Stephen Yablo


Stephen Yablo, Aboutness, Princeton University Press, 2014, 221pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691144955.

Reviewed by Adam Morton, University of British Columbia

This is an important and far-reaching book that philosophers will be discussing for a long time. In spite of the title, the questions and claims do not primarily concern reference, the topics of conversations, or the ways works of art depict. The main theme is best given by something Stephen Yablo says in the closing pages: "truths come to us wrapped in larger falsehoods . . . that go beyond what we really wanted to say" (205). Sometimes, one might add, beyond what we are capable of saying without saying too much. So his main concern is to analyze ways in which we can start with the literal content of an assertion and expand or contract it to what we really want to communicate. On the surface there are many such ways. There is subtraction: "it's like a telegraph but without the wires", "it's what is left if you start with intentional action and then take away the bodily movement". There is metaphor: "she is the engine driving contemporary set theory". There is rule-governed presupposition, of the king of France kind. There is free pragmatic presupposition of the grass cutting kind (if you take a cubic micron out of each blade with nano-shears, it is the grass you are cutting, but you haven't fulfilled your promise to cut the grass.) There is the appeal to unstated premises. There are others. (Implicit domains of quantification would be another, which he does not mention.) These all come under the heading of 'aboutness' because in each case the issue can be seen to turn, Yablo argues, on what the topic of a claim is, and its inclusion relations to the topics of other claims.

Yablo's aim is to find common conceptual mechanisms running through many of these. The theme of mathematical fictionalism runs through many of the examples, but is not essential to anything he says. In fact, his use of it illustrates his theme. Grant him that we often talk of, for example, specific rates of increase while not believing that the world really contains such things as numbers, and you will find many of the points easier to grasp. Later you can withdraw your agreement. It is a nicely-written book -- clear, elegant and often amusing -- but it is not easy. You often have to read a passage twice, and it is easy to have lost the details of one chapter when they suddenly become relevant to another. In the preface Yablo gives a sequence of chapters to read first to avoid drowning in details that you can return to when you have the big picture. I used a different approach. I first read what he says on topics where I have more background and opinions -- for me confirmation, closure, and presupposition -- and then I considered the general claims that sustain what he says about these.

The central idea is of one proposition being part of another. Propositions are taken to be sets of possible worlds, though the main points could be presented with other understandings of what propositions are. But the part-whole relation in question is not that of inclusion of the sets of worlds. You can get the idea intuitively by the application to confirmation. If the first coin that Nelson Goodman draws from his pocket is copper, that raises the probability that all four coins in his pocket are copper, but does not intuitively confirm it. The reason, for Yablo, drawing on work by Ken Gemes, is that it does not raise the probability of "the surplus content" of the all-copper hypothesis beyond the fact that this first coin was copper. In particular, it does not make it more likely that the next coin is copper. Raising the probability of "copper1 & . . . & copper4" does not raise the probability of its part "copper1". Similarly, evidence for "copper1 or copper2" is not evidence for "copper1" since "copper1" is not even part of "copper1 or copper2". The reason is that the disjunction can be true for reasons that have nothing to do with the first disjunct. This makes the subtraction relation important, P -- Q being the excess content of P over Q. Now conjunction does not have a simple inverse in propositional logic: there is no operator * such that (P&Q)*Q is true iff P is. So a lot of care has to go into saying what goes into subtraction. Essentially Q is part of P when the reasons that determine the truth-value of Q are among the reasons that determine the truth-value of P. For the details, you will have to read the book. Many of the details are fascinating, but one part of the analysis depends on a treatment of truth-makers that is left unfinished, leaving something for future work. (I don't want to give the impression that the exposition is not rigorous, though I am ignoring a lot. What the reader of a review needs to know is whether it is worth wrestling with the definitions to make up her own mind. It is.)

The mereology of propositions is also applied to issues of closure. Yablo discusses, in a way that parallels the discussion of confirmation, cases where someone knows something but it is plausible that they do not know an admitted consequence of it. He suggests that these are typically cases where the consequence is not a part of what is known. The result is closure under a cut-down consequence relation, which will not be characterizable in the usual formal way. But it will catch cases where, if he is right about confirmation, evidence is transmitted to consequences. I'd like to see this idea extended to multi-premise closure and combined with the notorious non-transmission of probability in such cases.

Subtraction gets another use in discussing presupposition. My sister is a topologist (T) presupposes that I have a sister, and this is closely related to the intuition Yablo elicits from the reader that it adds neither truth nor falsity to I have a sister (S). The analysis only applies to rule-governed presuppositions. For less systematic ones Yablo first compares them to metaphorical assertions, interpreted so that their content is defined in terms of Walton-style games of pretending that the world is such that the assertion's literal meaning is true. Yablo finds these attractive and versatile, but ultimately replaces them with an analysis in terms of missing premises of arguments. Thus the contextual meaning of "he cut the grass" is the implicit premise (along the lines of "he is shortening the blades of grass to a considerable extent") that must be added to the contextually salient premises "he is performing a domestic task" and "only considerable shortening of the grass would be a domestic task", to get the conclusion "he cut the grass". Missing premises are analyzed in terms of the part-whole propositional relations that are the core of the book, making use of conjectural material on truth-makers. (The naturalness of Yablo's approach is reinforced by seeing that there is also a connection in the other direction: when you present an enthymematic argument as sound and persuasive, you are presupposing the missing premises.)

This style of analysis is applied to a range of philosophical issues, remarkably many given that it is a fairly short book, and in each case the result is persuasive and enlightening. There are recurring allusions to a general phenomenon in philosophy where we can only say what we want by saying more and then indicating a retreat, or conversely saying less and indicating an extension. This phenomenon could obviously be of interest to philosophers of religion.

Loose ends, unfinished business, and unanswered worries remain, though. One is the need for a single treatment of truth-makers, left incomplete in chapter 4. This is important because the terminology is used in later chapters. Another is the relation between metaphor and pragmatic presupposition, left rather conjectural. My biggest worry is the danger of overkill: Yablo makes a good case that his treatment can be used to give desirable answers to a range of questions, but he has not given enough reassurance that the same style of analysis, mechanically applied, will not also sometimes give unwanted or perverse answers. Consider, for example, the treatment of presupposition in terms of missing premises. I worry that sometimes a suitable premise filling the gap between what is known to speaker and hearer and what is literally said may be something that is not plausibly taken as part of the communicated content of what is said. For example, we can get from the common knowledge that all the kings of France in the past four hundred years have been Bourbons to the asserted conclusion that the king of France is bald, by using the extra assumption that all Bourbons are bald. But the claim about Bourbons is surely not a presupposition of "the king of France is bald". (Yablo does not discuss definite article cases when presenting the missing premise picture of presupposition, presumably because this would create the added burden of defending an account of the logical form of "the"-sentences in order to sustain claims about consequence.) Another worry concerns what happens when we move from considering absolutely all possible worlds to considering all half-way-likely possible worlds, as a treatment of real life epistemology and semantics surely must. How stable under this refinement is the analysis?

I take the questions arising from Yablo's discussions as a tribute to its fecundity, though. There are doctoral dissertations, articles, and books to write exploring the possibilities and limitations of his approach.