2014.07.30

Dominic Gregory

Showing, Sensing, and Seeming: Distinctively Sensory Representations and Their Contents

Dominic Gregory, Showing, Sensing, and Seeming: Distinctively Sensory Representations and Their Contents, Oxford University Press, 2013, 230pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199653737.

Reviewed by Angela Mendelovici, University of Western Ontario


In this book, Dominic Gregory's aim is to provide a theory of the contents of distinctively sensory representations. The introduction and Chapters 1-4 provide the basic theory, while Chapters 5-8 discuss applications. This review focuses on the theory.

Gregory's target is distinctively sensory representations (DSRs), which are representations that, as he puts it, show things as looking, sounding, or, more generally, "sensorily standing" a certain way. What it is to sensorily stand a certain way is best introduced with the help of examples. A visual mental image of a table shows the table as looking brown and shiny, but it does not, all on its own, show the complete history of the materials out of which the table is made. Likewise, auditory mental images show things as sounding a certain way, and gustatory mental images show things as tasting a certain way. More generally, representations that are "bound" to a sensory modality in the way that visual mental images are bound to vision show things as sensorily standing a certain way. These are DSRs.

DSRs have distinctively sensory contents (DSCs), contents that derive from the ways they show things as sensorily standing. For example, if a visual mental image of a table represents the table as brown, and this content derives from the way that the mental image shows things as looking, then the content is a DSC. Whether higher-level contents, such as the property of being a table, are also DSCs is left an open question (see p. 8). DSRs can also have various other contents. For example, a historical painting might represent a particular historical event in its historical context, but this content does not derive from how it shows things as sensorily standing, so it is not a DSC.

One might wonder whether DSRs form a unified class. They include both mental and non-mental representations, and both intrinsic and derived representations. Though they include mental imagery, they exclude perceptual experiences, which many would consider to be mental representations. Gregory claims that the unity of the class of DSRs is "plausible enough at first glance" (p. 5). In chapter 1 he identifies three superficial similarities between DSRs, which are also taken to be prime examples of a theory of DSCs' explananda. In chapter 3 he aims to uncover the deep underlying similarity unifying the members of the class of DSRs, which also explains the three superficial similarities.

The three superficial similarities of DSRs Gregory describes in Chapter 1 are:

(Perspectivalness) DSRs bound to sensory modalities that are perspectival, in that they present items from a particular perspective, are themselves perspectival, in that they show items from a particular perspective. For example, just as vision is perspectival in that we seem to see items from particular perspectives (e.g., we might seem to see a person from the front), DSRs bound to vision are also perspectival (e.g., a portrait of a person might show the person from the front).

(Sensibilia) DSRs can only show what we can apparently encounter with the sensory modalities that they are bound to. For example, visual mental imagery can only show objects and properties that one can seem to see.

(Relative Specificity) Sensory experiences are relatively specific when it is the case that if they involve an apparent encounter with something having a general property (e.g., that of being blue), they involve an apparent encounter with something having a more specific property of that general type (e.g., that of being blue421); DSRs bound to sensory modalities that are relatively specific are themselves relatively specific in that when it is the case that they show something as having a general property, they show it as having a more specific property of that general type.

One might question these three alleged features of DSRs. For instance, she might deny (Relative Specificity). While we can't apparently see an object as blue without apparently seeing it as some specific shade of blue, it is not clear that we cannot imagine an object as blue without imagining it as some specific shade of blue. Likewise, we can visually imagine objects of non-specific sizes, auditorily imagine sounds of non-specific loudness coming from non-specific directions, and tactilely imagine objects of non-specific temperatures and textures, even though it seems we cannot have the corresponding sensory experiences.[1]

In the first chapter, Gregory also introduces a distinction between subjective and objective DSRs. Subjective DSRs represent sensations. For example, a mental image of a table might portray the sensations of a subject seeming to see a table. Objective DSRs do not represent sensations. For example, a playback of an auditory recording might show how an event sounds without representing the event as being heard by anyone. Both objective and subjective DSRs show things as sensorily standing a certain way, but they do so by employing "distinct modes of showing" (p. 22). Indeed, two DSRs might show things as sensorily standing the same way, but one might be subjective while the other is objective. Along with explaining the three above-mentioned features of DSRs, a theory of DSCs should explain how there can be both subjective and objective DSRs, and what are the distinct modes of showing associated with each.

Chapter 2 provides some background required for Chapter 3's account of DSCs. Most importantly, Gregory offers an account of perspectives and of what it is for things to sensorily stand a certain way from a perspective. Perspectives are bundles of contextual factors relative to which the contents of sensation-types, which are types of sensations present in sensory episodes (e.g., visual experiences, auditory experiences), are true or false. The basic idea is that sensation-types have contents (e.g., there is a blue square to the left of a red triangle), and these contents can be true or false in different contexts. Perspectives are bundles of such contextual features.

What is it, then, for things to sensorily stand a certain way from a certain perspective? Ways of sensorily standing from a perspective are sensation-types whose contents are true relative to that perspective. Relatedly, ways of standing sensorily are identified with sensation-types.

In Chapter 3, Gregory provides a theory of the DSCs of DSRs. Recall that DSRs don't just represent things as standing sensorily in certain ways; they "show" things as standing sensorily in certain ways. But what is it to show, rather than to merely represent? Gregory claims that showing is a matter of representing in a way that is subjectively informative: it allows one to grasp what it is like to have a sensation in which things sensorily stand a certain way. For example, viewing a picture of a person allows one to grasp what it is like to have a sensation in which things look a certain way; its content is subjectively informative. In contrast, a description like "the way the picture in this sealed envelope shows things as looking" might single out the same sensation-types, but not in a way that is subjectively informative; the description does not allow one to grasp what it is like to have those sensations. DSCs, then, are contents that single out sensation-types in subjectively informative ways. DSRs show, rather than merely represent, things as standing sensorily in certain ways because they have DSCs.

In addition to showing things as standing sensorily in certain ways, Gregory's account allows that DSRs show us tables, chairs, etc., but that they only do so derivatively: they show such items by showing things as sensorily standing certain ways, i.e., by singling out types of sensations in subjectively informative ways. Gregory calls these derivative showings scene-showings. They show, rather than merely represent, items and scenes in that they present them in an especially sensory fashion. Which scene-showings does a DSR scene-show? DSRs that show a certain sensation-type show the scene-showings that anyone having sensations of that type thereby "seems sensorily to encounter." (p. 52) In other words, DSRs single out sensation-types, which have certain contents. In virtue of this, DSRs scene-show those contents.

Chapter 3 also presents an account of the contents of subjective and objective DSRs. Subjective DSRs are sensation-characterizing: their contents single out sensation-types in a subjectively informative manner and "characterize one or more sensations as being instances of those sensation-types." (p. 54) Objective DSRs, on the other hand, are perspective-characterizing: their contents single out sensation-types in a subjectively informative manner and characterize the contents of those sensation-types as being true relative to some perspectives. In other words, both subjective and objective DSRs single out sensation-types in a subjectively informative manner, but they differ in their additional contents: subjective DSRs additionally characterize a sensation as being an instance of those sensation-types, while objective DSRs additionally characterize the contents of the sensation-types as being true relative to some perspectives.

Gregory devotes a large part of Chapter 3 to showing how the above-mentioned account of DSCs fulfills the explanatory goals set out in Chapter 1. One such goal is to explain the three superficial features of DSRs. Recall that the three superficial features pertain to the relationship between sensory episodes and DSRs. Certain features of sensory episodes (their perspectivalness, the contents they can represent, and their relative specificity) are mirrored in DSRs. The explanation of these, and potentially many other, commonalities between sensory episodes and DSRs is explained roughly as follows: DSRs single out sensation-types in subjectively informative ways, and thereby scene-show the scenes that are, as Gregory puts it, apparently encountered in sensory episodes in which we have sensations of the relevant types. Thus, DSRs can only scene-show scenes that can be apparently encountered in the sensory modalities to which they are bound. Any constraints that apply to what is apparently encountered in a given modality will be inherited by DSRs bound to that modality. For example, visual DSRs show visual sensation-types, and thereby scene-show the scenes that are apparently encountered in visual episodes in which we have those sensation-types. So, visual DSRs can only scene-show the scenes that are apparently encountered in vision. Since the scenes apparently encountered in vision are, for instance, perspectival, so too are the scenes that can be shown by visual DSRs.

Another explanatory goal is to explain how there can be both subjective and objective DSRs, and to account for the distinct modes of showing associated with each. According to Gregory's theory, both subjective and objective DSRs single out sensation-types in subjectively informative ways. But these sensation-types are put to different uses: subjective DSRs characterize visual sensations as being instances of these sensation-types, while objective DSRs characterize the contents of the sensation-types as being true relative to some perspectives.

Chapter 4 explores and expands upon various aspects of the theory. The remaining chapters discuss applications of the theory to debates on mental images, pictures, and distinctively sensory records. The discussion is insightful and interesting, even for those who do not agree with the theory itself.

Gregory's theory of DSRs is interesting and deserves careful attention, but one might take issue with some of its core tenets and assumptions. His starting point is that DSRs show things as sensorily standing in certain ways. While this in itself seems unobjectionable, his identification of ways things stand sensorily with singling out types of sensations in a subjectively informative way leads to what some might take to be an implausible view of objective DSRs. On Gregory's view, all DSRs, including objective DSRs, involve sensation-types as parts of their contents. Of course, unlike subjective DSRs, objective DSRs also represent how things are relative to a perspective. But they still in some sense represent sensation-types. This gives rise to an objection: many pictures, visual images, auditory recordings, and many other DSRs don't represent sensation-types at all. Instead, they just represent how things are (perhaps from a perspective), in much the same way that sensory experiences (seeings, hearings, etc.) represent how things are. For example, a visual mental image of a table doesn't represent how a table looks, but rather, how it is, e.g., that it is brown, shiny, at a certain location relative to a perspective, and perhaps even that it is a table.

One of the virtues of Gregory's account is that, on it, objective and subjective DSRs have part of their contents in common, and one might wonder if the alternative account has a similar virtue. It does if we pair it with an account of subjective DSRs on which they represent sensations (or experiences) that represent how things are. On the resulting view, both objective and subjective DSRs involve the representation of how things are, but, in the case of subjective DSRs, these contents occur embedded in more complex contents singling out sensations with the relevant contents. An objective DSR represents a content C, while a corresponding subjective DSR represents a sensation with the content C.

This alternative account also has the resources required to make sense of commonalities between DSRs and sensory episodes, Gregory's main explanandum. It is quite plausible that sensory episodes represent how things are, so both objective and subjective DSRs involve some of the same contents as sensory episodes. On this account, the distinction between sensory episodes and DSRs is less deep than Gregory maintains. While on Gregory's account, DSRs differ from sensory episodes in that sensory episodes represent how things are (independently of sensations) while DSRs represent sensations that represent how things are, on this alternative account, both DSRs and sensory episodes represent how things are.

One might complain that this alternative account owes us an explanation of the difference between DSRs and sensory episodes. We might say that some DSRs differ from sensory episodes in that they merely derivatively represent, while sensory episodes have intrinsic intentionality. For instance, pictures and playbacks of auditory recordings only represent because of their relationship to our intrinsically intentional mental states, which represent in the first instance, all on their own. But some DSRs, such as mental images, have intrinsic intentionality, and one might wonder how they differ from sensory episodes. I suggested above that some of the alleged similarities between DSRs might be denied. In particular, (Relative Specificity) might be denied. One might suggest that this difference in specificity points to one of the key differences between sensory episodes and mental images: mental images, though much like sensory episodes, lack many of the details and the degree of specificity found in sensory episodes. For instance, mental images, but not sensory episodes, can represent something as being blue without representing it as being some particular shade of blue.

If all this is right, then DSRs do not form such a unified kind after all. DSRs differ from one another in deep and important ways, and some are quite similar to sensory episodes. This does not mean DSRs do not form an appropriate target of theorizing, but it does suggest that the category may not be as useful as we might have thought when it comes to theorizing about representations and the mind more generally.

Something like this alternative view, though not clearly articulated as a theory of DSRs in the existing literature, is arguably one of the main alternatives to a theory like Gregory's. The potential merits of Gregory's theory lie both in its intuitive appeal and its explanatory power. For this reason, it would have been interesting to see what Gregory thinks of this kind of alternative view and why we should reject it, particularly since, to some, it might seem quite intuitively appealing and, on the face of it, it appears to have the explanatory resources required to do much of the work Gregory requires of a theory of DSRs.

Overall, this book is rich and original. It is hard-going and its terminological choices require careful attention, but Gregory helpfully provides extensive roadmapping and is reflective about his methodology. His book is likely to be of interest to anyone working on perception, mental imagery, and non-mental representations of a distinctively sensory sort.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENT

Many thanks to Dominic Gregory and David Bourget for helpful comments on this review.


[1] In a recent review of Showing, Sensing, and Seeming, Jennifer Corns (The Philosophical Quarterly, 2014) calls into question (Relative Specificity) on much the same grounds. She also raises doubts with (Sensibilia). One might also question (Perspectivalness). For instance, even though audition is perspectival in that it presents sounds from certain perspectives, it is not clear that all DSRs tied to audition are perspectival. One can imagine sounds, e.g., in inner speech, that do not come from any particular direction.