2015.03.18

Christian Coons and Michael Weber (eds.)

Manipulation

Christian Coons and Michael Weber (eds.), Manipulation, Oxford University Press, 2014, 258pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199338214.

Reviewed by Gerald K. Harrison, Massey University


Christian Coons and Michael Weber have put together a timely and fascinating collection of original articles on the topic of manipulation. As the contributions amply illustrate, manipulation is a pervasive presence in our lives, from advertising and guilt trips to romantic relationships: we are manipulated and manipulate all the time. Yet not enough has been done to clarify the concept and its morally relevant features. Does manipulation necessarily involve wrongdoing? Does it always involve some kind of deception? Must it be intentional? Does it always subvert or bypass an agent's freedom or rational capacities? The ten papers in this collection focus primarily on these issues and their respective moral significance. That is to say, the collection is predominantly about what manipulation is and why it is wrong (when it is wrong).

All of the essays make interesting, thoughtful contributions to answering these questions. They also acknowledge each other. This gives a nice sense of a collaborative effort, despite the differences in the details. Coons and Weber's introduction is masterful. However, the book does have an important omission. Cases involving manipulation have been -- and continue to be -- widely discussed in the literature on the relation between free will, moral responsibility, and causal determinism. Such cases are seen by some to be relevantly analogous to cases of decision making under causal determinism and thus to provide support to incompatibilism about responsibility-grounding free will. Yet there are no papers directly addressing this topic, or the kind of manipulation involved (although Todd Long's does say some interesting things about the moral responsibility of victims of manipulation, but its concerns are with responsibility's epistemic dimension). It would have been good to have included one or two essays on this.

The editors acknowledge the omission in a footnote in their introduction. They express some scepticism about whether the sorts of cases typically discussed in the free will literature qualify as cases of manipulation, suggesting instead that they "seem more closely related to assault or invasion" (p. 8, n. 5). Yet they are standardly referred to as 'manipulation' cases, so it would seem -- to borrow a phrase from Anne Barnhill's paper -- "under inclusive" to ignore them. What qualifies as manipulation is precisely what is at issue. In fact, the kinds of manipulation cases typically referred to in the free will literature seem capable of posing interesting challenges to some of the accounts of manipulation offered in this collection (as I will explain).

Most of the essays attempt to identify core features of manipulative acts. The first and one of the most provocative is Allen W. Wood's "Coercion, Manipulation, Exploitation". Wood's analysis of coercion and manipulation is victim focussed. Coercion and manipulation are best understood in terms of how they impact an agent's freedom and rational capacities. One is coerced into doing something when "I either do not choose to do it or if, when I do choose to do it, I do it because I have no acceptable alternative" (p. 21). Manipulation differs in that it is more subtle; it operates by making alternatives less attractive without removing them altogether. Because Wood's analysis focusses on the way in which coercion and manipulation deprive or subvert their victim's freedom, it turns out that coercion does not require a coercer, and manipulation does not require a manipulator. There's a certain sense to this. After all, if a tree is blown onto me and pins me to the ground, my freedom of movement is inhibited just as much as if a person had intentionally pushed it onto me. Similarly, then, whether one's alternatives have been made more or less attractive by an agent's influence, or by non-agential forces makes no real difference. Thus by focussing on what manipulation does to its victims, it seems that manipulation does not require manipulators.

However, there are concerns here, concerns echoed by some of the other contributors (though there are sources of support as well, such as in some of what Michael Cholbi says about ambient manipulation). It does not seem to tally with ordinary usage to describe cases of being forced without any forcer to be cases of coercion. As Marcia Baron points out in her essay, coercion without a coercer is more naturally described as force. Relatedly, to be forced by a barking dog to cross the road is one thing, but to be forced by an agent to cross the road is quite another. My freedom may be no more or less diminished, but when it is an agent's threats that are responsible I may have been wronged, and suffered a loss of dignity that the dog's barks would not similarly rob me of. And this seems to be precisely because I was coerced in one case and not in the other. Similarly, as I have already noted, some maintain that causal determinism is as subverting of freedom as manipulation by covert controllers. Even if that is so, I have suffered a loss of dignity if I am being manipulated that I have not lost if I am merely being determined by non-agential influences, and this seems in part because in one case we can find manipulators, whereas in the other there are none.

Baron takes a manipulator-focussed approach, arguing that manipulation requires intent. It need not be a conscious intention and it need not be an intention to manipulate. The intention can just be to influence, but if one is reckless (or worse) in how one prosecutes that intention, then it can count as manipulation. The centrality of recklessness or indifference to manipulation is a returning theme found in several of the other contributions. For example, in a very suggestive piece, rich with examples, Moti Gorin shows that in cases of manipulation the manipulator is indifferent to either the rationality of the means or end being pursued. Manipulators either employ means of influence that do not track reasons, or aim to influence someone to do something they do not believe to be supported by reasons. By contrast, rational persuasion is the ideal of non-manipulative influence. As Gorin says, with rational persuasion:

everything links up nicely: the motivations of the influencer are grounded in the reasons she believes really do support the behavior she seeks to bring about, the means of influence (e.g., sound argument) reliably 'aim at' or 'link up with' these reasons, and the mental states of the person being influenced also refer to the reasons that support the behavior. (p. 96)

In a case of manipulation one of these links is missing.

Barnhill questions whether manipulation needs to be intentional (though does not actually take a stand -- it "depends upon who you ask" (p. 69)) and explores manipulation's connection to self-interest. She develops an account of manipulation according to which it involves directly (that is to say, by saying or doing something) influencing someone's beliefs, desires, or emotions "in ways typically not in her self-interest or likely not in her self-interest" (p. 52). For example, appealing to an emotion not fully under someone's control -- intense malice -- is manipulative because it is an attempt to use something -- not-well-controlled malice -- that it is not typically in the victim's self-interest to have. But attempting to influence someone by appeal to her cold, tightly-controlled malice is not manipulative, because having such tightly controlled emotions is not typically contrary to one's interests. However, even influencing someone by appeal to her well-controlled emotions may constitute manipulation in a context in which acting on such emotions is not in her self-interest. However, there can be paternalistic manipulation, and this needs to be accommodated. Barnhill does so by noting that though the desires, emotions and beliefs that are being induced may be in the manipulee's interests, the mechanism used is non-ideal. The example given is of a nurse influencing a patient to take his medicine by flirting with him. We might say that though it is likely in the patient's interests to take the medicine, it is not in the patient's interests to be such that indirect routes -- flirting -- need to be taken to influence him into taking it.

Barnhill's analysis is fascinating, but incomplete as it stands. There is an important kind of manipulation that involves altering a person's circumstances, rather than anything about the person herself, such that her ideal response to these altered circumstances would be what the manipulator wished. Barnhill terms this "manipulation via an ideal response". It is put to one side. Yet it is not clear that Barnhill's account will be able to accommodate it. For the response of the manipulee is ideal in such cases, and it is also ideal that one is susceptible to this kind of influence (although denying this may be a way of bringing this kind of manipulation into the fold).

Barnhill's case, like many others in this collection, invites reflection on a range of ingenious and thought-provoking examples, from seduction techniques (Eric Cave), to manipulative artwork (Claudia Mills) and guilt-tripping aunts (Kate Manne). Yet, as mentioned above, there seems to be a kind of manipulation -- the kind typically referred to in the free will literature -- that was overlooked. This kind of manipulation is more wholesale: it is the kind Brave New World controllers and gods exercise over people. It is the kind that can take place at the genetic level. It does not bypass anyone's rational capacities or compromise anyone's interests or harm. And it may not involve any deception, for the manipulees may be designed to be aware of (and endorse) what has been done, and the manipulators need not be indifferent to whether their influence reflects what is desirable or true. Perhaps it is a stretch to describe such cases as involving manipulation, but it doesn't seem to be (this is how they are described). At the end of their introduction Coons and Weber note that it seems natural to describe a manipulator as a "puppeteer" (p. 15). To be manipulated is to be in some sense a plaything of alien forces. Yet that seems a very apt thing to say about the manipulators and manipulees in the sort of global 'manipulation' cases employed in the free will literature. Perhaps the manipulative nature of such cases of global manipulation of this kind can be captured by some of the analyses offered, but on the face of it, it looks as if it might evade capture. Hence, I think it would have been good to have some discussion of this sort of case, especially given recent concerns about cloning and designer babies (concerns that, in part anyway, express concerns about this sort of manipulation).

Overall, this is a very worthwhile book. It is rammed to the rafters with interesting examples, and all of the contributions have something interesting to say. It is an important topic, and I hope -- and expect -- this collection will inspire more to examine it.