and clarifying Lacan's larger philosophical relevance beyond just its Deleuzian and Badiouian resonances.

To be more precise, the examination of time à la Freudian and Lacanian psychoanalysis in the second main chapter is especially stimulating and satisfying. the authors convincingly demonstrate that Freud's "Copernican revolution" and Lacan's "return" to this revolutionary Freud entail depicting subjects as fundamentally structured through and through by the dynamics of various forms of temporalities. Contemporaneously with but differently from various renowned twentieth-century philosophical reckonings with time as a central problem (by Bergson, Husserl, and Heidegger, among others), Freud and Lacan transform traditional images and ideas of mindedness by re-grounding it on the foundations provided by multidimensional interrelationships between past, present, and future. Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe's reflections on these issues persuasively suggest that even such core concerns of analysis as its distinctive versions of the unconscious and sexuality rest upon recastings of temporality advanced by Freud and Lacan.

The authors put forward two more valuable contributions specifically to Lacanian scholarship in their book. The first third of their chapter on "Event" tackles what arguably is a relatively neglected matter (although, for instance, Žižek, Alenka Zupančič, Mehdi Belhaj Kacem, and I have written on this in a number of places): the links (or lack thereof) between, on the one hand, Deleuzian and Badiouian theories of the evental and, on the other hand, Lacanian analysis. Considering the amount of interest in Lacan's significance to Deleuze and Badiou, the under-exploration in the relevant bodies of literature of the metaphysics of the event in Lacan is somewhat surprising. That said, the book, building on the preceding chapter's rendition of time in psychoanalysis, achieves a fine balance in which Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe rightly emphasize the caveats, qualifications, and reservations Freudian-Lacanian analysis would attach to (primarily Badiouian) talk of the evental qua radically disruptive, unprecedented, etc. without, for all that, wrongly maintaining that analysis leaves no room whatsoever for happenings of discontinuity, change, and so on. In fact, by Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe's lights, whereas events rarely transpire for Badiou -- by contrast, Deleuze sees a single event as continually ubiquitous -- they are even rarer still for Lacan (albeit not altogether non-existent). Relatedly, and on a non-Lacanian note, I also found their unpacking of the Deleuzian idea of the event (as per Deleuze's Logic of Sense) illuminating.

The last contribution to the reception of Lacan's work that I wish to highlight here is the authors' presentation of how Lacan positions himself with respect to the natural sciences of modernity. Although this topic already has been covered extensively by other commentators on Lacan's corpus, Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe furnish an admirably lucid and insightful reconstruction of it. As they accurately portray this, Lacan consistently maintains that Freudian psychoanalysis is historically made possible by the birth of modern science in the early seventeenth century while nonetheless being distinct from and irreducible to such scientificity. More exactly, and as per the chapter on "Truth," the momentous historical revolution associated with Bacon, Galileo, and Descartes, with reverberations quickly going far beyond just the sciences and immediately adjacent academic fields, enshrines a new division between knowledge and non-knowledge. Correspondingly, modern subjects come to be split such that significant portions of themselves (particularly those bound up with what is covered by analysis under the heading of "libidinal economy") are excluded from participating in any way in the recognized realms of the known and acknowledged. Analysis, predicated upon this science-induced splitting of subjectivity, treats the remainders, the leftover scraps, of (post-)modern psyches: what is or appears to be idiosyncratic, irrational, nonsensical, senseless, unreasonable, and so on (i.e., desires, drives, fantasies, and everything psychopathologized). Freudian-Lacanian analysis thus can be viewed as the science of non-science, the knowledge of non-knowledge.

Having noted what I consider to be its strongest aspects, it now is time for the bad news, namely, a survey of what I contend are the weaknesses of this book. To begin with, and as I already hinted earlier when admitting to my ambivalence, the authors perhaps bite off more than can be chewed adequately in a space of under 300 pages (or even, for that matter, a much longer book). They spread themselves too thinly over three prolific figures about whom much has been (and continues to be) written. One consequence of this is that the book lacks a unifying, focused line of argumentation. Instead, what the authors offer is merely an amalgamation of interpretations of and remarks upon selections from the oeuvres of Lacan, Deleuze, and Badiou.

Secondly, I worry that the book is in danger of simultaneously disappointing both experts and non-experts. On the one hand (and connected with my previous criticism), The coverage of their three subjects too quickly sweeps across a diverse assortment of topics to be deeply satisfying to seasoned scholars well-versed in things Lacanian, Deleuzian, and/or Badiouian; experts almost certainly will find the selective skimming of themes and absence of substantial engagement with arguments in the secondary literature on these thinkers frustrating. On the other hand,the book nonetheless still manages to carry on too technical a conversation between and addressed to insiders already initiated into Lacan's, Deleuze's, and Badiou's discourses to be of much assistance to novices and students seeking accessible introductions to these theorists; non-experts probably will become confused and irritated by the sizable quantity of unexplained jargon frequently employed. Apropos this last observation, even professional specialists in French/Continental philosophy likely will be put off by the excess of under-clarified technical terminology peppered throughout this book. Both these and other faults to be enumerated below make the book's introduction and first chapter in particular rather tedious. This risks various types of readers simply putting down the book before making it very far, which would be unfortunate given that, as I spelled out above, its main body, starting with the chapter on time, has some quite worthwhile content.

At this juncture, I feel it important to expand upon something I noted in the prior paragraph: the ignoring of the vast bulk of extant scholarship on Lacan, Deleuze, and Badiou. Of course, this neglect, in and of itself, is tantamount to a failure to credit the past labor of others in the exegetical elucidation and critical consideration of the thinkers in question. However, the problem here goes deeper than being solely the ethical lapse of irresponsibly refusing intellectually to recognize larger scholarly communities' accumulated contributions. In fact, the authors's silences as regards the wider receptions past and present of Lacan's, Deleuze's, and Badiou's bodies of thought generate serious questions and doubts about the defensibility of some of their philosophical/theoretical claims and arguments.

A case in point, one I mentioned early on in this review, is the authors' deliberate exclusion of Žižeks -- and this despite Žižek's glaringly obvious centrality to the terrain surveyed. At root, this exclusion is based upon the authors' having embraced as axiomatic Badiou's handling of Lacan as an "anti-philosopher." For Badiou, psychoanalysis in general is an "anti-philosophy" in his specific, distinctive sense. Also, as I will touch upon again shortly, the final phase of Lacan's teaching contains two hardly transparent and unambiguous self-identifications as an anti-philosopher (from 1975 and 1980). That said, the authors, simply taking for granted the accuracy of this Badiouian perspective on Lacan, then charge Žižek with crudely collapsing (Lacanian) psychoanalysis into (German idealist) philosophy. Žižek's alleged wholesale conflation of the analytic with the philosophical therefore purportedly licenses him being relegated to a small handful of footnotes. Considering that Badiou himself sees sustained engagements with ostensible anti-philosophers to be crucial and invigorating for philosophy itself (a view supported by his recurrent thoughtful discussions of those he groups under the heading of anti-philosophy, such as, for example, Saint Paul, Pascal, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, and Lacan), entirely writing off Žižek for his non-Badiouian sin of anti-philosophically blurring the boundaries between analysis and philosophy is itself arguably non-Badiouian. And, whether or not Žižek actually does ride complete roughshod over the differences between analysis and philosophy is itself open to debate and in need of interpretive substantiations not provided in this book.

These problems and controversies having to do with Lacan, Badiou, Žižek, and the relations between psychoanalysis and philosophy have been scrutinized at length and in detail by numerous others elsewhere (for instance, Bruno Bosteels, Lorenzo Chiesa, Mladen Dolar, Jonathan Lear, Jean-Claude Milner, François Regnault, Colette Soler, Zupančič, and myself. These unmentioned conversations, in which Badiou and Žižek themselves are participants (and also direct interlocutors with respect to each other), have raised a plethora of important questions that the book neither asks nor answers, including: How are the later Lacan's two brief, enigmatic invocations of "anti-philosophy" to be understood when placed within the bigger picture of his well-known, career-constant appeals to philosophy and philosophers (as well as positive invocations of things philosophical contemporaneous with his occasional talk of the anti-philosophical)? What particular philosophies are here covertly determining the use of the (falsely) universal word "philosophy" being negated with an "anti-?" How historically conditioned or not are the Lacanian and Badiouian distinctions between philosophy and anti-philosophy? Does Badiou's philosophical system perhaps rest, at least in part, on gestures that, were he to be fully consistent with all of his assertions, would themselves qualify as anti-philosophical by his own criteria? More broadly, is psychoanalysis wholly and completely different-in-kind from philosophy? Along these broader lines, how anti-philosophical, if at all, are the non-empirical (even, arguably, transcendental in relation to the fields of clinical analytic experience) dimensions of analysis as epitomized by the core components of its metapsychological frameworks? Are there not, as many investigators have carefully labored to demonstrate over the course of decades, profound, indisputable threads of continuity (ones regularly remarked upon by Lacan himself) between the history of Western philosophy (especially German idealism) and Freud's and Lacan's theories of mindedness and subjectivity?

The authors do little by way of seriously responding to these pivotal queries raised in still-unfolding discussions to which they make barely any references. These lacunae reduce a number of their propositions to the status of unargued-for dogmatic pronouncements, such as statements targeting Žižek as well as those about the intricate interconnections between psychoanalysis, philosophy, and science. In this same vein, the authors exhibit a tendency to assume as self-evidently correct multiple contentious stances struck by both Deleuze and Badiou. Their just-glossed appropriations of a certain notion of anti-philosophy is an example of their Badiouian dogmatism. Indeed, their dogmatic tendencies are most pronounced with respect to Badiou, as evinced by the facts that Badiou always gets the last word in their chapters and that their jargon is at its worst when they are parsing Badiou's thought.

Similarly, their Hegel bashing merely parrots Deleuze's anti-Hegelian polemics, which are themselves rather unoriginal when set within the wider history of the critical reception of Hegel's philosophy from the 1830s through the present. They frequently rely upon the presumed justness of Deleuzian anti-Hegelianism, repeatedly trotting out a straw-man Hegel when it suits their purposes. The veritable mountains of primary and secondary literature by and on Hegel and the German idealists up through today, much of which sharply undermines and rebuts the sorts of post-war French caricatures echoed here, receives no acknowledgment whatsoever. This neglect again negatively impacts many of their assertions about (anti-)philosophy, analysis, Žižek(ianism), and the like. Their preaching to the choir will convince only those already converted.

My final complaint has to do with a tone sometimes accompanying the straw-manning of opponents, such as Hegel and Žižek. The dismissals of adversaries often come across as bordering on being outright disrespectful. One detects the whiff of an insular in-crowd atmosphere in which outsiders, when not altogether shunned in silence, are curtly rejected instead of being considerately refuted with solid textual scholarship and theoretical argumentation. What is more, if the authors fill any or all of the gaps in scholarship and argumentation I have flagged in this review in their earlier publications, they do not bother in this book itself to summarize how they do so.

These weaknesses are not insignificant shortcomings. Nonetheless, I still consider Bartlett, Clemens, and Roffe's book well worth struggling with for those interested in one or more of the figures dealt with. In particular, I think the authors succeed at advancing insightful extensions to an appreciation of Lacan's enduring relevance to Continental metaphysics. Such contributions call for a careful reading of this book.