2014.08.12

J. M. Fritzman

Hegel

J. M. Fritzman, Hegel, Polity, 2014, 185pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745647258.

Reviewed by Ansgar Lyssy, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


Of all the introductions to Hegel, J. M. Fritzman's is perhaps the most accessible one to date. It is written specifically for students with little to no knowledge of post-Kantian philosophy and succeeds not only in elucidating a great deal of Hegel's notoriously obscure ideas, but also in explaining why they are still relevant today. This introduction will leave beginning students of Hegel well equipped to understand Hegel's aims and methods, arguments and failures, all the while giving them the resources they will need to be able competently to put them into a historically broad context, sophisticatedly to relate them to one another, and occasionally even to place them in contact with contemporary debates.

Although Fritzman's introduction, a recent addition to a series of introductions to 'classic thinkers' by Polity Press, is organized around Hegel's books and lectures, it immediately starts out with an informative and succinct overview of their overall systematic coherence by emphasizing the intimate connection existing among Hegel's different writings. It is divided into nine chapters: an "Introduction," a chapter entitled "Hegel's Life and Influences," and six chapters devoted to one or more of Hegel's major works, each serving as an useful first encounter with: the Phenomenology of Spirit, the Science of Logic, the Philosophy of Nature and Philosophy of Spirit taken together, the Philosophy of Right, the Philosophy of History, and the Lectures on Philosophy and Religion. The book concludes with a brief chapter "After Hegel."

This overall focus on Hegel's major works is well chosen. The two preliminary chapters give a clear and convincing account of why Hegel's different writings are not to be understood as separate projects, but as parts of a more fundamental intellectual endeavour, which itself should also be placed within the greater context of the theoretical concerns of German Idealism. The final chapter nicely supplements this approach by situating Hegel into a larger historical horizon. While some other introductions offer a specific interpretation of Hegel's system and its structure, Fritzman tries as much as possible to minimize any intrusive interpretative element and aims instead at preparing the reader for her or his own engagement with Hegel's writings. He succeeds in the task of diplomatically balancing various leading interpretations remarkably well, given the obvious difficulties and limits of any such attempt at offering a textually 'neutral' take on Hegel.

One central aspect of Hegel's philosophy, as Fritzman points out on multiple occasions, is that of reconciliation: we are not alienated from nature or society, and it is the task of philosophy to demonstrate we can always find ourselves "at home" in both of them. This aspect of Hegel's philosophy has been forcefully argued by Michael Hardimon, and its importance remains largely undisputed in contemporary Hegel studies. Nevertheless, I found that this crucial aspect would have been developed much more clearly if Fritzman had elaborated on the need for reconciliation that necessarily drives it. Reconciliation surely presupposes alienation of some kind for the project to take on meaning, but why would we think that we are alienated from nature or society in the first place?

As Fritzman rightly underlines, philosophical reconciliation emphasizes rationality, and this means, for Hegel, that it takes place by means of dialectical reasoning, that is, the process of justifying categories and concepts within their logical and historical context. Fritzman's introduction consists of a summary account of Hegelian dialectics that is concise and lucid.  It provides a robust understanding of why Hegel's philosophy should be understood as an exposition of historical genealogies and logical-systematic structures at the same time. We thus get a good picture of the two sides of Hegel, namely, as a system-builder and a diagnostician of his time. These two aspects are in turn reflected within Hegel's philosophy for Fritzmann: individual knowledge depends on criteria for knowledge given within a society (which here signifies a historically grown epistemic context) whereby humanity itself can be said to have a richer knowledge than any individual insofar as the individual as a cognitive agent participates in something greater than itself. We encounter, in other words, Hegel's idea of a communal spirit, which unfolds itself.

The next chapter, "Hegel's Life and Influences", mostly deals with the philosophical influences on the Hegelian system -- or rather, with an array of positions that Hegel can be meaningfully contrasted or compared with in the tradition -- ranging from Parmenides to Schelling in diversity and historical breadth. Perhaps most noteworthy is Fritzman's extended and even refreshing discussion of ancient philosophy. This kind of discussion is not found in many other introductions, which all too often only present Hegel's dialectics as an answer to the epistemological problems incited by Kant and neglect the broader reach of his philosophy.

The remainding chapters focus on Hegel's published writings and lectures. Far from being mere summaries, each contains a brief guideline to help the reader see how Hegel's arguments are structured, how we can understand the context that motivates them, the general aim and scope of the respective part of Hegel's system they deal with, and what major alternative interpretations have been proposed in the secondary literature. The most remarkable trait of the book becomes most transparent in these chapters: how well Fritzman succeeds in stating the main points of Hegel's philosophy without overtly using Hegel's own idiosyncratic language. This permits Fritzman to deliver a concise, but faithful explanation of Hegel's main points, rather than merely rehashing Hegel in his own terms -- speaking "Hegelese," as Fritzman calls it (p. 50).

Spanning more than 40 pages, the chapter on the Phenomenology of Spirit can be easily considered the core of the book. Fritzman first introduces an array of core concepts, the "basic Hegelian concepts" as it were, such as Hegel's understanding of philosophy itself, dialectics, truth, reason, spirit, and celebrated passages such as the master-slave dialectic. After doing so, he follows the general structure of the Phenomenology, proceeding from consciousness to self-consciousness, reason, and ultimately spirit. He follows Michael Forster's interpretation that we should understand the Phenomenology as three different perspectives on the history of Western thought: individual shapes of consciousness, the social contexts that make them possible, and the Absolute. The common denominator in these perspectives is that knowledge itself is determined as such only within a specific context, which develops in historical but nevertheless systematic ways. This is not a "prospective" story that accounts for distinct moments of development in time, but rather a "retrospective" one that displays how the different moments of the whole are necessary for the whole to exist.

The chapter on Hegel's Logic treats the first part of the Encyclopedia and the Science of Logic as one. Once again, before jumping into the details of the main sections, Fritzman deals with the general aim and philosophical scope of Hegel's logic, including a discussion of the different competing interpretations of the logic as an idealist theory of categories or a variation upon a realist metaphysics. He contends that we should read the logic as both, just as we should similarly understand it as simultaneously an empirical psychology and a normative epistemology. Fritzman further argues that its dialectical analysis of the interrelation of concepts includes, like the Phenomenology, a historical perspective: as a sequence of logical moments it is simultaneously a story of Western thought, this time told through the perspective of concepts. In the rest of the chapter he explicates very briefly the major transitions and divisions of the logic.

As Hegel's logic concludes with a transition to nature, the next chapter elaborates on the Philosophy of Nature and Philosophy of Spirit. Following his usual procedure, Fritzman discusses two diverging mainstream interpretations, namely, the attempt to understand the philosophy of nature as an a priori investigation into the metaphysical structure of nature versus the endeavor to see it as a historical perspective on the development of thought. As nature itself has a rational structure that is only revealed historically by the means of science and philosophy, both interpretations ought to dialectically supplement each other rather than be opposed.

The Philosophy of Nature shows that "Spirit emerges from nature, where nature is Spirit's home" (p. 97), such that we have no reason to experience ourselves as alienated from it. But insofar as Hegel and Fritzman both emphasize that nature does not develop within time, we must be careful to properly understand how exactly this reconciliation occurs, viz., through the recognition that "Nature provides the material support, the physical conditions of the possibility of Spirit" and hence is not the Other (p. 97). 'Emergence' and the transition of moments in nature can only be understood retrospectively, not as a real process in time.

From here, the realm of the spirit emerges, a being that can finally realize freedom in contrast to everything else that exists entirely in the natural realm as a realm of necessity. Fritzman focuses mostly on subjective spirit, the first part of the Philosophy of Spirit, the essence or foundation of what Hegel refers to as anthropology, psychology, and phenomenology. Fritzman goes through the entire trajectory of Hegel's major concepts, ranging from those of the physical and the feeling soul, different aspects of mental instability, habituality in the anthropology, to proper consciousness in form of phenomenology, to conclude with the psychology's account of the imagination, memory, meaning and philosophy. This is rather reinvigorating to see because these aspects of Hegel are all too often downplayed or ignored, especially in introductions.

Although subjective spirit arises from nature, it should not be understood as a product of nature. It can only be understood retrospectively in terms of the role it plays in the whole of spirit: Hegel always starts from the perspective of the fully developed absolute spirit inasmuch as this is the only moment when spirit has sufficiently understood itself and thus is capable of giving an account of its own genesis. In this regard, spirit proves to be not something found, but in point of fact something that is freely posited. As Fritzman clarifies, because subjective spirit can only be grasped in terms of the whole of spirit, spirit defies all scientific investigation or concepts of nature and can only be understood by "the tools appropriate for understanding society, politics, history, and culture" (p. 105).

The Philosophy of Right is divided into chapters concerning family, civil society, and the state. While the family is constituted by love and responsibility, civil society is based on needs and economic relations. The state incorporates judiciary and executive elements, the legislature and the monarchy. Fritzman gives a rough summary of Hegel's legal philosophy, but this is complemented by some rather informative remarks on Hegel's stance on the role of women, administration, censorship, war, and colonization, which alleviate this problem. But what should be underlined is that Hegel's task is to describe his own time in contrast to his rational ideals.

Picking up on this thematic, the Philosophy of History then attempts to show that history itself follows a rational structure that we can know, and it is combined with an implicit call for action, directed at Hegel's contemporaries, to realize the rational structure implicit in their yet deficient societies. While history is the realization of freedom in time, freedom is not yet fully realized at the level of society. Fritzman also discusses several concepts of freedom and gives a short critique of the Eurocentric prejudices lying behind them, which helps readers grasp more fully the philosophical motivations beyond Hegel's theory of objective spirit.

The next chapter is entitled "Hegel's Lectures on Philosophy and Religion," but it also deals with Hegel's aesthetics. It starts with Hegel's claim that each concept -- or to use Fritzman's own words, each "story that we tell ourselves about our world, both social and natural, and our place in it" (p. 127) -- can only be adequately realized within the realm of philosophy. Religion and art may be two forms of articulating concepts that have not yet attained to a sufficiently reflective level of philosophical expression, but this does not in any way prevent them from having intrinsic value. Different forms of art can express concepts in a multitude of ways that are relatively transparent on their own terms, but nevertheless at its highest point art passes over into religion as a superior conceptual medium. A similar assumption holds for religion, which finds its highest point in Protestant Christianity, before this becomes philosophy itself.

In the last chapter "After Hegel," Fritzman provides a wide array of very summary accounts of Hegel's influence, even including Martin Luther King amongst a broad range of philosophers. Of course, none of this is intended to be a comprehensive or deeply insightful history of Hegelianism and its vicissitudes, but is rather designed to be a starting point for one's own engagement with Hegel's many 'descendants'. The book ends with a useful list of primary and secondary sources and reading suggestions.

In general, Fritzman provides a very helpful introduction, one that not only is pleasant to read, but also often manages to be intellectually exciting. What is important to underline is how he manages to cut down the technical terms while (and I cannot emphasize this enough) making accessible the intricate ambivalences and interdependencies within Hegel's dialectical argumentation, which all too often seem contradictory, illogical, or downright arbitrary to many readers.

Even though the advanced scholar might find that other introductions give a more distinctive perspective on Hegel, Fritzman's is stimulating, and even entertaining, to read. Even if his book is obviously not directed at those already well entrenched in Hegel or German Idealism studies, Fritzman takes seriously, and admirably carries out, the task of producing a comprehensive and readable introduction for 'innocuous' students.

While the lack of "Hegelese" terminology makes the book easy to read and very accessible, the obvious downfall for such an approach (especially given its designated audience) is that some students will find it hard to transition directly from this very readable text to Hegel's idiosyncratic and admittedly often obscure texts. In this regard, while Fritzman's introduction can only be a first step towards reading Hegel and might need to be supplemented by other means, it nevertheless remains a valuable first step. For someone who just wants to get a general idea of what Hegel is 'all about', this book is as good as it gets. I will not hesitate in recommending it to my students, but since they will also need to understand Hegel's own writings for themselves, it will not be the only book I recommend. This, however, is a systematic problem of such introductions and no fault of the author, who has so brilliantly succeeded in outlining why one should not only read, but also study Hegel.