2014.11.01

Simon Lumsden

Self-Consciousness and the Critique of the Subject: Hegel, Heidegger, and the Post-Structuralists

Simon Lumsden, Self-Consciousness and the Critique of the Subject: Hegel, Heidegger, and the Post-Structuralists, Columbia University Press, 2014, 265pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231168229.

Reviewed by Henry Somers-Hall, Royal Holloway, University of London


Simon Lumsden's is an ambitious book that attempts to develop a new dialogue between Hegel and the post-structuralists, here represented by Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Lumsden sets out his aims in the introduction, which are to show that the poststructuralists have misinterpreted the nature of Hegel's philosophy, and in doing so, have failed both to develop effective criticisms of Hegel's thought, and to recognise affinities between their projects. After an opening chapter on Heidegger, Lumsden uses Fichte's critique of Kant to develop his reading of Hegel, before in the final three chapters returning to Heidegger and introducing the two poststructuralist thinkers to analyse their similarities and divergences from Hegel.

I will examine the book in three sections, before looking at some problems with its overall approach. I'll begin by looking at Lumsden's account of the philosophical narrative prior to Hegel, before looking at his reading of Hegel himself, and then his account of the poststructuralists, focusing on his reading of Deleuze. Lumsden's claim is that post-structuralism criticises the 'reflective and metaphysical character of subjectivity' (1), developing a narrative that runs from Descartes through Kant to Hegel with an increasing privileging of the spontaneous transparent subject. Lumsden argues that instead, if Hegel is a metaphysician at all, 'his metaphysics must be conceived as fundamentally post-Kantian.' (1) For Lumsden, Hegel's notion of self-consciousness is not transparent, and is essentially communitarian, borrowing, albeit with substantial reworking, from Kant's distinction between concepts and intuitions. It is by excising Kant's original formulation of the content/intuition distinction that Hegel is able to extend reason to objects themselves, and fulfil the central Kantian insight that 'reason must be understood as reflectively determining its own norms by virtue of its capacity for self correction.' (16) This overcomes the essentially subjective structure found in Kant's model.

Lumsden reads Kant's project as essentially arguing that 'reason must, by virtue of its own capacity for self-correction, be considered as establishing and legitimating its own norms.' (70) While this involves a step beyond Descartes' uncritical metaphysics, Kant's attempt to develop this project is hamstrung by his belief that reason must relate to a domain of empirical objects given in intuition. Lumsden claims not to defend Hegel's critique of Kant against the well rehearsed objections of Henry Allison and others, (75-6) and in fact, rather than working through Hegel's arguments in detail (found, for instance, in the Science of Logic's doctrine of essence and the Phenomenology's analysis of force and understanding), he focuses on asserting that overcoming this distinction between concepts and intuition is necessary to avoid tensions in Kant's position, and to fulfil the project of seeing reason as self-determining without falling into subjectivity. His account of the limitations of Kant is developed through a reading of the immediate response to Kant, particularly Fichte's denial of the phenomenal/noumenal distinction. I want to briefly look at two aspects of Kant's project, downplayed by Lumsden, that play an important role in showing the limitations of his analysis: the character of intuition in Kant's project, and the importance for Kant of providing a critique of reason.

In introducing Kant's distinction between intuitions and concepts, Lumsden glosses them as 'broadly correspond[ing] to the opposing approaches to knowledge of Locke and Leibniz,' (74) with intuition thereby adding the empiricist moment to his theory of experience. The difficulty with this gloss is that Kant's intuitions (space and time) are not the empiricist basis for knowledge, but are rather the conditions for the kind of knowledge empiricism is based on. While impressions differ in degree from ideas for the empiricists, the structure of Kantian intuition differs in kind from conceptual forms. The fact that space and time are not discursive is one of the key reasons for Kant's adoption of transcendental idealism, as it precludes any kind of rationalist reduction of experience to concepts. The recognition of this fundamental moment of non-discursivity is something that separates the poststructuralists from Hegel, but its importance is not addressed by Lumsden. The second issue with Lumsden's account of Kant's project is his characterisation of it as the self-grounding of reason. Kant's notion of critique in fact leads to a far more ambivalent relation to reason than Lumsden allows. In the transcendental dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant sets out the claim that reason operates according to rules which, while legitimate when used to organise experience, lead us into error when disconnected from experience (and hence intuition). For instance, when we consider the universe as a whole (which cannot be given in experience), we fall into antimonies of reason, able to prove by rational argument alone that the universe both has and does not have a beginning in time. Kant went so far as to take this need for reason not to be autonomous, but to relate to a sensuous manifold, as being an indirect proof for transcendental idealism itself.

This notion of transcendental illusion is one taken up by many of the poststructuralists, but it is something that Lumsden does not engage with. In fact, his account of Kant itself falls prey to the paralogism that Kant claims to find in Descartes. In the transcendental deduction, Kant begins by moving from the claim that we are able to apply the term 'I think' to all of our representations to the claim that our experience is unified. While the 'I think' is accessible to us, the aspect of the self that actually unifies experience cannot be accessible. Since what unifies our experience must be prior to the kinds of categories it uses to give that unity to experience (categories such as substance and causation), we cannot apply those categories to it. Descartes' mistake, according to Kant, was to apply a category that can only be applied to objects of experience (substance) to that which makes experience possible (the transcendental unity of apperception). Descartes' 'thinking thing' thus invalidly unites the phenomenal and transcendental aspects of the self. As the paralogisms and antinomies demonstrate, Kant's project is far more nuanced than simply allowing reason to ground itself. It also calls for the recognition that reason cannot function purely autonomously without falling into error.

At points, Lumsden similarly does not seem to recognise the difference between the two moments of Kant's self. Rather than simply a phenomenal echo of the transcendental unity of apperception, Lumsden takes the 'I think' to actually accompany all of our representations (34), taking it for the synthetic subject itself. 'Kant's subject is unified and is identical throughout all its acts of representation.' (14) At other points, Lumsden does recognise a split in Kant's subject, but seems to understand it as a split between the conceptual self and the intuitive self, rather than between the empirical (which is determined by concepts and intuitions) and the transcendental (which is undetermined) (212). The nuances of Kant's project play an important role both in broadening out the definition of what it is to be post-Kantian, but also in the development of alternatives to Hegel's thought. Lumsden's reading of Kant sees him as essentially failing in a classical metaphysical project of relating categories to objects, rather than succeeding in redefining the nature of objectivity in terms of law-governed experience. Somewhat ironically, this metaphysical reading of Kant makes Lumsden's 'post-Kantian' Hegel look decidedly precritical at points.

Traditionally, contradiction has been a major part of the interpretation of Hegelian dialectics. If Kant is right that reason operating autonomously leads to contradiction, then Hegel can be said to bite the bullet, and to include contradiction as a real feature of the world. He writes in the Science of Logic, for instance, that the world is 'never and nowhere without contradiction.'[1] While Lumsden does recognise a role for contradiction, and the rejection of the logic of the understanding, his account argues that the dialectic is driven by a feeling of dissatisfaction within reason itself. The Phenomenology transitions between different accounts of consciousness and the object not because of the internal contradictions within a given shape of consciousness here. Rather, what drives reason to reject a given shape of consciousness is its sense that there is a 'background whole . . . in which all our norms are determined' (108) that exceeds the current shape of consciousness' determinations. Reason operates by making explicit these background assumptions, thus incorporating them into the conceptual scheme of consciousness itself. Lumsden sees this process as relying on a concept-intuition model, where background assumptions that are implicit and non-discursive (the intuitions) are gradually made explicit and brought into the domain of discursivity by reason. This process is ongoing, and leads to a dynamic, unstable model of consciousness unlike the account of Hegel's self which Lumsden attributes to the post-structuralists. There are a number of issues with this account that are worth raising.

Viewing the process of the Phenomenology itself as making intuition discursive leads to a number of potential problems, some textual, and some logical. First, the process of incorporation of intuitions into self-consciousness doesn't seem to capture the radical break we find with the categorial transitions of the Phenomenology. Lumsden presumably has to play down Hegel's claim that consciousness is not so much destabilised as destroyed by its dialectical transitions. Similarly, for Hegel, consciousness suffers despair as it moves through the Phenomenology and discovers its worldviews to be self-contradictory, rather than appearing prior to this as reason's intimation of the limits of its present view. For Lumsden, 'Thought is unsettled precisely because it is oriented by more than what it can, at any given point in time, explicitly affirm to be a determination of itself.' (108) As such, Lumsden must situate this despair as prior to the breakdown of consciousness, and as continuous. Second, in making what drives reason its recognition of a broader view of the world than what is represented in its present categories, Lumsden appears to present a different origin to our categories of thought than Hegel does. Traditionally, Hegel's account of categories is read as seeing new ways of viewing the world as emerging immanently from the failure of our present beliefs. While these categories may imply that our understanding of the world must be mediated by the broader community, the categories themselves are not a product of that community, but of the contradictions of a prior form of consciousness. By beginning with the simple structure of sense-certainty (the simple truth that there is something before consciousness, with no attempt to qualify this thatness), Hegel attempts to demonstrate that reason is led necessarily to a belief in the adequacy of discursive thought to being. For Lumsden, on the contrary, our categories of thought are 'intersubjectively derived', (106) and form the 'collective human determination' (105) of the community, rather than emerging immanently from the dialectic. Presumably Hegel would want to say that regardless of the actual assumptions of a community, the process of dialectical transition of the Phenomenology holds.

Lumsden's communitarian account runs the risk of making Hegel's project simply an attempt to explicate the structure of modern society. As he puts it at one point, 'the dialectic is an attempt to give philosophy a philosophical form that is adequate to the dynamism of modern life. This does not fix reality in any weighty metaphysical sense but simply tries to give an adequate philosophical expression of modern life.' (170) Furthermore, in seeing intuition as the implicit assumptions of a 'whole in which thought is situated' (108), we lose the character of the dialectical transitions of the Phenomenology as being genuinely creative. Lumsden renders it a process of discovery, and translation of the implicit into the explicit, rather than a creative enterprise. It also becomes a project guided by a telos that precedes it in the form of the structure of society already implicitly accepted by the subject. Both of these results form the basis for much of the post-structuralism opposition to Hegelian dialectics, which is often taken to be conservative, rather than creative, and one wonders whether this account of the self-validation of community norms might be vulnerable to the kinds of hermeneutics of suspicion found in Marx, Nietzsche and Freud. Finally, in making the process of incorporating implicit assumptions into reason the basis of Hegel's project, Lumsden's account makes Hegel's project one that extends indefinitely, as the discursive expands to incorporate the infinite content of intuition. Such a process resembles Hegel's spurious infinite rather than the good infinite that Hegel takes to provide an adequate account of the world. While there may be solutions to all of these problems, Lumsden does little to defend his reading against these potential criticisms, which serves to weaken his conclusions.

Lumsden's characterisation of the relationship between concepts and intuitions feels closer to a form of Leibnizianism, where intuitive structures are the result of confused perceptions of what an infinite being would regard as conceptual truths, rather than Kant's difference in kind. Ironically, this kind of Leibnizian model was the reason for Kant's adoption of a model of intuition as different in kind from conceptual determinations, following the perceived failure of Leibniz to successfully defend his position in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence. Here, perhaps, returning to Kant, we find the key difference between Hegel and the post-structuralists. Whereas Kant and the post-structuralists consider intuition (and related concepts) to be essentially non-discursive, Hegel (and Lumsden) consider them to be only accidentally non-discursive, but not inherently incommensurate with reason. Perhaps rather than being a post-Kantian Hegel, then, Lumsden presents a post-Leibnizian Hegel.

In the critical portion of his study, Lumsden argues that both Derrida and Deleuze derive their critiques of Hegel from Heidegger's critique of the metaphysics of presence. In the first chapter he briefly develops this account, focusing on Heidegger's criticism of Descartes' attempt to develop a purely epistemic account of our relation to the world. This short opening account of Heidegger's criticism of Hegel is supplemented in chapter 4 by an extended treatment of Heidegger. In keeping with Lumsden's focus on the notion of self-consciousness, his account of Heidegger focuses on the structures of das Man, and of care. His analysis of Heidegger is relatively standard, tracing Dasein's inauthentic understanding while caught in das Man through anxiety to an authentic understanding of itself as care.

Lumsden takes issue with the process whereby Dasein comes to recognise the individuality of its relationship to the world and to death. For Heidegger, this move from das Man to a concernful relationship to the world occurs through the call of conscience. As Lumsden notes, conscience has a divided structure, as while Dasein calls itself to conscience, the caller and the hearer are not the same Dasein: one is individuated while the other is lost in das Man. Lumsden claims that this model of the self is antithetical to that found in German idealism. 'Conscience calls itself; it does not posit, determine, or legislate for itself. . . . The call comes to Dasein in such a way (in silence) that it cannot be understood as spontaneous or self-caused, even though it issues from Dasein itself.' (133) Given the similarly complex relationship between the transcendental ego and the empirical ego that Kant develops in the paralogisms, and the centrality of possibility to Dasein, we might take issue with this characterisation. Perhaps more important is Lumsden's conclusion that 'Heidegger . . . is content to let the divisions [at the heart of self-consciousness] lie.' (137) The use of the word 'content' here captures one of the central problems with Lumsden's account of post-structuarlism. He appears to suggest that Heidegger's refusal to accept a Hegelian account of self-consciousness amounts to something like bloody-mindedness, rather than being a motivated (if potentially flawed) attempt to account for aspects of our existence such as thrownness and the intentional nature of consciousness that may rule out such an account.

I want to pass over the reading of Derrida relatively quickly to focus on the review of Deleuze. Suffice to note that Lumsden reads Derrida's project of explaining the instability of the subject of the modern world as very close to Hegel's own project. He accuses Derrida of tilting at windmills with his criticisms of Hegel's dialectic, by taking the dialectic to be an attempt to explain the basic structure of the world. Lumsden concentrates on the Derridean category of 'differance', noting its quasi-transcendental role. As Lumsden notes, the singular character of differance prevents its incorporation into the dialectic. Whereas Hegel, therefore, allows the domain of discursivity to be expanded by the incorporation of intuition, Derrida's singular differance 'is not able to provide the resources for the transformation of [the ethical life] since it is wholly other to our sense-making practices.' (176) Leaving aside the difficult question of whether Derrida's philosophy is capable of a coherent ethical programme, Lumsden is correct that the disagreement between Hegel and Derrida rests on whether there is something incommensurate with discursivity. Lumsden once again presents as a choice what for Derrida is a principled objection to Hegel. Derrida's differance is indeed different in kind from the discursive, but this is because it is what makes possible the space of discursivity. In Positions, he writes, 'differance, as that which produces different things, that which differentiates, is the common root of all of the oppositional concepts that mark our language, such as, to take only a few examples, sensible/intelligible, intuition/signification, nature/culture, etc.'[2] Differance is what sets up the kinds of logical structures necessary to make sense of the world conceptually. It cannot be the condition of discursivity without itself being non-discursive. As such, differance is close to Kant's transcendental unity of apperception, and is similarly prone to a transcendental illusion where discursivity is extended beyond its proper domain. In this respect, as their principle target is the dialectical process, Derrida's arguments are just as applicable to Lumsden's Hegel as to a more metaphysical Hegel. Now it may well be the case that Derrida's analysis proves to be unsustainable, but Lumsden does not show why this might be the case.

I want to focus a little more closely on Lumsden's final reading, which is of Deleuze. His analysis sees Deleuze as heavily influenced by Heidegger in his criticisms of Hegel. He claims that Deleuze sees the origins of Hegel's failures in Descartes' inauguration of modern philosophy. Finally, he sees Deleuze's challenge as reinstating the singularity of sensibility against the universalist discursivity of Hegel. Each of these three claims is problematic; together they present a misreading of Deleuze's philosophy, which means Lumsden's analysis substantially misses its mark.

To begin with, Lumsden claims that 'Heidegger's argument for reading modern philosophy as the metaphysics of presence defines the approach that Derrida and Deleuze take towards German idealism.' (218) He presents no textual evidence to support this claim, however, and it is certainly one at odds with Deleuze's own stated views. In Dialogues II, for instance, Deleuze groups Hegel and Heidegger together, along with Husserl, as the 'three H's', and blames them for a 'scholasticism worse than that of the Middle Ages'[3] (12) that pervaded the Sorbonne after the Liberation. Aside from a brief mention of Nietzsche's influence, Lumsden does not discuss the figures Deleuze explicitly acknowledges as major influences, such as Bergson and Spinoza. While there may indeed be an influence of Heidegger on Deleuze's thought, one would be hard pressed to make a case for it being Heidegger's analysis of care. Lumsden hardly touches on the central question of Heidegger's thought -- the ontological difference between being and beings. This is unfortunate, as insofar as Heidegger influences the post-structuralists, it seems to be this distinction that forms the basis for their disagreements with Hegel.

Second, Lumsden claims that the origin for Deleuze of the problems we find with philosophy occurs with Descartes ('the image and moral that took hold of philosophy was -- like so many other problems in modern philosophy -- initiated by Descartes.' (183)). This claim helps Lumsden to emphasise the centrality of self-consciousness in his reading of Deleuze's critique of Hegel. It is a claim that is difficult to square with the text, however. The first chapter of Difference and Repetition begins not with Descartes but with Aristotle, and 'the task of modern philosophy' is not taken by Deleuze to be the refutation of Descartes, but 'to overturn Platonism.'[4] The introduction of Plato, a figure not discussed by Lumsden at all, implies that the critique of the subject may not be the 'cornerstone' of Deleuze's thought, but rather that it is the limitation of traditional philosophy's account of thinking more generally that is problematic. While this may imply a criticism of self-consciousness, Lumsden's focus on self-consciousness risks taking the implication for the criticism itself. While self-consciousness is the focus of Deleuze's polemical reading of Hegel in Nietzsche and Philosophy, for instance, his more sophisticated account in Difference and Repetition instead focuses on the dialectical categories of the finite and infinite, and Hegel's inability to think difference adequately.

Finally, turning to Lumsden's account of Deleuze's philosophy itself, Lumsden claims that 'what Hegel considers "left over" is picked up and made the centre of Deleuze's philosophical project' (180), namely the sensible object outside of its conceptual determinations. Lumsden claims that what Deleuze is interested in is 'empirical difference' (181). As he puts it, 'Sensations, in the way Deleuze understands them, are "grasped" not as representations of objects, but rather as "a range of affective tones".' (185) Sensibility therefore becomes 'a kind of ground of thought that is prior to and other to the structures of recognition by which thought is traditionally understood.' (185) In effect, Lumsden's reading of Deleuze sees him as reiterating Feuerbach's philosophical position that philosophy must begin with the concrete object, and not with the universal. This is a view Deleuze explicitly rejects, claiming that Feuerbach is wrong to consider that 'this exigency of a true beginning is met by beginning with empirical, perceptible, and concrete being.'[5]

Here, Lumsden misreads Deleuze's claim that he is interested in 'that which can only be sensed' (185). By this phrase, Deleuze plays on the two meanings of 'sense', but he makes it clear that by 'that which can only be sensed', he means that which is only intimated in the sensible object ('What is it that can only be sensed, yet is imperceptible at the same time?'[6]). Just as with Derrida, what Deleuze is interested in is the investigation of the non-discursive conditions that give rise to discursive thought. His criticism of Hegel, once again returning to Kant, is that thinking suffers from a transcendental illusion when it attempts to investigate its conditions, falsifying them through the illegitimate application of the structures of discursivity (the 'shackles of representation') beyond their appropriate domain. Thus, Deleuze takes up Kant's suggestion that reason acting autonomously tends towards paralogism and transcendental illusion. Lumsden does not address Deleuze's philosophical arguments against Hegel in detail. He concludes the chapter by declaring that

in Deleuze's case, the movement of global capital and trade, the shifting allegiances of modern society and politics, and the wholesale transformation of cultural life in the modern world mean that the animating German idealist concern, that a subject could be at home with itself in modern life, is a philosophical project that is inadequate to late capitalism. (216)

Such a summary risks reading Deleuze's philosophical arguments as merely sociological description, and ignoring Deleuze's own characterisation of himself as a 'pure metaphysician', thus missing the force of his challenge to Hegel.

Some of these limitations in Lumsden's reading of post-structuralism perhaps emerge from his assertion, repeated at several points, that there is a 'biographical origin' (13) to poststructuralism's hostility to Hegel. Of course, philosophical disagreements always have a biographical element -- Kant focuses on Leibniz, or Aristotle on Plato, because of their historical relations -- but Lumsden's claim seems more to suggest that philosophical objections to Hegel are forced, or at least secondary. Similarly, while the claim is made several times that 'poststructuralism does not consider the idea that Hegel could be a post-Kantian thinker,' (18) and that 'the broad claim [for the poststructuralists] is that Hegel resolves the residual problems in Kant's thought by regressing to a precritical monistic spirit' (163), no evidence is provided for these claims, which are, at least in the case of Deleuze, false. There are also some strange omissions from the bibliography of Self-Consciousness and the Critique of the Subject. Lumsden doesn't refer at any point to Heidegger's Hegel's Concept of Experience, Derrida's book on Hegel, Glas, or Deleuze's early review article of Hyppolite's Logic and Existence, where he sets out the differences of his own philosophical project from Hegel's. These kinds of issues together raise doubts about the success of Lumsden's enterprise in charting the interrelations of Hegel and the poststructuralists.


[1] Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Hegel's Science of Logic, Humanities Press International, 1989, 238.

[2] Jacques Derrida, Positions, University of Chicago Press, 1982, 9.

[3] Gilles Deleuze, Negotiations, 1972-1990, Columbia University Press, 1995, 12.

[4] Gilles Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, Columbia University Press, 1994, 59.

[5] ibid., 319.

[6] ibid., 143.