2014.09.05

Laurence Goldstein (ed.)

Brevity

Laurence Goldstein (ed.), Brevity, Oxford University Press, 2013, 353pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199664986.

Reviewed by Catherine Wearing, Wellesley College


Each of us is exceedingly good at communicating a great deal more than we put into words. Brevity in this sense of the term -- as meaning something like economy or efficiency of expression -- is a central feature of how humans communicate. Indeed, one of Grice's sub-maxims of Manner is 'Be brief '. It is hard to imagine how effective communication could occur if we always made explicit everything we sought to get across. And so we can ask, under what conditions do we achieve brevity in communication, and what is the significance of this widespread and diverse phenomenon? The essays in this collection take up these questions.

Many of the papers focus on one or another of the specific mechanisms that facilitate brevity in conversation. These include the use of fragment utterances (utterances in which something less than a complete sentence is pronounced), implicitly communicated objects of verbs, contextual variation in the richness of descriptions, and the phenomenon of presupposition. Several other essays look at more general consequences of brevity, including the possibility of inexplicit thought and the implications of brevity for both the compositionality of language as well as extra-linguistic problems such as Kripke's puzzle about belief. A third group of essays approaches brevity from an experimental perspective.

The seventeen papers come from a distinguished and diverse group of linguists, philosophers, and cognitive scientists. The volume grew out of a series of workshops in which many of the book's contributors participated. There is a certain amount of cross-talk among individual essays, but on the whole, the book reads as a fairly disconnected group of papers. As a result, its value lies chiefly in the quality of individual essays as contributions to ongoing discussions of their specific topics. In what follows, I aim to give a brief overview of the individual essays, to give a sense of what can be found in this diverse and rich book.

Fragments and other 'local' phenomena

The book's largest single focus is one of the most obvious cases of brevity in communication: the use of fragments -- sub-sentential phrases -- in discourse. Five papers engage directly with these sorts of cases. The first two, by Jason Merchant, LynFrazier, Charles Clifton, and Thoams Weskott, and by Anne Bezuidenhout, debate the plausibility of Merchant's (2001, 2004) 'Silent Syntax' [SS] account of fragments. Merchant's proposal has seen a lot of discussion in the literature; here, Merchant et al. offer experimental evidence focusing specifically on the case of fragment answers to questions. Bezuidenhout raises both conceptual and empirical objections to the SS position.

According to Merchant, each fragment contains unpronounced (silent) syntactic material. For example, if Ann is asked 'Who did John see?' and she answers 'Steve', her answer contains not just the bare nominal which she articulates but unpronounced material as well. Merchant (2001, 2004) argues that operations of movement and deletion explain what is pronounced and what is silent. Thus, if we were to begin with a complete answer to the question ('John saw Steve'), the new material in that answer, that it was Steve who was seen, would move to focal position (generating 'Steve, John saw') and then the uninformative remainder of the sentence ('John saw') would be elided.

Merchant et al. offer two pieces of support for this proposal, based on looking at the behaviour of fragment answers to questions in English and in German. In the English cases, they highlight the behaviour of the complementizer 'that' in examples such as the following:

Q: What did John deny?

A: a. That he had lied.  [That he had lied, John denied.]

    b. *He had lied.        [*He had lied, John denied.]

The unacceptability of answer A.b is claimed to follow from the unacceptability of the full sentence 'He had lied, John denied', in contrast to the acceptable A.a and the associated sentence 'That he had lied, John denied'. According to the SS account, we see this pattern because the complementizer 'that' is required for felicitous movement of a clause. A similar prediction is made in German with respect to the behaviour of prepositions in fragment answers, as in the following:

Q: Haben sie  mit  dem Mann gesprochen?

     Have  they with the   man  spoken

    ‘Have they spoken with the man?

A: a. Nein, mit der   Frau. [Mit der Frau haben sie gesprochen.]

        No,   with the   woman

    b. ??Nein,  der Frau.   [*Der Frau haben sie mit gesprochen.]

            No,    the woman.

The NP 'der Frau' ('the woman') cannot move from its original position without the preposition 'mit' also moving, which explains why A.a is felicitous but A.b is not. To support these predictions, Merchant et al. gathered acceptability ratings for a range of fragment answers that came with or without complementizers (in English) and prepositions (in German). In both cases, they found that answers with complementizers/prepositions were rated as significantly more acceptable than answers without. Merchant et al. have confirmed that the sorts of linguistic intuitions on which the theory rests are indeed shared by speakers at large.

Bezuidenhout raises a number of objections to this Silent Syntax account. Most generally, she warns that we must be careful not to conflate an account of linguistic competence -- which would provide a formal model of elliptical sentences -- with an account of linguistic performance -- which would model the production and comprehension of (among other things) fragmentary utterances. This worry comes to the fore in thinking about how to deal with fragment answers of a different sort than the ones Merchant et al. discuss.

In contrast to the cases discussed by Merchant et al., in which movement considerations appear to explain which fragments could felicitously constitute direct answers to questions, Bezuidenhout highlights cases of infinitival short answers and negative answers, in which the felicitous possibilities are precisely not the ones which could have been moved from lower down in a complete sentence directly related to the original question. Consider, for example:

Q: What did John do?

  A: Play baseball.             [*John play baseball.]

                                        [What John did is play baseball.]

Q: Who did you talk to?

A: Not to John.                 [*I talked not to John.]

                                        [It is not to John that I talked.]

It has been suggested that sentences with pseudocleft or it-cleft constructions ('What John did is . . . ', 'It is not to John that . . . ') might constitute the underlying sentences in these cases. But as Bezuidenhout points out, this would mean that information about information structure (e.g., about what is focused vs. what is presupposed) is being used twice over: first, to generate the full underlying form, and then to decide what is to be expressed or elided. While such a double-loop process may work formally, it is unnecessarily cumbersome as a model of speech production and comprehension: "if informational structural considerations are already salient, they can be used directly by a speaker to produce a focal phrase without having to first form an it-cleft or pseudocleft construction and then having to engage in a movement and deletion process" (p. 43). This is one place where the general caution against extrapolating from formal theory to processing model is borne out.[1] Anyone interested in the debate over fragments should read both papers, as useful considerations are raised on each side of the aisle.

Reinaldo Elugardo extends the discussion of fragments further, shifting the focus to discourse-initial cases. His position is at the other extreme from Merchant's: he takes fragments to have only the syntax and semantics of their articulated components and yet to be capable of being used to make complete speech acts, such as assertions and requests. (For example, one might start a conversation by pointing to one's brand new shoes and say 'On sale!', thereby uttering a non-truth-evaluable phrase and with it performing a truth-evaluable act of assertion.) Elugardo makes a case for this position by highlighting the range of speech acts that a single phrase may be used discourse-initially to make. Considerations of parsimony, he argues, support the view that the phrase is subject to pragmatic enrichment, rather than being multiply ambiguous. He takes related considerations to count against Kepa Korta and John Perry's claim that discourse-initial fragments have (truth-evaluable) reflexive contents.

Michael Glanzberg also focuses on discourse-initial contexts, and in particular on why the felicity of fragments is so much more difficult to achieve in these contexts than it is in non-discourse-initial contexts. It seems that for discourse-initial utterances to work, the context must be able to provide the appropriate salience, topic, or background knowledge to facilitate the hearer's interpretation. But Glanzberg then shows that a puzzle arises: non-discourse-initial ellipsis can work even when the prior discourse fails to provide any of these sorts of support. Why should the mere presence of speech make the felicity of ellipsis so (comparatively) easy? He suggests that one important factor at work may be the processing of the uttered speech. His idea is that the understanding that is generated in the processing of speech may activate a range of resources (e.g., working memory) sufficient to generate exactly those features, such as salience, that facilitate the utterance's felicity.

As Glanzberg notes, this suggestion requires a great deal of working out. But it resonates with a central feature of the proposal discussed by Eleni Gregoromichelaki, Ronnie Cann, and Ruth Kempson, namely, the importance of connecting our theoretical model of linguistic knowledge much more closely to accounts of processing and performance. Gregoromichelaki et al. defend a psycholinguistically motivated account of syntax that is thoroughly incremental. They support this approach with examples from dialogues in which contributors construct collaborative utterances, such as the following:

(A and B arguing)

A: In fact what this shows is

B: that you are an idiot

Notice that there is a sense in which B's contribution completes A's, but presumably not in the same way that A might have completed his own contribution. Gregoromichelaki et al. argue that the frequency of such collaborative utterances in discourse gives us reason to abandon not just the idea that the underlying structure (syntactic or semantic) of fragments is properly sentential (as on Merchant's view), but also the idea that the appropriate conceptual unit is the proposition or complete thought (as on Elugardo's view). Gregoromichelaki et al. push the notion of brevity much farther than any of the other contributors in this book, encouraging us to award the hearer a much more central role in the construction of a dialogue as a way of generating an account that uses truly fragmentary components. Readers interested in Dynamic Syntax will need to do some background reading to get a grip on the view, but this essay offers an interesting take on the notion of brevity, suggesting that there may not be as much 'behind' our brief utterances as we tend to assume.

Three more papers address other local phenomena that facilitate brevity. Anouch Bourmayan and François Recanati's paper is a beautifully clear discussion of a set of cases that have seen some debate in the literature already, cases such as the following:

John is anorexic, but whenever his father cooks mushrooms, he eats.

Recanati (2002, 2004) has argued that these cases should be handled by free pragmatic enrichment. Following objections from Luisa Martí (2006) and Jason Stanley (2005, 2007), Bourmayan and Recanati develop a situation-theoretic analysis, which allows them to maintain a broadly pragmatic account without pushing the pragmatically-recovered material into implicatures, while providing a tidy explanation of various problem cases and other considerations. As they concede, there is still room for counter-moves on the part of Stanley and Martí, but the proposal raised in this paper is well worth considering by anyone following debates over unarticulated constituents and free pragmatic enrichment.

Presuppositions constitute another means by which speakers can achieve brevity in communication, and their explanation is a fertile ground of debate over the boundary between semantics and pragmatics. Andreas Stokke and Manuel García-Carpintero take up two outstanding points of debate. Stokke focuses on the Rooth-Soames objection to Irene Heim's dynamic account of presuppositions in terms of context change potentials. The objection focuses on presupposition projection -- how to account for the presuppositions of compound sentences on the basis of their atomic components -- and charges that Heim's dynamic account lacks both predictive and explanatory adequacy with respect to these cases. Stokke unpacks what exactly predictive and explanatory adequacy each require to argue that Heim's account fares better than the objection's proponents have claimed. In brief, he shows that proper attention to the role of empirical data in grounding the theory suffices to refute the charge of predictive inadequacy, while the distinction between descriptive and foundational theories makes room for Heim's account to sidestep the explanatory inadequacy charge. This is another very clear discussion, and it usefully highlights some of the 'big picture' considerations affecting theory choice in this domain.

García-Carpintero, meanwhile, challenges the Stalnakerian account of informative presuppositions. If I tell you that I'm running late because I had to pick up my sister at the airport, you would thereby learn -- assuming you didn't already know it -- that I have a sister. But how can one presuppose what is not already known? García-Carpintero defends a broadly semantic account against Robert Stalnaker's pragmatic 'eliminativist' account, arguing that Stalnaker cannot adequately explain how informative presuppositions are accommodated. Very roughly, Stalnaker's view depends on distinguishing two moments in the interpretation process: one at which the utterance is finished and its presuppositions can be checked (and accommodated if necessary), and a second at which the assertion is accepted or rejected. García-Carpintero accuses Stalnaker of begging the question against the semantic account. In effect, the idea seems to be that positing these two moments in the interpretation process does nothing against the claim that some presuppositions have semantic triggers.[2] Instead, García-Carpintero proposes that we take cases of informative presupposition to involve a speech act of 'presupposing', which can be triggered in virtue of features of the linguistic meaning of (part of) the uttered sentence (such as 'my sister' in the example above). I don't think García-Carpintero's discussion tips the balance in favour of a semantic account, but he's certainly right to press for more clarification as to why the two-moment move should suffice to establish the pragmatic explanation.

Experimental treatments of brevity

Four papers consider brevity from an explicitly empirical perspective. As with the more theoretically-focused papers on ellipsis, intransitives, and presupposition, the basic question at the heart of the experimental debates is whether particular kinds of brevity in speech should be explained by means of a (perhaps more general purpose) pragmatic mechanism (such as the Gricean maxims) or by more locally-focused syntactic or semantic knowledge. The four experimental papers bring a range of paradigms to bear in order to test competing proposals.

Eve Clark and Chigusa Kurumada investigate how children develop the ability to be both brief and informative. Children's early utterances are obviously very brief -- just single words, at first -- but what they mean to communicate by means of these utterances is often frustratingly unclear (for both them and their hearers!). In effect, young children are good at being brief, but often bad at being simultaneously relevant. By looking at corpus data taken from adult-child conversations, Clark and Kurumada were able to analyze patterns in children's developing ability to produce longer utterances consistent with standards of both brevity and informativity. They found that by age four, children are capable of producing substantially longer utterances, but the relevance of their utterances is often unclear or tangential. At five years old, by contrast, children's utterances were slightly shorter but more on point, suggesting that they have learned better how to balance brevity and informativity. Clark and Kurumada don't undertake to explain how children develop this ability, but they do draw our attention to a significant point that is not made explicit in any of the other papers, namely, the fact that considerations of brevity cannot stand on their own -- one needs to take other Gricean maxims (or analogous constraints) into account to judge success with respect to brevity. The maxims of Quantity and Relation are particularly important here -- brevity only makes sense in conjunction with a sense of the range of information the speaker is trying to get across and the relevance of that information.

Julie Sedivy weighs the relative merits of semantic and pragmatic explanations of two further examples of brevity: children's avoidance of lexical overlap and their use of contrastive interpretations of adjectives. In each case, one possible explanation is a pragmatic one. For example, suppose a child hears a speaker use an unfamiliar word. The child might reason that, if the speaker had meant to refer to a familiar object, she would have used the usual label for it; given that she didn't use this label, she must not have meant to refer to that object, but instead to a less familiar object whose name is unknown. Alternatively, one might offer a more local, word- (or word-form-) specific explanation. For example (following Ellen Markman and Gwyn Wachtel (1988), one might posit default constraints on word learning that shape the child's interpretation independently of any considerations to do with the speaker (e.g., that category terms do not overlap in their extensions). Similarly for contrastive interpretations of adjectives: the child might reason pragmatically that if the speaker referred to the tall vase, rather than simply the vase, that was because there was some other vase from which the correct one was to be distinguished. Or children might make a structure-based generalization, say, that adjectives quite generally are to be understood contrastively.

Sedivy tests these competing explanations by manipulating speaker competence. If the child is relying on a pragmatic mechanism, then she should modify her interpretations when she discovers that her interlocutor is not reliable. So, for example, she should be less willing to infer that a novel object (rather than a familiar one) is the correct referent of an unfamiliar word when the speaker routinely misuses familiar labels. On the learning constraints view, by contrast, the child's interpretation should be indifferent to such features of the speaker (and so, e.g., the bias towards applying unfamiliar labels to unfamiliar objects should persist even when a speaker is unreliable). Building on work by Gil Diesendruck et al. (2012), Sedivy and her colleagues were able to show that children are indeed sensitive to the reliability of speakers in both of the cases under discussion. They are significantly less likely to adopt unfamiliar names for unfamiliar objects or to use an adjective contrastively when the speaker is unreliable. In both cases, children seem to be taking conversationally relevant features of their interlocutors into account in working out what their interlocutors might (or might not) mean to be communicating, which supports a pragmatic explanation of the phenomena.

Daniel Grodner and Rachel Adler focus on the choices speakers make when they need to describe an object, and more specifically, on how communicative considerations (i.e., making themselves understood) interact with cognitive constraints (e.g., limited attentional resources) in determining choices of descriptions. By manipulating the sort of communicative situation in which participants find themselves -- are they cooperating or competing to solve a task? -- Grodner and Adler show that communicative considerations play a role in both competitive and cooperative scenarios, which suggests the same conclusion as Sedivy's work: considerations of brevity are chiefly a pragmatic matter. Ira Noveck and Nicola Spotorno take up this idea at a more abstract level, aiming to characterize a pragmatic process of 'narrowing' that facilitates brevity in a wide range of cases. Using scalar implicatures and metaphors as illustrations, they review a range of experimental studies that support pragmatic treatments of these phenomena. I confess to having had difficulty seeing how narrowing was significantly different from the sort of pragmatic explanation provided by Relevance Theory, but the attempt to unify a range of cases under a single explanation was helpful in focusing attention on questions about general patterns that might extend across distinct cases of brevity in conversation.

Broader questions

All of the remaining essays take up broader questions. Matthew Stone, for example, examines how conversational economy, understood as the simultaneous pursuit of multiple communicative goals, might be modelled from the perspective of computational linguistics. He focuses on what he calls 'pragmatic overloading', the use of a single intention to serve more goals than just the one for which you adopted it. For example, if someone utters 'Take the rabbit out of the hat' while you have two rabbits in front of you, only one of which is in a hat, and three hats, only one of which contains a rabbit, then you know which hat and which rabbit you are meant to be dealing with. As Stone puts it, "information provided across its different constituents makes it possible to achieve multiple goals in an efficient way" (p. 145). He draws out two lessons from his discussion: first, communicative intentions will need to have a rich structure, tracking both word meanings and ongoing updates to the conversational context, in order to support pragmatic overloading successfully; and second, the sort of brevity that can be achieved by overloading is constrained by the inherently collaborative nature of conversation. Sometimes, greater explicitness will be the only reliable way to ensure that an interlocutor grasps our communicative intentions. I sometimes found it quite unclear how the particular intentions at play in a given case were to be identified -- no criteria for individuation were provided -- but the broader considerations regarding how to balance coherence and collaboration are surely correct.

Francis Jeffry Pelletier examines how brevity of expression is compatible with semantic compositionality. Compositionality requires a well-defined relationship between the meanings of a sentence's parts and its meaning as a whole, while brevity -- if this means relying on (a range of) aspects of the context of utterance to fix meanings -- threatens to expand the sorts of relationships between part and whole to an unmanageable extent. The question, then, is how to model the contributions of context in such a way that compositionality is preserved. Pelletier's ultimate answer is that compositionality can't (quite) be preserved, but that something close to it -- groundedness -- suffices to explain the productivity and learnability of language. He shows first that careful attention to the distinction between standing and occasion meanings allows one to avoid a number of apparent challenges posed to compositionality by context-dependence. He then sketches an account in terms of semantic groundedness that aims to preserve the central benefit of compositionality (its capacity to explain productivity and learnability) while remaining empirically plausible. Details are a bit thin, but the move away from strict compositionality is motivated by a critical look at Recanati's (2012) attempt to reconcile compositionality with context-dependence. That account -- based on Recanati's 'mod' function -- is "pretty magical," Pelletier claims; what it shares with his own account is a commitment to deriving the occasion meaning of a whole from 'basic' parts -- perhaps not sub-parts of the uttered sentence, but parts which are not themselves dependent in the context at hand on any other elements that would make calculating their value impossible or circular.

Laurence Goldstein focuses on some implications of brevity beyond the facilitation of communication. He argues that greater attention to the phenomenon of 'speaking loosely' (saying less than you mean) helps to dissolve a range of philosophical puzzles, including the liar paradox, Russell's paradox, and Kripke's puzzle about belief. I'll illustrate the general strategy as it applies to Kripke's puzzle. Here's the puzzle: Pierre seems willing to assert both that 'London is not beautiful' and that 'Londres est jolie'. What does he believe? Is London beautiful in his view or not? Goldstein suggests that we should simply refuse the question -- there is no unqualified answer because what is speaker-meant in the two cases is different. Because Pierre speaks loosely, he appears to contradict himself, but when his two speaker meanings are properly clarified, one can see that he holds distinct and compatible beliefs (perhaps about different parts of London).

This gives the flavour of Goldstein's solution; he offers broadly analogous responses for a range of other puzzles. I worry, however, that this sort of solution won't quite do. After all, the hard case, the case that Kripke seems to be after, is the one in which Pierre has genuinely contradictory beliefs. Regarding this case, Goldstein simply allows that Pierre may have genuinely incompatible beliefs without this being any particular cause for concern -- the mind is sufficiently "compartmentalized", he claims, that rational people sometimes do hold contradictory beliefs, where this should be neither a surprise nor a worry. Setting aside whether this position is satisfactory, notice that if it constitutes the real thrust of Goldstein's solution to the puzzle, then the alleged role of brevity (or loose talk) in supporting the appearance of the puzzle was in fact a red herring -- the cases in which loose talk was involved were never the real problem.

Christopher Gauker's discussion of inexplicit thoughts also looks beyond linguistic communication. Gauker challenges the idea that there is a fully explicit thought behind each loose, vague, or incompletely specified utterance. Instead, he argues, an inexplicit thought (such as that 'S is ready', without it being specified what S is ready for) may in some contexts be sufficient to determine a course of action. I confess that I found the examples aimed at motivating this claim rather unconvincing. To take just one, suppose you and I are filling buckets with oats to feed the horses in our stable, and at a certain point as I am pouring oats into the first bucket, you say 'That's enough'. Gauker contends that I do not need to form the explicit thought 'The amount of oats I have poured into this bucket is as much as I should pour' but simply understand you to mean that I should move on to filling the next bucket (pg. 82). But I don't see why this thought is the explicit thought in question; surely a better candidate is something like 'that's enough oats in that bucket'. And then it's not clear why we should believe that the hearer does not and need not entertain that thought. Gauker is to be credited, however, for raising the tricky question of what exactly constitutes a fully explicit thought (or utterance), a notion that deserves more attention in connection with brevity than it receives in this book.

The final paper goes some way in this direction, by examining the opposite of brevity, namely, prolixity. Friedrich Christoph Doerge compares the resources of a "broadly Gricean account" and Relevance Theory to explain cases in which a speaker is deliberately more wordy or more informative than seems warranted in the context at hand. Unfortunately, some errors in his interpretation of Relevance Theory undercut his objections to that account, but the broad questions raised about prolixity are interesting and important.

Indeed, this collection left me wanting to hear more about what exactly prolixity and brevity each consist in. As I noted at the outset, the notion of brevity tended to be understood here as efficiency or economy of expression. But these notions would themselves benefit from more discussion. For instance, are they normative considerations, measured against something like Grice's maxims or other conversational standards? Or are they features of our cognitive processes? (In other words, are we 'built' to be cognitively efficient?) A related question: why are we so good at being brief? Is this a means of getting around what Stephen Levinson has called the "articulatory bottleneck"? Does it serve a more general cognitive purpose? Or is it a response to normative conversational expectations of speaker/hearers? These essays contribute to our understanding of the ways in which we achieve brevity. Taken together, they show how important this phenomenon is and how much more there is to say about it.


[1] Bezuidenhout also critically reviews a number of experimental studies that purport to support the SS account, but in the interests of space, I won’t reconstruct that part of her discussion.

[2] N.B.: On García-Carpintero’s view, semantics has to do with standing facts about meaning as a part of linguistic competence, but not necessarily with truth-conditions.