2014.11.14

Adolf Grünbaum

Collected Works Volume 1: Scientific Rationality, the Human Condition, and 20th Century Cosmologies

Adolf Grünbaum, Collected Works Volume 1: Scientific Rationality, the Human Condition, and 20th Century Cosmologies, Thomas Kupka (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2013, 280pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199989928.

Reviewed by Gary L. Hardcastle, Bloomsburg University of Pennsylvania


More readily perhaps than most volumes of collected works, this volume, the first of three from Adolf Grünbaum, can be read with profit in two quite different ways. It can, and should, be read first for what it is, a collection of ten of Grünbaum's best-known essays on scientific "rationality" (three essays), "determinism and the human condition" (three as well), and "theological interpretations of twentieth-century physical cosmologies" (four essays, including "The Poverty of Theistic Cosmology," a 50-page tour de force). Forthcoming second and third volumes will assemble Grünbaum's most significant papers on the philosophy of physics and the philosophy (and particularly the methodology) of psychoanalysis respectively, two areas of research shaped in no small part by those very papers and for which Grünbaum is, arguably, better known. But it is a very good thing that we have in this initial volume Grünbaum taking up topics of more general appeal, and a wide range of them to boot. For as a result, the many who lack the special training (or interest) in space-time or psychoanalysis are nevertheless afforded a focused and unobstructed view of a first-rate philosophical mind in action.

Grünbaum's topics are wide-ranging, but not haphazard. Grünbaum is at pains, for example, to defend inductivism -- the notion that evidence that conforms to a hypothesis (under certain conditions) gives us reason to believe that hypothesis -- against its critics. He argues at great length that determinism (or, for that matter, indeterminism) is no threat to human free will, nor therefore to any science which attempts to study the "inner life of free choice." Grünbaum argues at greater length that theism is undeserving of the high moral ground it has appropriated, and that theism (like atheism) is "morally sterile," although atheism does fit comfortably within a secular humanism, which may in turn provide moral imperatives. In four successive essays, Grünbaum addresses several facets of the question of whether our most current understanding of the origin and nature of the cosmos warrants belief in the existence of a omniscient, omnipotent, and all-loving deity, taking up for example in the first of these the question of why anything exists at all, or, more carefully, why all the things that exist and yet might have not existed exist, as opposed to nothing that might not have existed existing. The claims of theists like Richard Swinburne and Philip Quinn that any satisfactory answer to this question requires theism depend, Grünbaum argues, on confusion and non sequiturs.

This last question Grünbaum dubs the "Primordial Existential Question" (p. 151), but in fact most of the questions Grünbaum takes up are primordial, albeit in the term's less grand sense. These essays concern existence, suffering, love, death, God, sex, passion, social activism, religion, evil, free will, and human nature, and, throughout, the capacity of reason to enable us to think clearly and correctly about these things. It is with these sorts of questions that philosophy begins, in the utterly prosaic sense that it is with these sorts of questions that many undergraduates enroll in Introduction to Philosophy. More generally, these are the sorts of questions that the non-philosophical public expects philosophers to be able to at least address, if not illuminate and answer.

Those who wisely applaud Grünbaum's attention to this broad range of philosophical topics will find much to praise in the approach he takes to them as well. The tenets of this approach, characteristic not just of Grünbaum but of generations of philosophers who look to, for example, Bertrand Russell, are something like the following: Knowing the true answer to the question at hand is of the greatest value. Logic is to be valued, and used, in the service of preserving truth. Clarity is of a piece with logic and is similarly prized, not just for its communicative function in truth-preservation but as a social marker of intellectual virtue (logic, after all, being sensitive only to the preservation of truth and exerting its force upon belief independently of an arguer's particular ends, is consequently of use only to those who seek nothing but the truth). And, lastly, the questions deemed worthy of one's attention are just those one encounters in the course of answering questions that confront all humans: what is this world, what are we in it, and how is it that we can know it?

Grünbaum doesn't exemplify this approach to philosophy so much as embody it. There is in every essay a certain care in definition, a recognizable laying-out of theses, and an even pace to the reasoning, reasoning which often depends upon nothing more intricate than modus ponens. The simple tools are, however, used with great skill. Consider Grünbaum's handling of the apparent incompatibility of holding a deterministic sociopolitical theory while also urging political action on behalf of the changes that, according to that very sociopolitical theory, are inevitable. If, for example, someone believes that a decline in protectionism, or a revolution of the proletariat, is inevitable, it might appear foolish at best for that person to lobby for protectionism or foment the revolution; sociopolitical determinism appears to undermine calls for political or social action. With particular clarity and force Grünbaum described the mistake in this line of reasoning in 1956:

the predictions made [by a sociopolitical theory] are predicated on the prior fulfillment of certain initial conditions which include the presence in that society of men who are dissatisfied with the existing state of affairs and are therefore actively seeking the future realization of the predicted social state. To ignore that the determinist rests his social prediction in part on the existence of the latter initial condition, just as much as a physicist makes a prediction of a thermal expansion conditional upon the presence of heat, is to commit the fallacy of equating determinism with fatalism. . . . Equally untenable is [the] claim that it is practically futile for determinists to weigh alternative modes of social organization with a view to optimizing their own social arrangements. For the determinist does not maintain, in fatalist fashion, that the future state of society is independent of the decisions which men make in response to (i) facts (both physical and social), (ii) their own interpretation of these facts . . . and (iii) their value objectives. (pp. 111-112; emphasis in original)

Determinism, far from being a threat to political and social activism, is a necessary condition of it.

The arguments and positions defended in this first volume are, on many occasions, not original to Grünbaum, nor of course does he claim they are. Readers are likely to find much more in the way of Grünbaum's distinct and original philosophical contributions in the subsequent volumes on space-time and psychoanalysis. This volume's considerable value is as a model of that philosophical approach mentioned above. As such, it will reward the attention given it by any professional or even aspiring philosopher, whatever her or his philosophical approach or inclination.

In keeping with his defense of social activism in the context of determinism, Grünbaum is hardly one to take the logical inevitability of his reasoning to subvert passionate argument in its favor, nor for that matter to forgo passionate expression of his views at any point. That passion usually, though not always, emerges in the course of criticism, with Grünbaum's most indignant (or, at turns, most gleeful) attacks directed at inconsistencies in the views of his opponents, especially Karl Popper.

Grünbaum's penchant for the critical volley, and for offering detailed recollections of such exchanges in his essays, will leave the reader impressed by the number of significant thinkers with whom Grünbaum has engaged, in real time. Aside from Popper, Swinburne, and Quinn, in the pages of this collection Grünbaum also tangles with William Bartley, W. v. O. Quine, William Lane Craig, and Irving Kristol. Noticing this leads one to read the book historically, that is, less as a document of distinctions, arguments, and theses than as a record of a particular, and very successful, philosophical practice, in and of a particular time and place. This is the second way in which this collection can be read with great profit, and read in this way it provides considerable insight into the philosophy of science, and analytic philosophy, in the middle of the 20th century.

In this regard, it is of use to briefly recount Grünbaum's significant role in the development of professional philosophy, especially in the United States. Hired away from Lehigh University in 1960 at age thirty-six by an ambitious Provost at the University of Pittsburgh, Grünbaum built that university's Department of Philosophy into one of international standing and influence, founding its Center for Philosophy of Science the year he arrived. It was under Grünbaum's leadership through the late-1960s that the Philosophy of Science Association established itself as an independent professional association, an achievement that has helped keep philosophical attention focused upon the philosophy of science since the 1970s. And it was Grünbaum who was, albeit to some degree accidentally, the focal point for one pole of the "Pluralist Revolt" within the American Philosophical Association in the late 1970s. Grünbaum's eventual election to the presidency of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1980, the putative end of the revolt, came on the heels of a letter from nine past Eastern Division presidents to five hundred APA members, endorsing Grünbaum, attacking the "Committee on Pluralism," and lobbying explicitly against its candidate, William Barrett (NYT 1/6/81). Any attempt to understand the professional and academic development of philosophy in the second half of the 20th century, especially in the United States, rather requires an understanding of Grünbaum and his work.

Comprising essays written before 1956 (though it is important to note that half of its essays appeared after 1990), then, this collection serves as an important and useful window through which to view earlier times and places in philosophy. One striking instance of this emerges from Grünbaum's 1962 essay, "The Falsifiability of Theories: Total or Partial? A Contemporary Evaluation of the Duhem-Quine Thesis." Here Grünbaum argues against Quine's dictum, from his "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" published ten years earlier, that "Any statement can be held true come what may, if we make drastic enough adjustments elsewhere in the system" (p. 63). Quine's essay has been understood and taught for decades as an attack on any notion of meaning strong enough to render certain sentences true purely by virtue of the meaning of their terms. But to Grünbaum the dictum poses a threat to the testability of theories, and therefore to scientific rationality. Thus the semantic adjustments (specifically, swapping the intensions of different words) that we now understand Quine to have had in mind when he wrote of making "drastic . . . adjustments elsewhere in the system" strike Grünbaum as a trivial means to secure the thesis; he dismisses them as such (pp. 64-66) and proceeds to argue against various non-trivial versions of the thesis.

It would not be correct to say that there was a misunderstanding of argument or even thesis between Quine and Grünbaum, but there is a profound difference over what might be described as the moral of Quine's arguments or, perhaps, the significance one accords to the semantic alterations Grünbaum regards as trivial. At the very least we must recognize that Grünbaum was reading Quine's "Two Dogmas" very differently than we read it now. Notably, included in this collection is a letter from Quine conceding the triviality of his thesis, allowing that he depended on it only in the course of denying that "the understanding of a term can be segregated from collateral information regarding the object" (Quine to Grünbaum, June 1, 1962, quoted p. 76).

The two ways of reading this book -- historically or (for lack of a better term) non-historically -- are compatible, even complementary. After all, every philosophical work is of a particular philosophical place and time, and deserves to be approached as such. And to identify a work as an outstanding bit of philosophy of its place and time is hardly to denigrate it. And in both respects, this collection shines.