2015.02.14

David Carr

Experience and History: Phenomenological Perspectives on the Historical World

David Carr, Experience and History: Phenomenological Perspectives on the Historical World, Oxford University Press, 2014, 245pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199377657.

Reviewed by James Dodd, The New School for Social Research


David Carr's book represents a synthesis and significant expansion of his work on the philosophy of history since his 1986 Time, Narrative, and History. Its principal aim, which it shares with the recent publications of F.R. Ankersmit and Eelco Runia, is to break free from a perceived dominance in recent decades of the twin themes of representation and memory in philosophical accounts of history. The ongoing reign of representation can in part be traced to the work of Hayden White who, as Carr points out, in turn draws on the work of Arthur Danto, W. B. Gallie, and Louis Mink, all protagonists of the "linguistic turn" in Anglophone philosophy, who accordingly take as their guiding motif the idea of history as a mode of explanation that is completely dependent on linguistic representation (see White's 1973 Metahistory, which in Carr's presentation is more or less paradigmatic of this trend). The reign of memory, on the other hand, specifically the sociological phenomenon of collective memory (in contrast to historiographical production), can be traced to the influence of Maurice Halbwachs, and Carr cites Pierre Nora's Lieux de Mémoire (1997) as illustrative. The Achilles heel of each, according to Carr, is that, "different as they are from each other, one thing these two approaches have in common is that they begin with a gap between us and the past," (p. 3) a gap that that each essentially fails to close, thus belying our very real sense of not only understanding history through the practice of historiography, but experiencing events themselves as historical. His move is to take this experience itself as his focus: "I propose a phenomenological approach which puts experience in their [i.e., representation and memory] place as the central focus of a philosophy of history." (p. 2)

The argument here is phenomenological, but relates in important ways to broader trends in the philosophy of history.  In fact Carr's book can be read as a contribution to the long debate between, on the one hand, those inspired by a positivist conception of the discipline of history as a "social science," with its search for universal laws of human behavior, and, on the other hand, those who instead defend a hermeneutical, Geisteswissenschaften approach based on empathy and analogy, or the immanent understanding of human action and lived experience. It is clear from the first pages that Carr takes the side of Dilthey and Ricoeur in the argument (though not uncritically), directing strong criticism at competing trends such as the Annales school. He singles out social historians, such as Fernand Braudel, who argue for the elucidation of a history of social currents that are deeper and of such long duration that their progression is barely perceptible to individual human experience or perspective.

These broader methodological debates are not just implicit, but take up much of Carr's attention. His aim here is not simply to provide a phenomenological basis for a philosophy of history (the project of Chapters 1-2, 7 and 8), but also to introduce the phenomenological perspective on history by way of a history of the philosophy of history (Chapters 3-6). Of interest here are above all the Hegelian and positivist legacies of the nineteenth century, at least on the side of philosophy; the varieties of historicism likewise play their predictable roles, Leopold von Ranke looming large. The result is a powerful combination of phenomenological analysis and a history of ideas that provides insight into the genesis of the philosophical motivations for pursuing "phenomenological perspectives" in the philosophy of history.

Part of this history is Carr's own writings on the philosophy of history, above all Time, Narrative, and History, the thesis of which he gives a succinct re-articulation and appraisal (see p. 4, the fuller discussion on pp. 68-69, and p. 195). In the earlier work, the argument was that the "gap" between the reality of the past and its historical representation is mediated by narrative, which is in turn understood to be a form common to both historical representation and human action. The common form of narrative establishes a fundamental continuity between the past and its representation, undermining the idea that narrative order belongs only to fiction, to storytelling, and thus can only distort reality: "To tell stories about the human past is not to impose an alien structure on it but is continuous with the very activity that makes up the human past." (p. 209) As in his earlier work, Carr is arguing against those who, like White, imagine "narrative [to be] imposed on a non-narrative world, distorting it and thus concealing rather than revealing it" (p. 220), siding instead with Ricoeur, for whom "narrative is an essential feature of human existence by which we humanize and thus deal with time." (p. 220, also cf. p. 222) Carr wants to reaffirm this argument, but take it up from a different, more comprehensive point of view, given that "experience is too broad to be encompassed by comparing it to narrative form." (p. 4) Or perhaps more to the point, experience is not historical only to the extent to which it shares in narrative forms; there are other, even more fundamental, senses in which experience is "historical," the elaboration of which will strengthen the argument with respect to the centrality of narrative in historical understanding.

Carr begins by isolating what he calls a "manageable array of meanings" (p. 9) of experience in Chapter 1, through an historical reconstruction of various senses of experience in modern philosophy, before moving on to the more explicitly phenomenological task of developing a conception of historical experience proper in Chapter 2. Chapters 1-3 together represent the phenomenological groundwork of the book, Chapter 3 already being a transition to a phenomenological re-reading of the classical philosophy of history, chiefly with respect to its "metaphysical" and "epistemological" variants that represent the primary legacy of the 19th century, and which is the focus of Chapters 4-5. The rest of the book (Chapters 6-8, some of it previouslypublished) offers a series of complementary studies: Chapter 6 focuses on how particular phenomenologists, beginning with Husserl, understood history, and their relation to the historicist tradition; Chapter 7 offers a detailed phenomenological analysis of the spatial and temporal features of sociality and the past; and in Chapter 8 Carr engages in a more systematic way with his past work on narrative.

Clearly the concept of "experience" is crucial to the entire project, a risky enterprise given that it is a notoriously slippery notion; a lot of weight therefore rests on the success of Chapter 1. After a lively and eminently readable account of varying examples in modern philosophy from Locke to Husserl in which the concept of experience gains, more or less, some stability of definition, Carr settles on four basic senses (p. 30): the first emphasizes experience as having immediate contact with the world, so in the sense of "Locke's sensations, Hume's impressions," and at least one use of the term Erfahrung in Kant. The often contrasting German term Erlebnis, and of more recent invention, is also included in this first sense, on the argument that in Dilthey and also Husserl the contrast is between Erlebnis as the immediacy of lived experience and the cumulative, "long term" sense of experience, for which Dilthey reserves the term Erfahrung. (p. 20) Carr posits this latter as the second sense of experience: the notion of experience as "temporally extended and cumulative." The third is credited specifically to Kant, namely Erfahrung as "empirical knowledge of objects"; and finally the fourth is the "mystical-religious sense of Erlebnis" that one finds, for example, in William James's account of the "varieties of religious experience," and from which the title of the chapter borrows its phrasing.

These distinctions are rather blunt, perhaps necessarily so, for clearly there are many salient ways in which these four senses of experience interpenetrate, but also contrast in ways that run contrary to this division: Kant's argument for the dependency of objective knowledge on empirical experience can be read as incorporating both senses 1 and 2; an Erlebnis in Dilthey has temporal extension, thus is not "immediate" in the same sense as Hume's impressions; and even Hume's impressions are on a scale of immediacy the other pole of which are "ideas," which in turn arguably begin to blend into sense 2. Even the mystical religious sense of experience can be thought of as grounded in a combination of experience as immediate and of accumulative duration, to the extent to which a religious experience suggests an immediate contact with something that bears on the whole of one's life, projecting outward in significance to both the past and the future (here one thinks, for example, of the structure of Augustine's Confessions).

Yet the point is to make the otherwise variegated senses of experience manageable, in order then to serve as a point of departure for the real work of Chapter 2. Here Carr suggests ignoring senses 3 and 4 in favor of 1 and 2, arguing that a reflection on the relation between these two senses provides the basis for closing the "gap" between the past and the present. This work is done by way of a reflection on Husserl's theory of inner time consciousness; the idea is that no Erlebnis, no experience as an immediate relation to things, is so episodic or individuated in character that it would break free from a fundamental temporal continuity between the past and the future. (p. 37) Phenomenologically, a "present" experience is immediately subject to the process of temporalization, of its becoming past, in which it is modified as a retained "just past" that remains in a fundamental continuity with the present, in a sense unmediated by anything other than the structure of the passage of time itself. More (and this is a key argument found on pp. 43-47), the retentional continuity of the passage of time in turn provides the temporal ground thanks to which the past bears upon the present, giving it form. Carr argues that this essentially unites the first sense of experience as the immediacy of the present with the second sense of experience as accumulative, since "the retained past has patterns that accumulate and bear upon the present." (p. 47) In this way the past institutes, sustains, and gives weight to expectations for the future, perhaps the most primitive forms of historicity.

The immediate flowing of experience into a past that in turn provides content to how it is directed is what makes time time; what makes time properly historical is for Carr membership in communities. (p. 52) Here he aims to develop a notion of a collective subject, what he calls a "we-subject," constituted as a multiplicity of interlocking experiences distributed through time. More, he wants to understand this ontologically, as something that makes us what we are, namely "historical beings" in Dilthey's sense, or beings who are, to allude to a much quoted line of Dilthey's in the book, "historical beings before we are observers of history." (p. 55)

In this way the concept of historical experience in Chapter 2 supplements Carr's earlier account of narrative: historical being it is not simply a question of narrative coherence, but includes the possibility of encountering a particular class of events that are historical in character. (p. 63) For historical beings, events can have the significance of a turning point, a change in the existence of the community and not simply one's own individual life. These are events, such as the fall of the Berlin Wall or 9/11 (Carr's examples), that are experienced as transcending our individuality, but which bear upon "us" as a collective historical subject. Despite where this seems to be going, Carr wants to avoid comparison to Hegelian Geist, at least if we understand it as something indifferent to individual persons:

The communities I talk about exist only to the extent that people identify themselves with them. They are fragile entities that form themselves in certain circumstances and just as easily dissolve when circumstances change. They are not 'natural' entities but social formations, often with fluid and changing boundaries. (p. 69)

Still, even if one is sympathetic with avoiding the association with Geist, one might still wonder whether those who identify themselves with such ephemeral entities might be just as "fluid and changing." It might seem a bit optimistic to credit the social activity of individuals alone with providing for the endurance of a community. Nevertheless, there are interesting descriptions here of the problem of others, of other historical worlds as different "realities," with different expectations of time and space (pp. 187f), which together show Carr working with a more nuanced conception of the relation between individuality and community. This comes to the fore when he elucidates what he takes to be an ontological tension between the historian and the historical agent under study: each belongs to a different intentional unity of world experience, and their contrast gives rise to "ontological complexity, a conflict of realities." (p. 191) Thus the challenge to narrative is not simply a matter of explanation, of making sense of source documents or other types of available evidence, but involves a more fundamental question of how to enter into another world. It is only a short step to the observation that this challenge also lies at the heart of understanding the role of historical reflection in coming to an understanding of "who" we are, thus grappling with a core dimension of the problem of individual personhood.

Another contribution in this vein is Carr's phenomenological deepening of Niall Ferguson's defense of "counterfactual" history. (pp. 191-193) For Carr, there belongs "structurally to the historian's retrospective point of view" the tendency to ignore what, for the agent, had been a horizon of possible outcomes, not just for an action, but with regard to the entire future of the community. (p. 192) It is both natural and in some ways necessary to ignore these past possibilities; after all, the future of an historical action in fact turned out in a particular way, something the historian already knows. Yet the failure to appreciate the ways things did not turn out, but could have or were expected to, ultimately renders past actions opaque. One thinks here of Christopher Clark's recent book on the eve of the First World War that bears the poignant title Sleepwalkers: the title sums up how the actions of those just before the war look to us, namely by evoking their obliviousness to the catastrophe about to descend upon them, but at the same time in a way that, like a sleepwalker, they appear nevertheless to be engaging a future of possibilities that do in fact map in complex ways on to what actually happened. The narrative challenge for the historian is thus to tell the story of what happened, but in a way that understands the story the agent believed to have been living; otherwise the agency of the past becomes incomprehensible precisely through the manner of its own historical representation. (p. 195)

Carr rejects the criticism that this approach, with its emphasis on narrative form as an organizing principle for both historical agent and historian, leads inevitably to that hobbyhorse of the epistemologically inclined, relativism; his is instead a "much more modest project, which can be described as a phenomenology of the interplay of points of view." (p. 197) The argument is to sanction positively the place of narrative in historical writing, and by extension the role of the imagination; their involvement does not reduce history to fiction, a position that Carr thinks one can take only if one rejects metaphysically the idea of human reality having a narrative form along with the widely discredited epistemological claim that the imagination has no role in cognition, two assumptions he decisively rejects. (p. 211)

The point is again ontological: historical reality "must be, in its own way, a narrative reality, a reality that exists in being told" (p. 230); even communities themselves have a "narrative existence." (p. 230) Thus for Carr, the answer to the question whether narrative belongs not only to the historia rerum gestarum, but also to the res gestae themselves, can only be answered in the positive. Still, his positive answer rests on the argument for an ontological continuity between the experience of history and the narrative of history that, despite a variety of different experiences of the alien and the other, exhibit a distinctive unity. But is there not an important sense of historical discontinuities as well, one that perhaps transcends the limits of even communal experience, but which is nonetheless "historical" in a meaningful sense? What, for example, about "pre-history," or those communities of humans that existed before recorded history, where any res gestae are only indicated by mere shreds of evidence, such as the remnants of Clovis points distributed across Europe? And what, as a representative of the Annales school might remark, do we make of the virtual invisibility of long-term historical developments relative to any given time? No one watched the fall of the Roman Empire, as any ancient historian will tell you; and by extension, its historical reality would seem to be grounded on an ontology other than that of lived experience.

Carr does not explore these possible objections in any detail, but he does provide a powerful theoretical approach to address them and others. A highly readable and erudite contribution to current and future debates in the philosophy of history, this book is a welcome contribution to both phenomenology and the philosophy of history.