John V. Kulvicki


John V. Kulvicki, Images, Routledge, 2014, 221pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415557016.

Reviewed by Paloma Atencia-Linares, University of Kent

John V. Kulvicki's Images ((not to be confused with his previous On Images, Oxford University Press, 2006) is a comprehensive introduction to the philosophy of imagistic representations. Kulvicki provides a splendid critical introductory overview of recent philosophical accounts of pictorial representation, the majority of which have been developed within the framework of the philosophy of art. He also introduces a new line of research that extends to other philosophical sub-disciplines and is broader in scope than that of pictorial representation, namely, the philosophy of images.  Kulvicki aims to convince the reader that the more comprehensive category of images, apart from that of pictures, is worth considering from a philosophical point of view. He also proposes a view of the nature of images that accounts not only for pictorial representation but for other non-pictorial but still imagistic representations such as (scientific) diagrams, graphs, tables, and also for mental and non-visual images (e.g., auditory or tactile images).

As an introduction to contemporary theories of depiction, Kulvicki's book is extremely appealing. He guides the reader through a wide variety of views on pictorial representation, presenting not only the most prominent theories and authors, but also various other views that are frequently neglected. Kulvicki classifies these views into five different groups that he discusses in each of the first five chapters: experience theories (Richard Wollheim, Paul Ziff, Michael Polanyi, Lambert Wiesling, Reinhard Niederée and Dieter Heyer), recognition theories (Flint Schier, Dominic Lopes, Karen Neander, Crispin Sartwell and Michael Newall), resemblance theories (John Hyman, Robert Hopkins, Catharine Abell), pretense (Kendall Walton and to some extent Ernst Gombrich), and structural accounts (Nelson Goodman and Kulvicki). Some of the groupings might look awkward at first, e.g., Why are Hopkins' and Newall's theories not discussed in the chapter on experience? Why is Abell's view presented as a resemblance theory? Is Kulvicki's own structural theory not, after all, a resemblance theory?

Kulvicki, however, is careful to explain why he includes each theory in each group, and he is also clear about the overlaps and compatibilities between groups and theories. His account of the different views is by no means exhaustive. In many cases the particular views of some authors are only outlined, and there is no mention of fundamental details of some theories. For example, there is no mention of the notion of 'standard of correctness' and the important role it plays in experiential theories such as Wollheim's or Hopkins', or the fact that the criterion of recognition is only necessary but not sufficient for determining what a picture depicts in recognition theories. This, however, is not a serious objection since Kulvicki's aim is only to provide a general overview of the field and the basic ideas behind each view. The reader will not therefore get a detailed summary of each theory, but she will certainly be able to form a very clear and comprehensive map of the philosophical discussion on pictorial representation, the main ideas driving the different groups of theories, a balanced and lucid account of their advantages and limitations, and a very good grasp of the compatibilities and conflicts between them. This, in and of itself, is an excellent and much needed contribution. Indeed, it is a good reason to read the book and have it on your shelf.

As I mentioned above, the book has broader ambitions. In chapter 5, apart from presenting his own favoured view of pictorial representation -- a structural account in which resemblance plays a central role -- Kulvicki claims that the general framework of the theory allows us to account for a wide range of images (including non-visual images) and not only for pictorial representation. In chapters 7 and 8, he illustrates this by showing how the structural account he proposes is in line with prominent views on the nature of scientific and mental images respectively.

The general idea is that what is common to all imagistic representation -- and what distinguishes them from 'arbitrary pairings' -- is that images preserve the structure of what they represent and, in doing so, they present things to us. This preservation of structure is cashed out in terms of isomorphism, resemblance and transparency depending on whether the images are diagrammatic, non-pictorial, or pictorial. In pictorial systems, Kulvicki claims, the preservation of structure amounts to being transparent in the following sense: if P1 is an accurate picture of another picture P, within the same system of representation, P1 is syntactically identical to P. That is, P1 preserves and manifests identical bare-bones content: identical patterns of lines, colours, shadows and any other feature that plays a role in making the picture depict what it does. Now, there are images, paradigmatic examples of which are fMRIs, radar images of weather, or temperature maps that are not transparent in this sense: a radar image of a radar image does not deliver a syntactically identical radar image to the original one. However, although they do not preserve all the features of their bare-bones contents, they still resemble the objects they represent. Kulvicki calls these images non-pictorial. Both pictorial and non-pictorial systems are isomorphic in some sense, but there are other images that are merely isomorphic without resembling their objects or being transparent. They are merely isomorphic in the sense that we can find 'relations between qualities of the representation[s] that mirror relations between qualities of what [they] represent' (p. 105). Examples of these images are diagrams, graphs, charts, tables and maybe also some mental states: they all preserve (and manifest) the structure of their objects at a more abstract level.

This general proposal, it seems to me, has at least two problems. On the one hand, as an account of pictorial representation, the structural view appears too narrow: the criterion of transparency, at least as explained in this book, seems to rule out many representational systems we would intuitively call pictorial. Take the case of caricatures. Intuitively, caricature is a pictorial system of representation that distorts, exaggerates or simplifies the characteristic features of the individuals they represent. However, a caricature of a caricature -- if one stays within the same system of representation -- is not likely to be syntactically identical to the original caricature. On the contrary, we would expect the syntactic features to be even more stylised in order to show an exaggerated or distorted version of an already distorted depiction of a given subject. A similar outcome would be expected with pictures of pictures in the style of, say, Van Gogh or in a certain expressionistic genre: if the picture of the original picture is within the same system of representation -- i.e., if it follows the style or technique of depicting a certain subject matter -- the resulting picture would presumably have a more dynamic look in the case of the Van Gogh-style picture, or even more angular forms in the case of the expressionist style. (Just imagine, for example, a Van Gogh- or an expressionist-style filter in Photoshop applied two or three consecutive times over an image). The same reasoning applies to the case of certain styles of photographs that are the product of a system specifically designed to distort the appearance of the subjects, such as the ones produced by Weegee (the photographer Arthur Fellig). Again, presumably in this photographic system, photographs of photographs will not deliver a syntactically identical image, and yet, we intuitively consider them pictorial. Kulvicki may choose to deny this. He may reply that caricatures, certain styles of painting or Weegee-style photography are not really pictorial, since they only resemble their objects but are not transparent in his sense. This is what he claims, for instance, in the case of Goodman's complementary colour photography system (p. 104). Such a reply, however, strikes me as counterintuitive and revisionary.

Now, if as an account of pictorial representation Kulvicki's proposal is too narrow, as a general theory of images, the view might be too broad. Isomorphism, understood in the liberal sense described in this book, is a notion that seems to capture a broader extension of representations than those that are merely imagistic. Thermometers, as Kulvicki himself mentions (p. 104), are (or can be in some general sense) isomorphic systems of representation, as are abaci or sand timers, but it is not entirely obvious that they can be considered 'images'. In fact, certain sculptures -- classic Greek sculptures, for instance -- can be said to be not only isomorphic but also transparent in Kulvicki's sense: a classic sculpture of a classic sculpture, in the same system of representation, results in a syntactically identical representation. But again, while, say, 3-D holograms fall intuitively within the realm of images, sculptures do not fit so easily in that category, let alone in the category of pictures.

All this suggests that Kulvicki's proposal might be closer to a general theory of (non-arbitrary) representation than to a theory of images, although one might suspect that even as a more comprehensive theory of representation, it is still too broad. Clones (biological or cybernetic), for instance, preserve the (genetic, hardware or software) structure of the original organism/artifact, but that does not make a clone a representation of the organism or artifact. Similarly, substances like sodium nitrate and calcium sulphate are said to be isomorphic since they share the same crystal structure, yet neither of them represents the other. In other words, isomorphism might be an interesting feature of images, but it is not restricted to them or to representations more generally. Hence, it is not clear how this notion can help to characterise, let alone individuate, the domain Kulvicki is trying to capture.

Apart from the notions of isomorphism, resemblance and transparency -- which combine syntactic and semantic features -- Kulvicki mentions other purely structural and purely semantic features that are also meant to play a role in distinguishing the realm of images from other arbitrary representations. These features that Kulvicki adapts from Goodman (1968) are repleteness, syntactic sensitivity and semantic richness. Very roughly, repleteness refers to the amount of (syntactic) features that matter for representing whatever is represented, syntactic sensitivity tracks the degree of variations in the syntactic features of a representational system that suffice for a change in its syntactic identity, and semantic richness captures relation between all the possible representational contents and the availability of syntactic kinds within a representational system. Now, although these features combined with transparency can, in principle, individuate pictorial representations, it is not clear how they can help to distinguish the domain of images from other kinds of representations. Kulvicki is explicit in saying that most representational systems (including linguistic and numerical representations) are semantically rich (p. 98), and although pictorial and non-pictorial systems are relatively replete and syntactically sensitive, diagrams, charts and tables may have the same low sensitivity and repleteness as linguistic or numerical representations. If this is so, isomorphism would be the only feature left to capture what distinguishes the domain of images from other representational systems. But, as I said before, without a more substantial notion of isomorphism it is difficult to see how to rule out many other representations and non-representations from the relevant domain.

To be sure, this book is only meant to be an introduction to -- or an invitation to consider -- a relatively new line of research, and so it is not reasonable to expect to find an exhaustive and detailed theory of images that clarifies or fills the gaps that I have pointed out. However, my impression is that, although the reader might be persuaded at first of the worthiness of the project of developing a philosophy of images, the level of generality of the proposal may leave her a bit sceptical about the viability of the project.

The book has a chapter on pictorial realism (chapter 6) and one on photography and object perception (chapter 9); each can be read independently of the main lines of argument. Chapter 9 is a summary of the debate over whether or not it is possible to (literally) see objects through photographic images. Unlike other theories of depiction (e.g., Walton's, Wollheim's or Hopkins'), Kulvicki's structural theory of depiction has nothing specific to say about the case of photographs. Hence, it is not surprising not to find a contribution to this debate in line with the structural theory. However, the chapter does provide a particularly lucid and helpful overview of the different positions available, and it connects well with the previous chapter on mental images. Chapter 6, on the other hand, is an excellent analysis of the issue of pictorial realism. It convincingly argues that in order to understand this topic we need to distinguish between three different types of realism: content realism -- which is related to the amount of detail and informativeness of the picture, but has nothing to do with accuracy; manner realism -- which involves a comparison with the depicted object and, to that extent, does indeed take accuracy into account; and, kind realism -- which 'focuses on whether the representation . . . is part of an exemplary system of pictorial representation' (p.129).

In sum, this book provides an excellent critical overview of contemporary theories of pictorial representation. But it is also an ambitious attempt to provide the foundations of an account of a broader domain of images. The book's level of generality or its introductory character may not help to achieve this latter goal as successfully and convincingly as possible, but it certainly leaves the reader interested in the project and wanting to revisit both Kulvicki's previous book and the literature on scientific and mental representation. Images is a very good example of how different areas of philosophy can interact and enrich one another.