2015.01.28

Ted Poston

Reason and Explanation

Ted Poston, Reason and Explanation: A Defense of Explanatory Coherentism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 195pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137012258.

Reviewed by William Roche, Texas Christian University


This is a book worthy of careful study. Ted Poston develops and defends an explanationist theory of (epistemic) justification on which justification is a matter of explanatory coherence, which in turn is a matter of conservativeness, explanatory power, and simplicity. He argues that his theory is consistent with Bayesianism. He argues, moreover, that his theory is needed as a supplement to Bayesianism.

There are seven chapters. Below I provide a chapter-by-chapter summary along with some substantive concerns.

In Ch. 1 ("Introduction"), Poston gives a brief history of coherentism, critiques some standard objections to it, and gives an overview of the remainder of the book. One of the objections he critiques is the "input" objection:

Input Objection (IO): Coherence is solely a matter of relations between beliefs. So coherentism implies that experience plays no role in justification. But this implication is false. So coherentism is false.

Poston argues in response that there is room for non-doxastic varieties of coherentism on which the coherence requirement is defined in part in terms of the propositional contents of the subject's experiences. He notes that his theory in particular is a variety of just that sort and so, contra IO, does not imply that experience plays no role in justification.

In Ch. 2 ("Epistemic Conservatism"), Poston develops and defends a version of epistemic conservatism. His version, as with any version (I take it), implies that belief in p is at least sometimes sufficient to generate justification (or positive epistemic merit) for p. He argues that there is much to recommend epistemic conservatism. He notes, though, that, despite this, epistemic conservatism is very much unpopular in epistemology. He considers several objections to the view and argues that each of them fails against his version. One objection is the "extra boost" objection:

Extra Boost Objection (EBO): Suppose S's evidence for q is counterbalanced and her credence in q is 0.5. She then gains some evidence for p (a different proposition) and comes to have a high credence in p. Suppose she subsequently realizes that p entails q and so comes to believe q. Suppose her credence in q is 0.8. Then by epistemic conservatism it follows that S's belief in q generates justification for q and that her credence in q should increase yet further to, say, 0.85. But, clearly, S's credence should not increase yet further. There is no extra boost in the credence she should have. So epistemic conservatism is false.

Poston responds that EBO fails against his version of epistemic conservatism because it is restricted to cases of "empty symmetrical evidence". These are cases where there is no evidence for or against the target proposition.[1] Since S, in the case at hand, has evidence for q, viz., p, the case is not one of empty symmetrical evidence. Poston clarifies that the "boost" idea is incorrect even with respect to cases of empty symmetrical evidence. The view, rather, is this: if S believes p, and has no evidence for or against p, then it is rational for her to continue believing p. Poston ends the chapter by arguing that his version of epistemic conservatism is supported by the perspectival character of epistemic justification.

Because of the restriction to cases of empty symmetrical evidence, Poston's epistemic conservatism is immune to objections concerning cases of non-empty symmetrical evidence. It is natural to worry, though, that the restriction is ad hoc. Why not instead restrict things to cases of symmetrical evidence, whether empty or non-empty?

Poston argues that if belief is not sufficient for justification in cases of empty symmetrical evidence, then skepticism is true. Even if Poston is right in this, the worry above -- that the restriction to cases of empty symmetrical evidence is ad hoc -- remains. All cases of symmetrical evidence, whether empty or non-empty, are ones where S's total evidence (which might be empty) is neutral with respect to the target proposition. If belief is sufficient for justification in some such cases, then, the worry goes, belief is sufficient for justification in all such cases.

Poston conceives of his theory of justification as a coherentist theory. It might be worried that his theory is coherentist in name only. Take a case where Poston's version of epistemic conservatism implies that S's belief in p generates justification for p. By hypothesis the case is such that S has no evidence for or against p. The justification in question is thus non-inferential. But no coherentist theory, the worry goes, allows for non-inferential justification.

Poston addresses this in Ch. 3 ("Reasons without First Philosophy"). He stresses that though his theory allows for non-inferential justification, it runs counter to the characteristically foundationalist idea that there can be cases where a justified observational proposition (or conjunction of justified observational propositions) by itself serves as a reason for another proposition. His theory involves what he calls "the framework view of reasons". This view can be put as follows:

Framework View of Reasons (FVR): A proposition p is a reason for a proposition q for a subject S at a time t if and only if (i) S is justified at t in believing p, (ii) p by itself is insufficient for q's justification, and (iii) there is a set of propositions Λ such that (a) p is a non-redundant part of Λ, (b) Λ is unnecessary but sufficient for q's justification, and (c) S is justified at t in believing the propositions in Λ.

The crucial point is that FVR is to be understood so that (iii) is true only if certain of the members of Λ are non-observational propositions concerning the explanatory virtues. This means that there can be no cases where a justified observational proposition by itself -- and thus independently of a framework of justified propositions some of which concern the explanatory virtues -- serves as a reason for another proposition.

The taxonomic issue of whether Poston's theory of justification is coherentist in name only is of no real importance. The important issue is whether Poston's theory is plausible as a theory of justification. I return to this issue below.

In Ch. 4 ("Explanation and Justification"), Poston spells out his theory in more detail. The theory is this:

Ex-J: S has justification for believing p if and only if (i) p is a member of a sufficiently virtuous explanatory system E and (ii) E is more virtuous than any competing system E'.

Poston clarifies that Ex-J is different than the following:

Ex-J': S has justification for believing p if and only if (i) p is a member of a sufficiently virtuous explanatory system E and (ii) there is no system E' such that E' is more virtuous than E.

Suppose p is a member of E whereas not-p is a member of E'. Suppose each of E and E' is sufficiently virtuous, E and E' are equally virtuous, and no system is more virtuous than E or E'. By Ex-J' it follows that S has justification for believing p. Things are different with Ex-J. Given that E' is a competing system with respect to p, and given that E is not more virtuous than E', it follows by Ex-J that it is not the case that S has justification for believing p. This is supposed to be the desired result.

Poston notes that Ex-J, as he means it to be understood, is both mentalist and evidentialist. Here is the rough idea. Ex-J implies that any two subjects who are alike in terms of their mental states are also alike in terms of justification. This makes it mentalist. Ex-J implies that any two subjects who are alike in their evidence are also alike in terms of justification. This makes it evidentialist.

Poston also notes, however, that Ex-J runs counter to the evidentialist thesis that S is justified at t in believing p if and only if S's evidence at t on balance supports p. He defends this point on the grounds that Ex-J implies that in cases of empty symmetrical evidence S has justification for believing p.

This defense is a bit surprising. Poston seems to hold that p is a member of a sufficiently virtuous explanatory system E only if p is involved in an explanans or an explanandum in E. He writes: "What is it to be a member of an explanatory system? A proposition is a member of an explanatory system by being a part of an explanans or part of an explanandum" (p. 87).The problem is that cases of empty symmetrical evidence are cases where, presumably, p is not involved in an explanans or an explanandum and thus are cases where (i) in Ex-J is false. So, it seems, Ex-J needs to be reformulated a bit so that it is consistent with Poston's version of epistemic conservatism.

Why accept Ex-J? Poston answers, in part, by setting out a host of test cases and arguing that Ex-J does better overall on those cases than reliabilism and Earl Conee and Richard Feldman's evidentialism. I return to Poston's argument below.

Ch. 4 also contains a discussion of explanation and the explanatory virtues. Poston argues that explanation is primitive and that the explanatory virtues are three in number: conservativeness, explanatory power, and simplicity. Ex-J, along with Poston's argument for it, should be understood accordingly.

Do explanatory power and simplicity admit of precise characterizations? Poston answers in the negative. This is somewhat disappointing (at least to me). But, if Poston is right, then there is simply no getting around it.

I want to be very brief with Ch. 5 ("BonJour and the Myth of the Given") and Ch. 6 ("Is Foundational A Priori Justification Indispensable?") so that I can get to Ch. 7 ("Bayesian Explanationism"). In Ch. 5, Poston critically examines two recent theories at odds with Ex-J on the justification of so-called "phenomenal beliefs". One is a theory defended by Laurence BonJour. The other is a theory defended by David Chalmers. In Ch. 6, Poston addresses BonJour's arguments for the indispensability of foundationalist a priori justification. Poston argues that each of BonJour's arguments is problematic.

The main issue in Ch. 7 is whether explanationism (short for "explanationist theories such as Ex-J") is consistent with Bayesianism. Poston answers in the affirmative. He writes:

My goal in this chapter is to argue for a new compatibilist position regarding the relationship between Bayesianism and explanationism. I argue that explanationism is consistent with Bayesian requirements of coherence and conditionalization. Furthermore, I argue that inductive confirmation requires explanatory information. . . . The view I stump for may be described as explanatory Bayesianism. It requires that a subject's prior probability distribution reflect explanatory virtues. A Pr-function ought not have priors that give simpler theories lower priors than complex theories. A Pr-function should reflect the power of an explanatory hypothesis in the relevant likelihoods. A Pr-function should distribute probability over the most fundamental explanatory parameters instead of the Platonic heaven of all possible explanatory parameters. In light of new mysteries, one should seek a new prior distribution that departs least from one's previous prior distribution while maximizing simplicity and explanatory power. (pp. 149-150, emphasis original)

There is a lot going on here. I want to focus on the claim that explanationism is consistent with Bayesian conditionalization (the thesis, roughly, that if S learns e, and nothing more, then S's new credence in h should be equal to her old credence in h given e).

Poston gives a case meant to show (or at least illustrate the point) that explanationism is consistent with Bayesian conditionalization. Suppose there are two coins. One is fair. The other is a two-headed coin and so always comes up heads. Suppose one of the coins is randomly selected and is to be flipped ten times. Let h1 be the hypothesis that the coin selected is the fair coin but comes up heads on all ten flips. Let h2 be the hypothesis that the coin selected is the two-headed coin. Suppose the coin comes up heads on each of the first seven flips. Let e be the proposition that the coin selected comes up heads on each of the first seven flips. Poston writes:

Which hypothesis has greater confirmation after observing seven heads? Clearly, [h2]. Why? Because [h2] explains the evidence, whereas [h1] merely entails the evidence. [h1] leaves the positive run of seven heads entirely mysterious. (p. 174)

Poston then argues that this is consistent with Bayesian conditionalization. He argues for this by arguing that Pr(h1 | e) / Pr(h2 | e) = Pr(h1)Pr(e | h1) / Pr(h2)Pr(e | h2) = Pr(h1) / Pr(h2), which is very small.

I am not sure I understand the argument. Poston writes (throughout the argument) in terms of "confirmation". But confirmation can be understood in different ways, and Poston never clarifies what he has in mind.[2] Perhaps the idea is this: explanationism implies that upon learning e you have justification for believing h2, but you do not have justification for believing h1; so explanationism implies that upon learning e your new credence in h2 should be greater than your new credence in h1; Bayesian conditionalization implies that upon learning e your new credence in h2 should be greater than your new credence in h1; so explanationism and Bayesian conditionalization are in agreement in the case at hand.[3]

It does not follow, of course, that explanationism and Bayesian conditionalization are in agreement in all cases. Are there cases in which explanationism runs counter to Bayesian conditionalization? Are there cases in which Ex-J in particular runs counter to Bayesian conditionalization?

Recall that Poston defends Ex-J by, in part, setting out a host of test cases and arguing that Ex-J does better overall on those cases than reliabilism and Conee and Feldman's evidentialism. One test case concerns so-called "explanatory theories". He writes:

Is one ever justified in believing an explanatory theory on the basis of its explanatory merits? Many of the views we accept purport to be justified in this way. Scientific theories are advocated on the basis of their explanatory merits. . . . If it turns out that no one is ever justified in believing a theory on the basis of its explanatory merits then the reach of skepticism is vast. (p. 100)

Poston argues that since an explanatory theory (of the kind in question) involves a large number of propositions, each of which is less than certain, it follows that an explanatory theory's probability (on the evidence in a given case) is low (less than 0.5). He then argues that this is problematic for reliabilism and Conee and Feldman's evidentialism but not for Ex-J. He writes:

Given Ex-J the final conjunctive probability of a theory is not relevant for determining justification. Rather what is relevant is the explanatory merit of the theory in comparison with its competitors. If the theory itself is simple, fits with background evidence, explains, and beats its competitors then one has justification for that theory. The fact that the final conjunctive probability of a grand theory is low does not itself provide any specific challenge to one's view. The cost of an explanatory theory is available at no lower cost. (pp. 101-102)

This is a rather remarkable passage. Let h be an explanatory theory. Let e be an evidence proposition such that (i) Pr(h | e) is less than 0.5 and (ii) Poston would claim that if S learned e, then, by Ex-J, S would have justification for believing h. Suppose S learns e. Then by Ex-J, as Poston means it to be understood, it follows that S has justification for believing h and so, presumably, it is not the case that she should have a credence in h less than 0.5. By Bayesian conditionalization, in contrast, S should have a credence in h less than 0.5. The result, it seems, is that Ex-J is not consistent with Bayesianisn conditionalization and thus is not consistent with Bayesianism.

Ex-J, of course, is framed in terms of all-or-nothing belief as opposed to credence (or degree of belief). It is not implausible, though, that all-or-nothing belief and credence are connected at least in that S has justification for believing h only if it is not the case that she should have a credence in h less than 0.5.

Perhaps some varieties of explanationism are consistent with Bayesianism. But, it seems, Poston's variety is not among them.[4]


[1] Are there propositions such that (at least in some cases) a subject has no evidence for or against them? Poston gives several examples of propositions he takes to be of that sort. One is the proposition that meaning is stable. Another is the proposition that objects persist through time.

[2] Poston also uses the term "favors". This term, as with the term "confirmation", can be understood in different ways.

[3] It is easy to see that Bayesian conditionalization implies that upon learning e your new credence in h2 should be greater than your new credence in h1. Pr(h2 | e) = Pr(h2)Pr(e | h2) / [Pr(h2)Pr(e | h2) + Pr(not-h2)Pr(e | not-h2)] where not-h2 is in effect the hypothesis that the coin selected is the fair coin. Pr(h2)Pr(e | h2) / [Pr(h2)Pr(e | h2) + Pr(not-h2)Pr(e | not-h2)] = (0.5)(1) / [(0.5)(1) + (0.5)(0.5)7] = 0.992 (with rounding). It follows that Pr(not-h2 | e) = 0.008. Since h1 entails not-h2, it follows that Pr(h1 | e) £ Pr(not-h2 | e). By Bayesian conditionalization it follows that your new credence in h2 should be equal to 0.992 whereas your new credence in h1 should be less than or equal to 0.008.

[4] Thanks to Ted Poston for helpful feedback on an earlier version of this review.