2014.08.34

Ward Blanton and Hent de Vries (eds.)

Paul and the Philosophers

Ward Blanton and Hent de Vries (eds.), Paul and the Philosophers, Fordham University Press, 2013, 628pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823249657.

Reviewed by Christophe Chalamet, University of Geneva


The widespread interest in Paul among philosophers continues to give food for thought, as this massive volume demonstrates. Other recent books include: St. Paul among the Philosophers, John Caputo and Linda Martín Alcoff (eds.); Paul, Philosophy, and the Theopolitical Vision: Critical Engagements with Agamben, Badiou, Žižek, and Others, Douglas Harink (ed.); and Paul in the Grip of the Philosophers, Peter Frick (ed.). Ward Blanton and Hent deVries's volume consists of over 500 pages of small print, followed by 115 pages of notes. They enlisted 23 scholars, including three now deceased continental thinkers: Hans Conzelmann, one of the great Pauline scholars of his day, and two significant French philosophers, Deleuze (an essay published in 1978), and Paul Ricœur (a late essay, from 2003).

The editors must be commended for featuring seasoned Pauline scholars as well as younger ones (Conzelmann, L. L. Welborn, Paul Holloway, Troels Engberg-Pedersen, and Emma Wasserman). A fifth of the book was written by thinkers who have been studying Paul's writings at a close philological level for years. But the point of the book is to let very different voices engage the issues that have arisen as philosophers have turned to Paul in recent years. These issues transcend the traditional exegetical and theological problems around which, for instance, the entirely different (and diffuse) group of Pauline scholars who belong to the "New Perspective on Paul" have been circling for three or four decades.

In the introduction, Ward Blanton (whose style sometimes veers toward the cryptic) quotes 1 Cor. 2:2: "I decided to know nothing among you except Jesus Christ, and this one [as] crucified".  He then correctly suggests that "[p]erhaps our readings of Paul and of philosophy ought to start here, knowing something about the economy of information within which such a reduction was enunciated" (5). Let's stick with what's crystal-clear about that sentence (i.e., the first part), which seeks to let Paul tell us what was of central importance to him (Christ crucified, rather than universalism and the rest, which may or may not have their importance, but as consequences of the meaning of the Easter event). Blanton's statement is important and probably has something to do with his reading of Stanislas Breton, a major interpreter of the cross in Paul's thought (why isn't there an essay by Breton, rather than Conzelmann's bland piece on Luke's Paul?). In the volume, it is L. L. Welborn and Slavoj Žižek who best emphasize the centrality of the cross for Paul.

Let me survey each of the book's six parts. "Reconstructing the ancient Paul" as a man "between Athens and Jerusalem" is the aim of Part I, with three essays (Conzelmann, Paul Holloway and Emma Wasserman), which obviously can only scratch the surface. Holloway compares Paul's epistle to the community of Philippi with ancient philosophies of consolation. Paul appropriates, mainly, the Stoic view that "grief lies in mistaking things that do not matter for things that do," and yet "what matters" received a new content in his epistle (65), which leads Holloway to argue that Paul was "a philosopher -- a Christianizing philosopher, to be sure, but a philosopher nonetheless" (67). Wasserman explores the famous passage of Rom. 7:7-25 (in which Paul laments over his own inner conflict) in order to "historicize" it, i.e., to interpret it in relation to the philosophical and cultural context. She finds traces of Platonic imagery. Who is the "I" in Romans 7? Paul himself, or any Christian? A typical, observant Jew? A fictive "I"? Wasserman suggests "A paradigmatic Gentile,", particularly on the basis of Rom. 7:9 (81), and thus warns against hasty universalizing interpretations of this text, for instance in anti-Pelagian, Augustinian ways.

Part II, "Sovereignty and the Aporias of Universalism," picks up where Part I left off. Troels Engberg-Pedersen, in one of the highlights of the book, tackles the much-debated tension between universalism and particularity, drawing on Stoic philosophy in order to engage Alain Badiou's interpretation of Paul as "one of the very first theoreticians of the universal" (Badiou, Saint Paul, 108). Engberg-Pedersen counters that Stoic philosophy had theorized the universal long before Paul, and that Paul's own universalizing tendencies (which coexist with and in fact emerge out of even stronger particularistic and ethnic ones) cannot be abstracted from the "content of the Christ event" (93), as is the case in Badiou's formal argument. "For Paul, the only thing that matters is the Christ event and what it means" (100). Far from producing a universalism, the "Christ-believing group" constitutes "a new group (103)," a "third race" (alongide the Jewish and the Greek ones), a "spiritual" one that differs from the rest of the (still "fleshy") world (101). Engberg-Pedersen could have recalled what Elizabeth A. Castelli, Ian Balfour and others mention elsewhere in the volume, namely that Badiou, when he quotes Ga. 3:28 ("there is neither Jew nor Greek . . . "), omits the last eight words of that verse ("for you are all one in Christ Jesus").

With  Marc de Wilde's erudite essay, we almost leave Paul behind and move to the issue of sovereignty and Carl Schmitt's political theology, in relation to 2 Thess. 2:6-8 and the enigmatic notion of "restraining" force (katechon). After a broad survey of the history of interpretation of that passage, de Wilde searches for sources of Schmitt's theory and ends with an evaluation of that theory (and of one of Schmitt's recent commentators): Schmitt's "weakness" (a dreadful one, I would add) was his uncritical endorsement of "the rulers of the moment," and thus his failure to acknowledge the "state-critical tradition" of interpretation (126).

Closing Part II, Welborn's masterful "The Culture of Crucifixion and the Resurrection of the Dispossessed" shows the "omnipresence of the cross in popular literature" (135) -- and other media -- of ancient Rome, and its near absence in the refined literature of the Roman elite. The elite wanted nothing to do with such shameful realities and words. Paul, on the other hand, "seizes upon the cruel and disgusting term" (137): "The message that the Christ had shared the fate of a piece of human garbage . . . . this message was a power capable of rescuing those who trusted in it from despair at the nothingness of their lives" (138), "because the one who had died in this contemptible way was the anointed one of God" (139). This leads Welborn to his most decisive criticism of Badiou, which concerns Badiou's exclusion of the cross from the "Christ-event" (139-140).

Part III, on "Paul, Materialism, and the Contingencies of Emancipation," is the longest, with seven articles. The present review can only touch on certain aspects. The main interlocutors are Jacob Taubes, Badiou, and Giorgio Agamben in Elizabeth A. Castelli's critically sharp contribution, in which Badiou's (and not just Badiou's) supposed "universalism" is acutely questioned in light of "global Christianity": "one wonders whether the universalism attributed to Paul by these thinkers extends fully to encompass the lived experiences of their global others" (158). Stanley Stowers deals mostly with Badiou, whom he reads as an heir "of the Augustinian-Lutheran and Cartesian tradition of interpreting Paul," in which there is "no general truth, but only truth of particular situations," truth as "an ungrounded commitment, a decision" (166). I can't say I found Stowers' thesis fully convincing, insofar as the Augustinian-Lutheran tradition cannot be reduced to Kierkegaard's interpretation of faith. But showing how Badiou projects his own Cartesianism onto Paul is helpful.

With Žižek's "The Necessity of a Dead Bird: Paul's Communism", we get to the "materialism" mentioned in the title of Part III. For Žižek, "materialism" means "atheism" (176). Could it be that Stowers' important notes on the "materiality" of pneuma in Paul and Hellenistic culture challenge this identification? If God is "pneuma," as Paul thought, and if "pneuma" is not simply "spiritual" (as in "ghostly"), couldn't there be a Christian materialism, besides its atheistic versions? Žižek's essay is thought-provoking as it wrestles with Job and the cross, but it is about Hegel's philosophy of religion rather than about Paul.

Roland Boer analyzes Žižek's double "conversion" to Christ (or, rather, Paul) and to Marx (or, rather, Lenin). His conversion was triggered by Judith Butler. It enabled him to "crack the shell" (191), without freeing himself, of Lacanian psychoanalysis. In the process, Boer criticizes Žižek for confusing grace and love: grace -- not love -- breaks the deadlock of the law and of ethics (196). This is a puzzling, questionable way (theologically speaking) of opposing grace and love. Isn't grace God's love "in act" in relation to what is not God, or the efficiency of God's love towards God's creation? Is it possible "to take a stand against ethics and against love . . . in the name of grace" (199), as if grace had nothing to do with love? Boer seems to forget that love is not firstly a qualifier of human existence, but of God: there is no better descriptor of who God is and what God does than "agapè," according to the first epistle of John and other biblical texts.

It is also strange to read that Luther gave up "entirely on human agency" (207). Isn't the Christian called to "conform" her will to God's will and serve others, thus becoming another Christ? Does that happen through "the removal of human agency" (207)? Just as in any revolution there is the original event, which is followed by "the hard labor the morning after" (208), isn't there a second part, on the necessity of good works, in Luther's treatise on The Freedom of a Christian? If the various aspects of the Christian life, such as justification and sanctification, are kept distinct, as they are in The Freedom of a Christian and throughout Luther's works, it may become impossible to assert simply that Luther's theology gives up on human agency.

Boer is on surer grounds when he writes that "theology can provide one of the most complex ways of speaking about revolution" (207). The entire movement known as the Social Gospel, as well as Karl Barth's early critique of it in the two editions of his Römerbrief (1919-1922), confirm Boer's insight, which has more to do with the unpredictability, and thus the externality (the "aliena" dimension of grace and justice in Luther's theology) of any revolutionary event. Boer concludes that, after four books, Žižek has finally made a breakthrough, realizing that, by breaking "all the rules" (209), grace alone -- not love, nor Lacanian psychoanalysis -- can do the job and allow him to "become a fully engaged political thinker" (208) seeking "means for stepping beyond capitalism" (209).

Clayton Crockett ponders Žižek's and Badiou's interpretations of "the event" as a backdrop for an investigation of Deleuze as, precisely, a thinker of the "event" conceived as "an affair of language, a production of sense, rather than simply the interaction of bodies" (217). This helps us understand the Easter event, which Paul sought to proclaim, not as two separate moments (Good Friday, and then, three days later, Easter Sunday), but as "an enormous spiritual will that transvaluates the grotesque torture and death of a Jesus-body, hanging from a cross, to the good news that Christ is alive." (220). But "whose" will is Crockett talking about? Are we back, here, with the old modern theory (Reimarus, etc.) that the disciples plotted something? Similarly, is it adequately balanced to claim that Christianity "has been a brutal persecution machine, even if that aspect does not exhaust it" (!) (221). Crockett is more interesting when he follows Taubes' way of interpreting Nietzsche and Paul in terms of a rivalry rather than Deleuze's simplistic retrieval of Nietzsche's supposed stance against Paul (221).

Simon Critchley ("You Are Not Your Own: On the Nature of Faith") follows in these footsteps. His is one of the most clearly-written essays, apparent from his very first sentence: "Saint Paul is trouble" (224). Critchley clarifies: the return to Paul "shouldn't . . . be seen as a conservative gesture or some sort of return to traditional religion. On the contrary, the return to Paul is the demand for reformation." (225). After siding with those for whom Paul is more worried by mystical experiences than attached to them, Critchley embarks on an interpretation of Heidegger's Sein und Zeit's section on conscience and "the impotence of Dasein" (243-247), relying on Heidegger's early lectures on Paul. That impotence may in fact be its strength. Even more interesting is Critchley's suspicion about the crypto-Marcionite leanings of recent philosophical interpretations of Paul (especially Agamben, with his antinomian tendency, and Badiou for whom the "event" is a "pure beginning," but also Heidegger (251-252)). How Critchley came to imagine that the (fascinating) epigraph of Harnack's History of Dogma was coined by "Goethe von Eckermann" (230) (rather than from the published conversations between Goethe and Johann Peter Eckermann), I do not know; it is more amusing than significant. The original quote does not quite say that "The Christian religion has nothing to do with philosophy"; it says rather that "The Christian religion has nothing to do in the field of philosophy" ("in der Philosophie"), which is of course not the same thing.

Ricœur's piece ("Paul, the Apostle: Proclamation and Argumentation") is another highlight of the book. Seeking to show how proclamation and argumentation interact in Paul's letters (and thus, following Breton, paying attention to Paul's Greek side, since Paul argues for the sake of convincing others), Ricœur enters into dialogue with Taubes, Badiou, and Agamben. With regard to Badiou, he privileges "the most fundamental genealogical universal, preceding the deontological universal so dear" to his colleague (namely the "neither Greek, nor Jew" of Gal. 3:28): "All in Adam, all in Christ." (269), or the usage of the two "all" in Rom. 11:32, encompass "all the 'neither . . . nor's' of Paul's tormented discourse" (277). Before the "neither, nor" of Gal. 3:28, there is the "neither, nor" of Paul's great hymn in Rom. 8:35-37 ("neither death, nor life"; 274)! Badious's universalism is "abstract"; Taubes was correct to emphasize Paul's "anti-Roman project," notably in Romans 13 (271).

Part IV, titled "Communal Spaces Between Times" (smart sounding, but what does that mean?), gathers three articles by scholars in comparative literature: Julia Reinhard Lupton (a Shakespeare specialist ), Eleanor Kaufman, and Nils F. Schott. Lupton and Kaufman round up the "usual suspects" (Taubes, Schmitt, Badiou and Agamben). Lupton does so in order to develop a deep reflection on universalism (an ideology incapable of respecting the alterity of the other) and universality as "a recurrent struggle with universalism itself," aiming at truth (294-295). Kaufman situates the books on Paul of each of the four thinkers in the broader context of that author's œuvre including, in Badiou's case, his penchant for numbers (308-309). With Schott, we are "back to Paul," with a sort of lectio continua of Paul's first epistle to the Corinthians and of Paul's concern for the unity and well-being of that community. Reading the entire letter is useful, certainly, but Schott runs the risk of providing an overly quick reading of Paul's text, which makes it difficult to argue what he wishes to establish about the threefold "unity of the call," in scripture, apostolic succession (!), and the community.

Part V, "Paulinism and Cultural Critique," opens with Gil Anidjar's intriguing essay on the question of "enmity" in Romans, since that epistle is, in Taubes' words, "a political declaration of war." But "who or what is the 'enemy of God'?" (330-331). Is it "death," which Paul calls the "last enemy" (1 Cor. 15:26)? The "God-haters"? Israel (see Rom. 11:28, a complex, key verse)? In what sense is it (or are they) enemies of God? Is it they who hate God, or God who hates them, or both, since the Greek words theostuges and echthros are ambiguous (333)? Could it be that the Messiah himself "has become the enemy" (335)? And what about Jesus' "mad commandment" to love one's enemy? What does it mean, besides the fact that there still are enemies? According to Anidjar it means that the neighbor has "become an enemy" (341-342), insofar as the neighbor must be loved. He suggests, relying on Samuel Weber, that loving one's enemy amounts to the decision "not to isolate the self from the enemy" (341). But can love be expressed in such negative terms, as a "not doing" something? Is it not the case that love is mostly a positive act or intention? And does the commandment to love one's enemy and one's neighbor really imply "the becoming enemy of the neighbor"? Could it not mean, rather, the becoming neighbor, as enemy (since forgiveness is not forgetfulness), of the enemy?

In "Scandal/Resentment", Antónia Szabari writes about the French banlieues culture, critiquing what some (including Žižek) have called the "unarticulated" "resentment" perceptible in the French riots some years ago (and still today). The link between this essay and "the philosophers" (not to mention "Paul") is tenuous, and one wonders how and why it ended up in the volume.

Stathis Gourgouris ("Paul's Greek") brings to the fore, with great acuity, the question of Paul and Greek language.  Gourgouris first considers it in connection with pope Benedict XVI's critique of any attempt to "dehellenize" Christianity. Later he zeroes in on two key terms in Paul's writings: pistis (faith) and charis (grace), two terms Paul reconfigures, eliminating any juridical-economic connotation from the word pistis (373), suppressing the dimension of "exchange" (cf. Mauss and Bataille) in the gift which grace is (374-375). Far from being simply gratuitous, the gift leads to an "acquisition of power", which can only be understood if one is aware of the "exchange economy" that exists in gift-giving and gift-receiving (375). According to Gourgouris, "The discrepancy between language and signification is no doubt the most exhilarating aspect of the Pauline text" (376), for the apostle achieved, with "perverse ingenuity," "a carnivalesque performance of unprecedented magnitude" in the "domain of signification" (378). Things get even more interesting when Gourgouris (all too briefly) tackles Badiou's (as well as others') interpretation of Gal. 3:28 ("There is neither Jew nor Greek . . . "). Confering these words "a revolutionary signification that undoes the exclusionary framework of the polis . . . is either naïve or cunningly deceitful," for everyone in the ekklēsia, far from exercizing "autonomy or freedom", is God's doulos (376-377). Gourgouris is probably onto something here but, given the importance of the matter, it would have deserved a more detailed treatment. Is he on target, however, when he claims the bottom line in Paul is the "adoration for the afterlife . . . that subordinates life, real life, to death," when he suggests that "Christianity is a religion essentially propelled by a death drive" (379)? Such stark statements will not be convincing to people who are well aware of so many theologians' attempts, throughout the 20th century, to pay attention to the "masters of suspicion," to whom Gourgouris appears to be deeply indebted. What is clear is that, according to Gourgouris, "those who seek in Pauline theology signs of human emancipation, whether they call it universalist or messianic" (380), are sorely mistaken.

Part V closes with an essay by Deleuze (the original text is a preface to his wife's French translation of D. H. Lawrence's monograph on the book of Revelation) on how Christianity, with its will to power, became the Antichrist (383). My hunch is that it is in the book mostly because of the author's name (and perhaps also because he wrote as a philosopher about Paul before Taubes et al.), rather than the content (which has little to do with Paul, and little to do with "the philosophers," except of course Nietzsche). The book would be slimmer, but not much poorer, without it, in my opinion.

Part VI, "Ethics and the Foundations of Law" has four essays. In "The Killing Letter and the Discourse of Spirit: Reading Paul Writing", Ian Balfour, after an (indeed) "disposable" preamble, goes straight to the question: saying that the letter "kills" is not the same as saying, as we often do when interpreting Paul's sentence (2 Cor. 3:6), that the letter is "dead". Far from being dead, the letter is alive, and it kills! What it kills, Paul does not specify (400). And what is the "letter"? Paul frequently quotes "Scripture," of course, which as (holy) "letter" is obviously not completely foreign to the "spirit," and in 2 Cor. 3 what he has in mind is the Corinthian community itself as a letter (Balfour is one of the few contributors who critically engages the work of Richard B. Hays, an important contemporary Pauline scholar, one who has specialized in the ways in which New Testament authors quote the Torah. The volume's lack of engagement with some sectors of contemporary scholarship on Paul is perhaps its main shortcoming.).

Balfour's text contrasts with Gourgouris's conclusion about the absurdity of turning to Paul to overcome oppressive, antidemocratic tendencies when he writes: "Paul's program of spiritualization (which is also to say, of freedom, of the new, and more) is no doubt one of the main things that contributed to the recent engagement with Paul among philosophers and philosophically oriented intellectuals" (410). But, following Gourgouris and others, albeit on different grounds, Balfour develops a helpful critique of Badiou's (mis)use of Gal. 3:28 (411). Balfour, like other contributors, points out the way in which Badiou truncates Paul's repeated claims: for Paul it is faith in Christ that cancels the usual distinctions between Greeks and Jews, etc. "Thus we have a rather particular universality, something other and less than a universal universality" (412)! Neglecting the "particular", which grounds universality, clearly distorts what Paul says. Balfour describes that omission as "violent" (412). And the overcoming of distinctions Paul writes about is probably limited, in his mind, to those who are "in Christ": "Outside this realm, there is Jew and Greek, male and female, slave and free" (412). What are the implications of such claims, which seem warranted, for Badiou's bold thesis about Paul and universalism? Does that render Badiou's thesis completely erroneous? Not necessarily, I would think.

Itzhak Benyamini's article on loving the neighbor, "the sons' community", Freud and Lacan is the most puzzling and problematic piece in the volume. Quoting the King James Bible (!) at length, it begins with some overly bold claims and theses about Paul as "the first and greatest Christian theologian" (411) and as "founder of a narcissistic community of sons" (414). In the notes, one reads that the Epistle of James was "probably" written by Jesus' brother (603, n. 5). The reader also finds "sin" identified with "jouissance" and is invited to consider Paul's "blatant rebellion against the law and his veiled rebellion against the Father-God" (414-415), his attempt "to prepare the believer to come to grips with the arbitrary nature of the cruel God, through a coalition with the Son" (41). Feuerbach was a "Protestant theologian" (428) . . . I could go on. What is the point of these 23 pages? I do not know. The goal here is "to make a sharp distinction between Judaism and Christianity" (415). That is an understatement. Is such a "sharp distinction" helpful when dealing with Paul? Few would think so, nowadays.

Shmuel Trigano, in "The 'Jewish Question' in the Return to Paul: Empire Politics," worries that the "rehabilitation of Paul" may revive "the terrible heritage that gave rise to twenty centuries of antisemitism" (439). This worry needs to be taken seriously, indeed. Trigano is probably correct when he states that Paul was much more interested in "identity" than in "universalism," but is it warranted to speak of the "jealousy invoked by Paul against the Jews" (in Rom 11,11-15), or to claim that "the Pauline operation is to preserve election while removing the Jews" (440, 442)? I doubt many Pauline scholars would agree with these claims. In Trigano's view the metaphor of the olive tree and the grafting, far from being a "proof of Paul's benevolence," "expresses a negation of Judaism" (441)! Isn't it anachronistic to imagine that Paul defended a "Catholic" (but what is the meaning of that term here?) universalism (440)? Surely, Trigano is aware that the word "katholikos" does not appear in Paul's epistles, or in the New Testament for that matter.

Trigano's paper relies on an interpretation of history dominated by teleological necessity. Paul planted the seeds of all the subsequent antisemitism: he laid "the ground for the sacrifical treatment of the Jews that would be deployed for twenty centuries in Europe and that is being revived today" (445). But isn't it the case that, in Romans 11 for instance (v. 1-2, 16, 28-32), Paul warns the Roman community not to despise the Jews, not to consider them as being "sacrificed," cut off, from God's covenant? As with Benyamini, much in Trigano's article presupposes that Paul was a Christian, and a "Catholic" at that, and so it comes as a surprise when he writes, at one point in his essay: "I subscribe to the fact that Paul is a Jew" (445). And so it is as a Jew that Paul "delegitimized" the Jewish people? Did Paul really promote "attraction for the Israel signified, repulsion for the sign" (445)? Can Europe's recurring anti-judaism and anti-semitism (the two should not be confused, even though both are ugly, repulsive and not without correlations) be traced back so immediately and directly to Paul? Many episodes of Western history, many twists and turns, often (but not always) should be taken into account while interpreting the Bible (and thus Paul too). It won't do simply to place the whole weight of anti-Jewish prejudice and hate on Paul's shoulders. It seems to me that Trigano reads Paul as if Paul had been a proto-Marcionite. But the early Church sided with Paul against Marcion's rejection of the Torah, as Kenneth Reinhard reminds us in his paper (453).

In "Paul and the Political Theology of the Neighbor," Reinhard presents anew some of the insights he has already defended elsewhere this past decade. One of his aims is to restore the link between the two commandments of love (love of God and of neighbor) in political-theological thinking (450). Most theologians, it seems to me, would applaud such an aim. Reinhard then turns to the tricky question of what to do with Rom. 13:1-7 (454) and enters into a very interesting dialogue with the editors of Taubes' lectures (455), who according to him have misunderstood Taubes. The gist of the argument is: "To obey Caesar is not to take the safe course and bide one's time before the parousia but to hasten the advent of redemption by participating in the decadence of the law -- not, by any means, through breaking the law, but by obeying it" (458-459). Reinhard ends his piece by reflecting on our own situation, making use of Agamben's distinction between secularization (which simply transfers the power structures of the sacred to the secular, leaving them intact) and profanation (which implies the deactivation or cancellation of the sacred's power) (464). "The political theology of the neighbor" enacts a profanation, restoring "to common usage something that was previously sacrosanct" (465).

The "bouquet final" of the volume is de Vries' piece on "Inverse Versus Dialectical Theology: The Two Faces of Negativity and the Miracle of Faith". Centering on Taube, De Vries first treats several aspects already considered elsewhere in the book: Paul's revolutionary and polemical reduction of the double commandment (469-470, 511), his declaration of war on Roman power (467), and his proto-Marcionite tendencies (481). De Vries then examines, compares and contrasts "dialectical theology," as exemplified by Karl Barth, and "inverse" or "other" theology, as exemplified by Theodor Adorno (486). "Dialectical theology" has been the object of much scholarship since the 1920s (much before Hans Urs von Balthasar's 1951 study, unlike what de Vries writes about Balthasar being "one of the first commentators on the work of Karl Barth" (469)), but "inverse theology" is a much more obscure expression. What does it mean, and what does it do? "Inverse theology" is "neither nontheological and atheistic . . . nor theological and theistic" (490). So what is it, then? Can something positive be said about it?

The reader may be a bit discouraged when reading that the opposition between Barth and Adorno "entails a distinction that we cannot make yet cannot but make and that, moreover, when all is said and done, makes no difference either way" (495), or that "at a certain level of abstraction or nuance, their respective positions do not seem to matter" (505). Sure, eschatologically speaking, none of this may matter. But none of the readers of this review or of the book are in the eschaton, so what is the point of these claims, especially since there are deep differences between the two: Barth speaks of a "'Real' given in revelation and accepted in faith" (the word "given" might need qualifying, as Barth preferred to speak of the "giv-ing" of the "Real" rather than of its "given-ness," for fear of reification), whereas Adorno denies that and opts for "a strictly conceptual and deeply ascetic gesture of redemptive critique" (495). In other words, Barth's dialectical theology is still "too affirmative or positive," it is too "maximal" in the eyes of an "inverse," "minimal" theologian such as de Vries (504, 508) -- but also to fellow systematic theologians, such as G. C. Berkouwer in his book The Triumph of Grace in the Theology of Karl Barth (1956). And yet the similarities are striking between the two "theologies," insofar as both "dialectical" and "inverse" theologies consider the world sub specie aeternitatis and both attempt (but which theologian worth her salt does not try to do that?) to think the subject matter's radical transcendence and immanence (496-497).

De Vries is convinced "that at certain points Barth's and Adorno's projects seem formally indistinguishable" (504). The key word in that sentence is "formally". But isn't material agreement or convergence much more interesting than formal similarities? De Vries turns to the key, material dimension at the end of his essay, when he asks (it is interesting to note that dialectical theology has disappeared as he formulates this question): "What . . . does 'inverse' or 'other' theology have to offer us?" (508) An important part of the answer seems to be that "inverse theology" connects the materia of theology with our "forms of life," and in return it connects these "forms of life" with "the richness and virtual presence of the religious archive" (510). But there, too, which sound theologian does not attempt to do that?

All in all, this thick book is a fascinating collection, focusing on how Paul has been and is being interpreted by recent and contemporary philosophers. Much work remains to be done for the sake of fostering a rich, fruitful conversation among Pauline scholars, exegetes and theologians, on the one hand, and the interpreters of Paul who happen to be philosophers and thinkers interested in philosophy, on the other. But this volume certainly goes in the right direction and deserves close attention.