2014.11.06

Trent Dougherty and Justin P. McBrayer (eds.)

Skeptical Theism: New Essays

Trent Dougherty and Justin P. McBrayer (eds.), Skeptical Theism: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2014, 337pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661183.

Reviewed by Graham Oppy, Monash University


This aptly named book contains twenty-three new essays. In the preface, the authors say that (a) the collection moves the debate over the viability of sceptical theism forward; (b) the contributors are (fairly evenly) divided between established scholars in the field and up-and-coming scholars working in philosophy of religion; and (c) they aimed for a collection that is balanced. I think it fair to say that the collection does move the debate forward, that there is a nice division between established and up-and-coming scholars, and that there are many respects in which it is balanced. However, it will not go unremarked elsewhere that what is perhaps the standout essay -- by Lara Buchak -- is also the only chapter written by a woman.

There is a large existing literature on sceptical theism. Some of the major contributors to it -- e.g., the late William Alston, William Hasker, Justin McBrayer, Alvin Plantinga, Michael Rea, William Rowe, Bruce Russell and Peter van Inwagen -- are not represented in this volume while other major contributors -- e.g., Michael Bergmann, Paul Draper, Daniel Howard-Snyder, Stephen Maitzen, J. L. Schellenberg, and Stephen Wykstra -- have new contributions here.

The book is divided into four parts. I shall consider each in turn.

Part I, 'Knowledge and Epistemic Humility', kicks off with a pair of papers that continue the exchange between Jonathan Matheson and Trent Dougherty over the consistency of sceptical theism with commonsense epistemology. Matheson argues that Weak Sceptical Theism -- the claim that, if an individual is on balance justified in believing that she is in no position to judge whether particular evils are gratuitous, then she is not on balance justified in believing that any particular evil is gratuitous -- is consistent with Phenomenal Conservatism -- the claim that, if it seems to S as if P, then S thereby has at least prima facie justification for believing that P. According to Matheson, if a person is on balance justified in believing that she is in no position to judge whether particular evils are gratuitous, then any direct evidence that that person has for the claim that particular evils are gratuitous will be fully defeated. (7) The main claim that Dougherty seeks to defend 'goes in the other direction': a person to whom it seems obvious that there are gratuitous evils will be, on balance, justified in rejecting the claim the she is in no position to judge whether particular evils are gratuitous. (23) According to Dougherty, sceptical theists have almost universally held that, owing to the truth of the sceptical theists' sceptical theses, no one anywhere has any reason to disbelieve in God on the basis of facts about evil. While there are many interesting questions of detail that are taken up in this discussion -- concerning, for example, the distinction between rebutting and undercutting defeaters, and the merits of Bayesian epistemology -- it is a curious feature of the discussion that it is far from clear that the main claims of the two protagonists are jointly inconsistent: Matheson's Weak Sceptical Theism does not entail the view that Dougherty claims sceptical theists have almost universally held.

Part I also contains an interesting exchange between Chris Tucker, Todd Long, and E. J. Coffman. Tucker defends two claims: (a) if true, the sceptical theists' sceptical theses prevent some people from obtaining any justification whatsoever to doubt the existence of God from their encounters with evils; and (b) since the sceptical theists' sceptical theses tell us nothing about whether we have rational, non-inferential means of recognising that there are gratuitous evils, encounters with evil may justify some who take those evils as sufficient grounds to reject the claim that God exists. (45) Long argues that there is a version of sceptical theism -- 'minimal sceptical theism' -- that is strong enough to prevent anyone from obtaining even the slightest justification to doubt the existence of God on the basis of encounters with evil. In his view, in appreciating how limited with respect to knowledge, power and goodness we are in relation to that which would be had by a perfect creator were there to be one, we come to have reason to be in doubt about whether our thoughts about what would justify a perfect creator in allowing evil track what would be a perfect creator's justifying purposes. (74) Coffman argues that, while Long is mistaken in supposing that his minimal sceptical theism is strong enough to prevent anyone from obtaining even the slightest justification to doubt the existence of God on the basis of encounters with evil, Tucker is mistaken in thinking that encounters with evil may justify some who take those evils as sufficient grounds to reject the claim that God exists. In particular, according to Coffman, the truth of the claim that at best we have undefeated reason to withhold judgment on whether the total value we perceive in certain states of affairs accurately reflects the total moral value they really have plays a crucial role in defeating the suggestion that encounters with evil may justify some who take those evils as sufficient grounds to reject the claim that God exists. (84)

Part II, 'Debating CORNEA' (where CORENA = Condition of Reasonable Epistemic Access), contains a very interesting exchange between Paul Draper, Timothy Perrine and Stephen Wykstra, and Lara Buchak.

Draper argues that if, on the assumption that God exists, we grant that we would not expect to know God's reasons for permitting certain evils, then (a) CORNEA's core shows that our inability to adequately explain the existence of those evils in terms of theism is not strong evidence against theism; but (b) CORNEA's core fails to show that the evils themselves are not strong evidence against theism. (Draper distinguishes three readings of CORNEA's core: STRONG CORE (in cognitive situation S, Pr(E/H) is many times greater than Pr(E/~H) only if, relative to S, Pr(E/~H) < 0.5); SIGNIFICANT CORE (in cognitive situation S, Pr(H/E) - Pr(H) is large only if, relative to S, Pr(E/~H) < 0.5); and LEVERING CORE (in cognitive situation S, E is evidence that would make a positive difference of close to 0.5 to the probability of H if the probability of H independent of E were close to 0.5 only if, relative to S, Pr(E/~H) < 0.5). He notes that, while STRONG CORE and LEVERING CORE are true, SIGNIFICANT CORE is false.)

Next, Perrine and Wykstra argue that, despite Draper's claims to the contrary, there is a moderate sceptical theism that defeats Draper's well-known evidential argument from evil. They formulate Draper's argument as:

SIMPLER: Naturalism is a much simpler hypothesis than theism.

FITTER: Naturalism has a better predictive fit than theism regarding the data of good and evil.

NO-OFFSETTER: There are no epistemic advantages that theism has over naturalism such that those features, when combined, suffice to offset the epistemic advantage naturalism has over theism (if SIMPLER and FITTER are true)

FALSER: (Therefore) Theism is probably false. (145)

The moderate sceptical theism that Perrine and Wykstra recommend conjoins the following four theses: (1) we should be very confident in our ability to discern some of the goods that God values and some of the evils that God disvalues; (2) we should have middling to low confidence in our ability to discern connections between the goods we discern God to value and God's allowing specific instances of suffering; (3) we should be maximally uncertain that we can discern all of the goods that God values and the relative weights of those that we can and can't discern; and (4) we should be maximally uncertain that we can discern all the connections holding between all the goods God values and all God's acts of allowing suffering. (160) According to Perrine and Wykstra, a moderate sceptical theist will insist that, while it may be that naturalism has a better predictive fit than naive theism to the data concerning good and evil, there is no reason to doubt that better versions of theism will have an equally good fit to that data without yielding some other epistemic advantage to naturalism. Moreover, we cannot now determine that evidence is relevant only to NO-OFFSETTER and not to FITTER, because evidence plays a crucial role in determining which are the better versions of theism.

Draper responds with a range of criticisms of Perrine and Wykstra, diagnosing both 'misunderstandings' and 'mistakes'. In particular, he suggests that they make a mistake that can be brought out with the following analogy. Suppose that three balls are drawn randomly from four urns. According to theory-12, the balls all come from either the first or second urn; according to theory-34, the balls all come from either the third or fourth urn. As it happens, the first, third and fourth urns all contain 900 yellow balls and 100 purple balls, while the second urn contains 3 yellow balls and 997 purple balls. There are two versions of each of the theories: there is a version of theory-12 on which all of the balls come from the first urn, and there is a version of theory-12 on which all of the balls come from the second urn; there is a version of theory-34 on which all of the balls come from the third urn, and there is a version of theory-34 on which all of the balls come from the fourth urn. That the first ball drawn is yellow favours theory-34 over theory-12 and the first version of theory-12 over the second version of theory-12. However, if the next two balls that are drawn are also yellow, it remains the case that the total evidence favours theory-34 over theory-12, even though there is a version of theory-12 that fits the data just as well as theory-34. By analogy, theory-versioning cannot help theists avoid the implications of the distribution of goods and evils in our world. (175-76)

Buchak takes up the cudgels on behalf of Perrine and Wykstra. Granted, in Draper's analogy, the total evidence favours theory-34 over theory-12. But how are we to compare theory-1 -- the 'updated' theory, which says that all of the balls came from the first urn -- with theory-34? There are two different ways that we might have updated. On the one hand, we might have followed Draper in updating by conditionalisation: in that case, we shall suppose that theory-34 is better confirmed by the evidence than theory-1. On the other hand, we might have updated the conditional -- if theory-12 is true, then theory 1 is true -- without lowering the probability of the antecedent: in that case, we shall not suppose that theory-34 is better confirmed by the evidence than theory-1. If we understand Perrine and Wykstra to take theory-versioning to be updating on a conditional without lowering the probability of its antecedent, then -- according to Buchak -- Draper's objection is not decisive. (185)

Part III, 'Sceptical Theism's Implications for Theism', kicks off with an exchange between J. L. Schellenberg and Michael Bergmann. Schellenberg argues that, if sceptical theism undermines ways of justifying atheistic belief, then there is a kind of sceptical atheism that undermines ways of justifying theistic belief. In particular, sceptical atheists can appeal to principles such as:

SA1: We have no good reason for thinking that the considerations opposing the epistemic force of religious experience we know of are representative, relative to the property of (potentially) figuring in an undefeated defeater of religious experience as justification for theistic belief, of the considerations opposing the epistemic force of religious experience there are.

SA2: We have no good reason for thinking that the arguments from horrors or hiddenness against theism we know of are representative, relative to the property of (potentially) constituting a successful proof that theism is false, of the arguments from horrors or hiddenness against theism there are.

SA3: We have no good reason for thinking that the possible goods we know of are representative, relative to the property of consistency with a person being axiologically ultimate, of the possible goods there are.

According to Schellenberg, there is no non-arbitrary way for theists to discriminate between these principles, and the kinds of principles that are commonly taken to be definitive of sceptical theism, e.g., Bergmann's principles (as formulated by Schellenberg):

ST1: We have no good reason for thinking that the possible goods we know of are representative, relative to the property of figuring in a (potentially) God-justifying reason for permitting such things as hiddenness or horrors, of the possible goods there are.

ST2: We have no good reason for thinking that the possible evils we know of are representative, relative to the property of figuring in a (potentially) God-justifying reason for permitting such things as hiddenness or horrors, of the possible evils there are.

ST3: We have no good reason for thinking that the entailment relations we know of between possible goods and the permission of possible evils are representative, relative to the property of figuring in a (potentially) God-justifying reason for permitting such things as hiddenness or horrors, of the entailment relations there are between possible goods and the permission of possible evils.

More generally, Schellenberg suggests that sceptical theists should look with some fondness on what he calls total evidence scepticism: the claim that, for many a proposition expressing a belief or potential belief of ours, we have reason to doubt whether the total relevant evidence supports that proposition. (199)

Bergmann insists that his sceptical theses -- ST1-ST3 -- support only a limited scepticism about certain kinds of access to God's reasons: while these sceptical theses entail that we cannot know via inductive inference from known goods, evils and entailments between them that there are no God-justifying reasons for permitting certain evils, these sceptical theses do not entail that there is no other way in which we can come to have that knowledge. Moreover, he suggests that, without further information not yet supplied, it is unclear when Schellenberg supposes that his total evidence scepticism is to be applied; after all, if it applied always, then it would lead to an uninteresting global scepticism. (215)

Part IV, 'Sceptical Theism's Implications for Morality', kicks off with an exchange between Stephen Maitzen and Daniel Howard-Snyder. Maitzen's paper is a critical evaluation of Howard-Snyder's previously published 'Epistemic Humility, Arguments from Evil, and Moral Scepticism' (Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion 2). In particular, Maitzen claims that when it comes to the case of Ashley Jones -- a twelve-year old girl who, while babysitting her neighbour's children, was raped and bludgeoned to death by an escapee from a local juvenile detention centre -- 'commonsense morality' tells us (a) that we should be confident that we're obligated to intervene in Ashley's case, and (b) that we should not be confident that we have that obligation if -- as sceptical theists maintain -- we should be in doubt about (i) whether the goods we know of constitute a representative sample of all the goods there are and (ii) whether each good we know of is such that the necessary conditions of its realisation we know of are all the necessary conditions of its realisation that there are. (281) On Maitzen's account, commonsense morality is a hodgepodge of consequentialist and non-consequentialist considerations, but it nonetheless serves as a sound foundation for criticisms of sceptical theism.

Howard-Snyder says that something that more properly deserves to be called 'commonsense morality' tells us that we are not obligated to intervene provided that if, for all we can tell, there is a reason that would justify our non-intervention, then we have a sufficiently good reason not to intervene. In his view the fact that, for all we can tell, there is a reason that would justify our non-intervention is not a sufficiently good reason for us not to intervene. In the course of his discussion, Howard-Snyder draws an interesting distinction between a general principle that he attributes to Bergmann -- that we should believe something on the basis of something else only if we have good reason for thinking that the latter is a truth-conducive basis for believing the former -- and a general principle that he is himself prepared to endorse -- that we should believe something on the basis of something else only if it is not the case that we should be in doubt about whether the latter is a truth-conducive basis for believing the former.

I have not discussed all the chapters. In particular, I have not mentioned those by: John DePoe, N. N. Trakakis (Part I); Kenneth Boyce, M. J. Almeida (Part II); Wes Morriston, Erik Wielenberg, Andrew Cullison, Kevin Timpe (Part III); and Ted Poston (Part IV). Unlike those I have discussed, these chapters all stand alone: they are not parts of the book's wider exchanges . However, along with the chapters that I have discussed, they advance our understanding of sceptical theism. As a whole, the essays will set the agenda for discussion for many years to come.