Elijah Chudnoff


Elijah Chudnoff, Intuition, Oxford University Press, 2013, 245pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199683000.

Reviewed by John Bengson, University of Wisconsin-Madison

There is a long tradition in philosophy, going back to Plato and Descartes, of ascribing to the human intellect the power to directly apprehend, or intuit, abstract truths, without basis in sensory experience or mere relations of ideas. In the mid-twentieth century the tradition was opposed by Quine, whose radical empiricism (and naturalism) did not tolerate any such a priori exploits, and before him by Ayer and Carnap, whose semantic rationalism (and positivism) acknowledged the a priori but only as narrowly tied to conceptual understanding of analytic statements. Recent, post-Quinean philosophy has seen a resurgence of interest in rationalism -- what George Bealer has called a "rationalist renaissance". But many contemporary proponents, including Bealer, David Chalmers, Michael Huemer, Frank Jackson, Kirk Ludwig, Christopher Peacocke, and Ernest Sosa, still pursue a semantic rationalism, albeit one that makes room for the synthetic a priori by severing the link between conceptual understanding and analyticity, and which (Peacocke's version excepted) stresses an epistemic role for intuitions as conscious deliverances of the former. The Platonic or Cartesian rationalist view that intuition is a form of intellectual perception, affording epistemic access to abstract truths without mediation by conceptual understanding, remains relatively unpopular -- and unexplored -- by comparison.

Elijah Chudnoff's Intuition pursues this latter version of rationalism.[1] Its approach is largely phenomenological, employing first-personal reflection on what it is like for one to have or undergo various conscious mental states (events, etc.). The basic strategy is comparative, pursuing a view of intuition modeled on ordinary sensory experience. In fact, the book is nearly as much about sensory experience as intuition; with few exceptions, its central arguments and theses are claimed to hold mutatis mutandis for both. It also includes interesting discussions of imagination, reflection, inference, and more.

Chudnoff's treatments of various mental phenomena are phenomenologically astute, epistemologically nuanced, and metaphysically robust. They often speak directly to recent debates regarding sensory and cognitive phenomenology, phenomenal intentionality, and the epistemic significance of conscious experience. Regarding the latter, Chudnoff's novel phenomenological explanations of justification and knowledge, in particular, merit careful study by epistemologists and philosophers of perception. While the book is motivated primarily through its relevance to the theory of the a priori, and secondarily to the philosophy of mathematics (it is chock full of mathematical examples and directly tackles mathematical error and the access problem), its principal contribution is perhaps to the literature on phenomenal states at the intersection of philosophy of mind, epistemology, and metaphysics.

The introduction, which contains detailed chapter summaries, identifies five main theses:

Thesis 1: Intuitions are experiences, rather than beliefs or dispositions thereto.
Thesis 2: Intuitions justify belief.
Thesis 3: Intuitions ground knowledge by making thinkers aware of their subject matter.
Thesis 4: Intuitions' subject matter is abstract.
Thesis 5: Intuitions 

Several other theses are also defended along the way. A significant virtue is that the book does not seek simply to articulate and motivate these theses, but also attempts to answer, in an admirably unified way, a series of "how-possible" questions to which they give rise. How is it possible for these theses -- individually and jointly -- to be true? That is, what must intuitions be like so that they can be experiences, justify belief, ground knowledge, be about abstracta, and occur independently of sensory experience? This approach has the dual advantage of being philosophically rich and dialectically forceful. It also has the effect of forestalling the interrogations on which skepticism about intuition -- and, above all, Platonic rationalism -- standardly relies. If such skepticism does not wish to become merely idle, it must directly confront Chudnoff's answers.

Part I is on the nature of intuition. Its first chapter, "What Intuitions are Like", lays the foundations for the rest of the book, outlining an account of the nature, or basic metaphysical structure, of intuition that makes possible Chudnoff's answers to the above questions. This account is a specific version of Thesis 1 and is built around two main ideas.

The first idea, which Chudnoff labels 'Presentationality', is that intuitions are experiences with presentational phenomenology, where this involves having "a feeling of presence to mind" or "a 'consciousness of seizing upon' some subject matter" (4, the quoted expression is Husserl's). Chudnoff adopts a fairly specific view, or analysis, of what presentational phenomenology amounts to:

An experience has presentational phenomenology with respect to the proposition that p when it not only makes it seem to its subject that p, but also makes it seem to its subject as if it makes him or her aware of the very chunk of reality that makes p true. (18; cf. 37)

According to Chudnoff, in the familiar sensory experience of seeming to see a red light ahead, for example, it seems to you that there is a red light ahead, you seem to be aware of some concrete items (e.g., a light) in virtue of which this is true, and the former seeming seems to you to occur in virtue of the latter. Analogously, according to Chudnoff, in having the intuition that two circles can have at most two common points, it seems to you that two circles can have at most two common points, you seem to be aware of some abstract items (e.g., circularity) in virtue of which this is true, and the former seeming seems to you to occur in virtue of the latter.

The second idea is that, just as statues are constituted objects, built out of clay, metal, and other entities that are not themselves statues, intuitions are constituted experiences, built out of thoughts, imaginings, intentions, beliefs, and other mental states that are not themselves intuitions. Chudnoff labels this idea 'Constitutedness'.

Putting these ideas together, the resulting account of intuition can be reconstructed:

An intuition of a subject, S, is a conscious experience, E, such that

(i)             It seems to S that some proposition or propositions, p1 . . . pn, are true;

(ii)           S seems to be aware of some item or items (e.g., properties), o1 . . . on;

(iii)          o1 . . . on are (at least partly) what putatively make (at least some of) p1 . . . pn true;

(iv)          It seems to S that conditions (i-iii) hold in virtue of E;

(v)           o1 . . . on are putative abstracta;

(vi)          S undergoes conscious mental states, m1 . . . mn, that are neither individually nor jointly identical to E;

(vii)        E is constituted by m1 . . . mn; and

(viii)       m1 . . . mn are thoughts, imaginings, intentions, beliefs, etc.

Conditions (i-iv) express Chudnoff's preferred analysis of the first idea, that intuitions have presentational phenomenology. Conditions (vi-vii) express the second idea, that intuitions are constituted experiences. As already alluded, Chudnoff maintains that conditions (i-iv) are true also of sensory experiences. Herein lies the core similarity between intuitions and sensory experiences. The primary difference between them lies in (v): in sensory experience, o1 . . . on are putative concreta, rather than abstracta. (Below, I raise the question of whether conditions (vi-vii) and an analogue of (viii) hold of sensory experiences as well.)

I will comment on these conditions at some length, before turning to the accounts of intuitive justification and intuitive knowledge in Parts II and III. But let me first summarize some of the work to which Presentationality and Constitutedness are put. Each is invoked in the explanation of various other observations and claims, including the main theses (Theses 1-5, listed above). For example, Presentationality explains why intuitions are neither beliefs nor dispositions thereto (Thesis 1), and are also distinct from inferences. It also explains why, or how, intuitions justify corresponding beliefs (Thesis 2) and plays a role in the explanation of intuitive knowledge (Thesis 3). Given condition (v), it also secures the abstractness of intuitions' subject matter (Thesis 4). Constitutedness explains the observation that intuitions are accompanied by thoughts, imaginings, intentions, beliefs, and other conscious mental states. It is also used to diagnose and treat introspective objections to Presentationality (as recently pressed by Sosa and Timothy Williamson, among others): when objectors reflecting on thought experiments claim to fail to find anything in their stream of consciousness that satisfies (i-iv), it is because they are mistakenly looking for something that is not constituted by their thoughts, imaginings, intentions, beliefs, etc. Third, it underwrites the possibility of intuitions that occur without sensory experience (Thesis 5), namely, those wholly constituted by thoughts.

Let me make a few comments about the above account that might help to situate it within the current literature. In so doing, I will also offer a few critical remarks.

The notion of a contentful seeming in condition (i) is said to be irreducible to a judgment or to any kind of disposition or inclination thereto (beyond this, the notion is not given further explication and is, to this extent, treated as a primitive). This means that condition (i) alone distinguishes Chudnoff's account from doxastic views of intuition, such as those articulated by David Lewis, Sosa (if inclination is broadly construed to include attractions), Williamson, and many others. Chudnoff raises two objections to these views: the first is an elaboration of Bealer's naïve comprehension example -- that it is possible to have the intuition that the naïve comprehension axiom is true although one does not consciously judge, and is not consciously disposed or inclined to judge, that it is true. The second is a defense of the thesis that intuitions have presentational phenomenology, a thesis which Chudnoff takes doxastic views to be forced to deny.

Chudnoff's account is also interestingly different from other non-doxastic views of intuition, such as those advanced by A.C. Ewing (in Reason and Intuition), Bealer, Laurence Bonjour, Huemer, Joel Pust, and myself. All of these authors maintain that intuitions are experiences that seem to reveal how things are, and so endorse something in the vicinity of condition (i). At the same time, none of them endorses all of conditions (ii-iv). This is not to say that they are forced to deny that intuitions have presentational phenomenology; instead, they may simply offer alternative analyses of it. Chudnoff acknowledges in the introduction that "one could develop a view according to which intuitions are seemings, appearances, or presentations that" rejects some or all of his preferred analysis (9).

Here it may be helpful to observe that there are various aspects of experience that plausibly merit the label 'presentational phenomenology'. For example, when you see a ball, and it looks blue, your experience presents a color, blue; but it also presents how things are, that there is something blue before you. Here at least two types of phenomena seem presented, or present to mind: a color, and that there is something with that color before you. Regarding the latter, the subject matter that one has "a consciousness of seizing upon" possesses, or seems to possess, predicative structure (a proposition or, as I will sometimes say, 'apparent truth'). Regarding the former, the subject matter is simply a property (the color blue). The two may of course come apart: for instance, when hoping that you will find your red scarf and imagining it hanging on its peg, your imagination may present you with the color red, though it is not presented to you as being the case that there is something red before you.

Chudnoff's discussion focuses almost exclusively on presentation of properties, as in condition (ii), and the self-referential, truth-making phenomenology -- which I myself am unsure how to articulate -- in condition (iv), making those seem like the centerpieces in his analysis of Presentationality. By contrast, an alternative non-doxastic view of intuition may focus exclusively on presentation of apparent truths, which something in the vicinity of condition (i) may be thought to capture. Such views thereby endorse Presentationality without conditions (ii-iv).

While it is fairly uncontentious that sensory experience involves both the presentation of apparent truths and presentation of properties (and perhaps more), it is extremely contentious that intuition involves both -- let alone both plus self-referential, truth-making phenomenology, as Chudnoff maintains. This makes a defense of the full conjunction of conditions (i-iv) especially urgent. Chudnoff's primary argument is phenomenological, involving phenomenal contrast. He asks us to consider the following propositions:

1.     Two circles can have at most two common points.

2.     If a quadrilateral is inscribed in a circle, the sum of the products of the two pairs of opposite sides is equal to the product of the diagonals.

Chudnoff conjectures that most people have the experience of just seeing -- that is, intuiting -- 1 to be true in a way that they do not just see 2 to be true; in the latter case, a demonstration or testimony may be needed to appreciate its truth. The contrast is certainly salient to me. In the case of 1, I "have the consciousness of seizing upon" something; not so in my appreciation of the truth of 2.

This argument might tell against views that deny that intuitions have presentational phenomenology. However, it is not clear that it tells against non-doxastic views that endorse something in the vicinity of (i) but not (ii-iv). Notice, after all, that it is not obviously false to say that what I "have the consciousness of seizing upon" in the case of 1 is something with predicative structure: 1 is presented as true; not so for 2. In this way, the existence of alternative, non-doxastic views that endorse Presentationality but do not accept (ii-iv) complicates the dialectic. Unfortunately, the challenge they pose is never confronted.

A related concern is that several conditions in Chudnoff's account, including but not limited to (ii-iv), prima facie exclude a variety of conscious mental states that are regularly viewed as rather straightforward, if not paradigm, examples of intuition. For example, conditions (ii-iv) rule out -- by Chudnoff's own admission -- many instances in which "a particular action might intuitively seem right or wrong" (107). Conditions (iii-iv), in particular, threaten to exclude what we might will call 'innocent intuitions', which do not seem to one to provide access to that in virtue of which the proposition that is presented as true is true: one might see, or seem to see, that the moral supervenes on the non-moral but feel quite in the dark about -- not have a felt presence to mind of -- what makes this true. Condition (v) excludes a wide range of concrete intuitions: for example, the intuition that if cats meow, then cats meow; or the physical intuition that a composite object will fall at the same speed as its parts. Finally, Chudnoff works hard to show that conditions (vi-viii) do not rule out cases in which a proposition is found to be "immediately intuitively obvious" without any reflection (72-76), and readers will benefit from thinking through whether he has been successful.

The primary defense of conditions (vi-viii), which express Constitutedness, once again involves phenomenological reflection. Chudnoff describes two scenarios in which one has the intuition that p: in the first, one has the intuition that p because one employs visual imagination to mentally manipulate a complex three-dimensional diagram; in the second, one has the intuition that p because one reflects on some basic geometrical relations. The example is complicated (p is the proposition that (a + b + c)3 ≥ 27abc and (a + b + c)3 = 27abc just when a = b = c), and I admit that I did not have the intuition. But I see the point of the example: it seems obvious that there could be a phenomenological difference in the two scenarios. But it would seem that the difference can be accounted for by holding that the intuitions are accompanied by different thoughts, imaginings, etc., and that the overall experience one has when having an intuition accompanied by one set of thoughts, imaginings, etc. may differ from the overall experience that one has when one's intuition is accompanied by another set of thoughts, imaginings, etc. There is no need to make the further claim that the thoughts, imaginings, etc. that accompany the intuitions also constitute those intuitions. The accompaniment relation is significantly weaker than the constitution relation in (vii), and it is compatible with the alternative non-doxastic views of intuition mentioned above. An appeal to mere accompaniment also seems capable of delivering the other explanatory benefits of Constitutedness, mentioned above.

I have already mentioned that conditions (i-iv) are intended to forge similarity between intuition and sensory experience. How deep does the comparison go? The question of whether or how conditions (vi-viii) are also meant to apply in the case of sensory perception is not addressed, but it is an interesting question to consider. While there are presumably many "complex" perceptual states, such as visual scans or searches, that are constituted by other conscious mental states, including sensory experiences, which could serve as m1 . . . mn in (vi-vii), arguably there are also some "simple" sensory experiences that are not constituted by any further conscious mental states. Chudnoff's account seems to imply that intuitions, being "constituted experiences", are more like complex visual searches than the simple sensory experiences that constitute them. Waiving the concern that this is not obviously compatible with the epistemological theses that Chudnoff wishes to maintain (in particular, the Phenomenal Dogmatist thesis discussed below), other theorists of intuition -- proponents as well as critics -- might take this to indicate that his target is not the same as theirs, which may include "simple" intuitions.

Let me now turn to the epistemological theses in Parts II and III. As noted, Chudnoff maintains that the epistemic credentials of intuition are explained by its presentational phenomenology. In the case of justification, the claim is that an experience E prima facie justifies a belief that p when, and because, E has presentational phenomenology with respect to p. This is basic justification, requiring no additional epistemic support from background beliefs or any other mental states besides E -- which may be a sensory experience or an intuition. Chudnoff calls his position a version of 'Phenomenal Dogmatism', and he offers several considerations on its behalf.

As I understand it, Phenomenal Dogmatism does not rely upon Chudnoff's preferred analysis of presentational phenomenology but is available to other analyses -- hence to other non-doxastic views of intuition -- as well. One way to adjudicate between the wide range of options would be to locate which aspect of presentational phenomenology is doing the justificatory work, as it were, and then determine which non-doxastic view is best-suited to explain how it does that work. Given that presentation of properties places before the mind entities that fall short of the predicative structure of the contents of the beliefs that are justified, and that it is found even in imaginative experiences (recall the example of the red scarf described above), which cannot justify beliefs about how things are, presumably this is not a viable candidate. By contrast, presentation of apparent truths, which speaks directly to how things are, seems to be a better candidate: it places before the mind entities that have the predicative structure of the contents of the beliefs that are justified, and it is not found in imagination and other experiences that are justificationally inert. To the extent that presentation of apparent truths tracks something in the vicinity of condition (i), it is fair to say that it underwrites the justificatory role of presentational phenomenology whereas the additional conditions are, from the perspective of epistemic justification, excesses.

Phenomenal Dogmatism is currently not the most popular account of intuitive justification. Chudnoff argues against what he takes to be its primary competitor, 'Understanding-based Reliabilism', or UBR, which is basically the semantic rationalist thesis that intuitions have their epistemic basis in conceptual understanding, fortified by the claim that this basis guarantees reliability. Chudnoff's argument against UBR locates real-world cases, such as those involving the Jordan Curve Theorem and the Axiom of Choice, in which there is no plausible reliable psychological process that relates the content of an epistemically significant intuition to the tacit information, 'INFO', that one possesses in virtue of grasping various concepts and their mode of combination. As Chudnoff describes the cases, for the Jordan Curve Theorem, the implication (between INFO and the theorem) requires too many steps for there plausibly to be a psychological process that implements it; for the Axiom of Choice, there simply is no such implication; and in neither case is there a reliable process of visualization.

In Part III, Chudnoff's account of intuitive -- and sensory -- knowledge (Thesis 3) pivots on the claim that an experience E puts one in a position to know that p when, and because, E has veridical presentational phenomenology with respect to p. Chudnoff does not canvass opposing views (for example, safety theories or virtue epistemology) but focuses on responding to objections to his own.

The objections arise when the above claim about experiential knowledge is conjoined with conditions (i-v) in Chudnoff's account of intuition. This conjunction implies that when an intuition is veridical, then what one seems to be aware of, an abstract item or collection thereof, is in fact what one is aware of. But how can one be aware of abstracta? Chudnoff registers the connection between this question and the access problem, attributed to Paul Benacerraf. He proposes that the question and its force be understood as arising from two requirements on awareness:

Dependence: If one is aware of o by having experience e, then e depends on o.

Differentiation: If one is aware of o by having experience e, then e's phenomenology differentiates o from its background.

Chudnoff invokes Constitutedness to address Differentiation: seeming awareness of abstracta is grounded in intuition, and the conscious mental states that constitute the intuition select, or foreground, the objects of which one seems to be aware insofar as those objects are the items at which those states are directed. Regarding Dependence, Chudnoff's strategy is to eschew causal dependence in favor of constitutive dependence.[2] The key thesis is labeled 'Formal Naïve Realism':

If S is intuitively aware of an abstract object o by having intuition experience e, then e depends on o, in that: in accordance with the essence of e, [o partly constitutes e in the sense that] o is part of the [form or] principle of unity that e's (material [i.e., non-formal]) parts instantiate[,] and thereby determines e's phenomenal character. (216)

As I hope this indicates, Chudnoff's engagement with both requirements is philosophically sophisticated and the overall account of awareness of abstracta that he develops merits serious consideration. Even if he does not engage all requirements that have been associated with Benacerraf's challenge (some of which do not revolve around awareness), Chudnoff's discussion succeeds in showing that Benacerraf-style worries about intuition and abstracta should not be regarded as refutations but rather as impetus for further philosophical work.

This is, I think, one instance of a general lesson that Chudnoff's book teaches. Although some philosophers might not like intuition, it is becoming increasingly clear that one can no longer responsibly claim, as used to be popular (and in some circles still is thought to be legitimate or cool), that to invoke intuition is comparable to an appeal to divine intervention or little more than an exercise in empty self-congratulation. While the claim might be motivated by a laudable desire to avoid superstition, the claim embodies more prejudice than it counters. No doubt there is a sense in which the philosophy of intuition is still relatively undeveloped. But one implication is that there are at present a host of unexplored possibilities that merit careful investigation and sober assessment. In this light, Intuition deserves praise as a creative, rigorous, ambitious, and sensitive contribution to our collective effort to understand the nature and scope of our intellectual powers, including those powers ascribed by Platonic rationalists.

[1] An unabridged version of this review that includes all footnotes and additional text is available at https://sites.google.com/site/johnbengson/Review_of_Chudnoff_on_Intuition.pdf.

[2] I have also pursued this route in my 2010 dissertation and subsequent work on a Platonic rationalist account of intuition as intellectual perception. This review is not the place to pursue a contrast between Chudnoff’s position and my own.