2014.09.17

Elmar J. Kremer

Analysis of Existing: Barry Miller's Approach to God

Elmar J. Kremer, Analysis of Existing: Barry Miller's Approach to God, Bloomsbury, 2014, 143pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623567866.

Reviewed by Herman Philipse, University of Utrecht


Those of us who made an effort to study the best instances of Scholastic philosophy -- preferably in the Latin originals -- may have felt about them in two different ways. On the one hand, when reading the writings of Petrus Abaelardus, Duns Scotus, or Thomas Aquinas, we will have admired the elaborate architecture of their arguments, their logical ingenuity, and the finesse of their conceptual distinctions. On the other hand, we may have come to the conclusion that too many of their arguments are not sound, because they rely on outdated background knowledge or defective logic. For example, Anthony Kenny concluded his examination of Thomas Aquinas' famous Five Ways by saying that they "fail . . . principally because it is much more difficult than at first appears to separate them from their background in medieval cosmology".[1]

If a person has both of these reactions to exemplary writings of Scholastic philosophers, and also aims at improving natural theology, she may be motivated to modernize Scholasticism by putting sophisticated instruments of contemporary analytic philosophy into its toolbox. A small minority of analytic philosophers is engaged in this enterprise, and there even is a Journal of Analytical Scholasticism. Undoubtedly, the Marist priest and Australian philosopher Barry Miller (1923-2006) was an important pioneer of Analytic Scholasticism. Since he is well-known neither outside of Australia nor among analytic philosophers, we should welcome this concise and lucid introduction to his works by Elmar J. Kremer. As a believing Catholic and an Emeritus Professor of Philosophy at the University of Toronto, with great expertise on "Le Grand" Antoine Arnauld and the problem of evil, Kremer is well equipped to explain the subtleties of Miller's approach to God.

Kremer's declared aim is "to provide a clear exposition of Barry Miller's metaphysics, focused on questions about the existence and nature of God", leaving a more critical analysis "for other occasions" (p. 121, cf. p. 2). Indeed, non-religious readers may think that Kremer is sometimes too charitable in defending Miller's views. The book starts with a short first chapter on Miller's life and his philosophical journey. The second chapter summarizes Miller's arguments about existence in opposition to Frege, Russell, Quine, and against the view of many contemporary logicians. According to Miller, 'exists' should be seen as a predicate, and existence must be conceived of as an accidental real first-level property of contingent concrete individuals. This chapter may be of interest even to those who do not care about natural theology.

In the remainder of the book, Kremer discusses Miller's original and ambitious cosmological argument from contingency (Chapter 3), his radical conception of Divine simplicity (Chapter 4), some questions as to how this conception can be reconciled with the contingency of creatures and with human freedom (Chapter 5), and he answers objections to Miller's views raised by Graham Oppy, Katherin Rogers, and Bruce Langtry (Chapter 6). Kremer's treatment of these issues is based mainly on the trilogy in philosophical theology that Barry Miller published after his retirement in 1987: From Existence to God (1992), A Most Unlikely God (1996), and The Fullness of Being (2002). In this review, I shall discuss neither the historical adequacy of Kremer's summaries of Millerian natural theology, nor the precise way in which Miller updated Thomist conceptions. Let me first recapitulate Miller's life and philosophical journey, then discuss his argument to the effect that existence is a real property of individual entities, and finally criticize Miller's cosmological argument from contingency, as they are presented by Kremer.

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Born in Sydney in 1923, Miller first studied electrical engineering, and worked for Telecom until he entered the novitiate of the Society of Mary in 1953. He was ordained as a priest in 1957, after which he studied philosophy at the Angelicum in Rome, obtaining his doctorate in 1959. He then went to Cambridge, UK, doing a B.A., and visited Oxford in 1960, where he met Elizabeth Anscombe and Paul Grice. Back in Australia, Miller taught philosophy at the Marist seminary in Toongabbie (NSW) from 1961 until 1967. He had problems, however, because according to the Superior of the seminary his open-minded style of teaching "was not suitable for forming the students into disciples of Aquinas" (p. 6). Kremer summarizes in some detail the discussion between Miller and his Superior for the Marist Provincial Council.

Fortunately, there was no need to resolve the dispute at the Marist seminary in Toongabbie, since Miller accepted a temporary appointment at a Marist seminary in New Orleans. He used his year in the US to travel widely, to give talks at some universities, and he attended lectures by Geach, Quine, Sellars, Chisholm, Plantinga, and Bernard Williams. Upon his return to Australia in 1968, Miller obtained a position at the philosophy department of the University of New England, where he remained until his retirement in 1987. Apart from visits to the universities of Münster in West-Germany and of Notre Dame, he lived the remainder of his life in a suburb of Sydney, where he completed the trilogy in philosophical theology mentioned above. Apart from this trilogy, Miller published his doctorate, The Range of Intellect (1961), 39 philosophical articles in 1962-1994, and the entry on 'Existence' in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (1996, revised substantially in 2002; superseded by Michael Nelson's entry in 2012).

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To provide a first glimpse of Miller's cosmological argument from contingency for the existence of God, let me summarize it provisionally:

1. Existence is a real first-level accidental property of contingent individuals.

2. Concrete contingent individuals are distinct from their existence.

3. This distinction implies a paradox, unless:

4. All existing concrete contingent individuals are caused to exist by a necessarily existing and therefore uncaused individual that is identical with its existence, and this is God.

5. At least one concrete contingent individual exists, e.g., the dog Fido, or the universe.

6. Hence, God exists (from 1-5).

In this section, I shall briefly discuss Miller's arguments for the first premise, as they are summarized by Kremer.

Miller defines a property as "whatever is attributable to something by a predicate" (p. 20). Accordingly, the contention that existence is an accidental first-level property of contingent individuals may be justified initially by arguing that 'exists' can be predicated of individuals. Miller argues for this latter thesis simply by providing examples, such as 'Socrates exists' or 'Socrates no longer exists'. Furthermore, he concludes that existence is a real property as distinguished from "Cambridge properties", which he defines as properties "whose presence or absence does not make a real difference" to the individual that has them (p. 18, cf. Peter Geach on "Cambridge change"). For example, that I am now writing a review of Kremer's book is a Cambridge property of the book, and also of Kremer. Surely, however, Kremer's existence is not a Cambridge property of Kremer, if it is a property at all. Let us call this argument by examples for the thesis that existence is a real property Miller's prima facie argument.

As we all know, however, philosophers from Kant to Quine and beyond have argued that 'existence' is not a real first-order predicate, inter alia because the assumption that it is leads to paradoxes and absurdities. This is why Miller embarks on "the negative strategy" of attempting to refute such arguments. It is not necessary to discuss here all the attempted refutations Miller puts forward, for the simple reason that if he fails to refute convincingly only one plausible argument to the effect that existence is not a real predicate, his negative strategy is shipwrecked.

Let me take the so-called absurdity objection as an example (pp. 21-23). According to this objection, if existence is an accidental real first-order property of individual entities, so must non-existence be, but this would imply an absurdity. For in order to attribute truly a real property to a specific individual, we must be able to refer successfully to that individual by using a proper name, a pronoun, or by pointing to it, etc. However, we can refer successfully to an individual only if that individual exists or at least has existed, so that non-existence cannot be a real property. Hence existence cannot be an accidental real first-level property of individuals either.

Miller replies to this argument by claiming that whereas existence is a real property of individuals, non-existence is merely a Cambridge property. He proposes the following criterion for deciding whether the lack of a real property implies the presence of a real complementary property: "Lack of a real property F would bespeak the presence of a correlative real property non-F only if F and non-F were determinates of . . . one determinable property" (p. 23, quote from Miller). Since there is no determinable of which both existence and non-existence are determinates (like red and not-red may both be determinates of the determinable colour), non-existence is not a real property, but rather a Cambridge property. Hence, Miller rejects the premise of the absurdity objection.

I do not think that this refutation is convincing. Why endorse Miller's criterion? A person could just as well propose a similar criterion for deciding whether we are talking about real properties: all real properties are either determinates of determinables, or determinables of determinates. Since this is not the case for existence, existence cannot be a real property. Furthermore, non-existence cannot be a Cambridge property, contrary to what Miller claims. He defined a Cambridge property as a property the presence or absence of which does not make a real difference to the individual that has it. Is it true, or is it even meaningful to say, that it makes no real difference to the goddess Athena whether she has the property of non-existence or not? Moreover, whereas all Cambridge properties are relational (p. 29), non-existence is not relational.

Finally, does Miller succeed in refuting the Kantian argument to the effect that existence is not a real property? According to this argument, it is always possible to assert of one and the same entity (described by a list of its properties) both that it exists and that it does not exist. It follows from this plausible premise that existence cannot be a property (Critique of Pure Reason, A600/B628). Miller answers by stipulating that although existence is a real first-order property of concrete individuals, it differs from all other properties in two respects. First, existence does not add anything to what the individual is, and second, it does not add anything to an antecedent reality (p. 38). In my view, however, this stipulation amounts to changing the ordinary meaning of the term 'property', so that Miller's reply to Kant commits a fallacy of ambiguity. I conclude that Miller does not succeed in establishing that existence is a real accidental first-level property of concrete individuals.

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Let us now assume, for the sake of argument, that Miller's first premise is true: existence is a real accidental first-order property of concrete individuals. How does Miller build his cosmological argument from contingency on this first premise? That is, how does he argue for premises 2-4 mentioned above?

Like Frege, Miller holds that logic is a reliable guide to ontology. If, therefore, the proper name 'Fido' and the predicate or function 'is black' are constituent parts of the proposition 'Fido is black', the state of affairs that makes this proposition true must also consist of two distinct constituent parts, Fido and his instantiated blackness. As we saw, Miller distinguished sharply between ordinary properties such as blackness and the property of existence in his failed attempt to answer Kant. Surprisingly, however, he now assumes in his argument for a "constituent ontology" of existence that "'Fido exists' is an atomic proposition on all fours with 'Fido is black'" (p. 53, cf. 59). He concludes that both Fido and his instantiated existence are constituents, that is, ontologically prior parts, of the state of affairs that makes 'Fido exists' true. In other words, concrete individuals must be distinct from their existence (2, above).

But this constituent ontology of existence leads to a paradox. If Fido and his existence are parts of Fido's existence that are ontologically prior to the whole, Fido must somehow pre-exist his own existence, which seems to be contradictory. Miller concludes that Fido must have a "capacity to complete his existence" in virtue of "something other than either his being a concrete individual or his being an existing concrete individual" (p. 58, quote from Miller). He further argues that if this "something other" is also a contingently existing individual, the same conclusion would hold, and that this series of causes of Fido's existence cannot be infinite, so that there must be a first cause that is identical with its existence: God.

There is neither space nor need to go into all the details of Miller's cosmological argument from contingency, since it goes wrong from the very start. That parts are ontologically prior to the whole constituted by them holds for ontologically independent parts of a whole, such as the bricks of which a building is constructed. But it does not hold for property-instances, such as the blackness of Fido, which cannot exist apart from their bearers, whereas to apply the concept of ontologically prior parts to Fido and his existence, and to conceive of Fido's existence as constituted out of these parts, is nonsensical.

One may wonder who the intended audience is for both Miller's trilogy and Kremer's book. Kremer stresses repeatedly that Miller saw philosophy as "an active search for truth (irrespective of where it may be found)" (p. 2, quote from Miller; cf. pp. 8, 11). Allegedly, Miller's writing "was directed to anyone engaged with basic questions of metaphysics and prepared to approach them with careful argument in the style of analytic philosophy" (p. 3). Indeed, his later work "was produced for a secular, as opposed to a clerical, audience", Kremer avers (pp. 10, 11). I do not think, however, that Miller's excessively subtle and often fallacious arguments for the existence of God will convince any open-minded reader. In the end, Kremer reaches a more adequate diagnosis of Miller's philosophical attitude. Miller was a "man who does have a prompt will to believe and yet seeks reasons for what he believes, because he 'loves the truth that is believed'", as Aquinas said (p. 129). Whether these reasons are convincing for non-believers is quite another matter.


[1] Anthony Kenny, The Five Ways. St. Thomas Aquinas' Proofs of God's Existence. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1969, p. 3.