2015.03.23

Frederick C. Beiser

After Hegel: German Philosophy, 1840-1900

Frederick C. Beiser, After Hegel: German Philosophy, 1840-1900, Princeton University Press, 2014, 232pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691163093.

Reviewed by Rudolf A. Makkreel, Emory University


This is a history of nineteenth century German philosophy after Hegel that gives thinkers such as Adolf Trendelenburg, Hermann Lotze, Wilhelm Dilthey and Eduard von Hartmann pride of place instead of the usual Germanic figures of Feuerbach, Marx, Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Although Trendelenburg, Lotze and Dilthey were professors at the University of Berlin, this is by no means merely a history of academic philosophy, for it engages many wider intellectual debates. It is a useful volume that fills in some gaps in standard histories.

Frederick Beiser focuses on the crisis of identity that philosophy faced after the death of Hegel in 1831. His narrative starts in 1840, the year in which Trendelenburg (1802-72) published his Logische Untersuchungen, which attempted to replace the speculative idealist efforts of Fichte and Hegel to ground the sciences with a more modest, second-order logic of the sciences. Beiser relates this more respectful approach to the sciences back to an earlier set of Kantian idealists such as Jakob Fries, Johann Friedrich Herbart and Friedrich Beneke. Among these, Herbart's program for reforming epistemology through psychology was also influential on the early writings of Trendelenburg's student Dilthey. We obtain a very good sense where a figure such as Trendelenburg stands in relation to the sciences, but this is not always rounded out to include his overall position. For that, the reader would have to turn to an earlier work by Beiser on late idealism. But we do learn that Trendelenburg's logic of the sciences includes more than a consideration of the methods of the various sciences. It goes on to "stress the abiding importance of metaphysics, i.e., a knowledge of the universe as a whole" by constructing "a general system of the sciences" (21).

Beiser's history is organized around some of the main controversies of the second half of the nineteenth century. If philosophers are to take the development of the sciences seriously, what is their distinctive task? How are they to reconcile mechanism and materialism with views such as vitalism and teleology? Are less speculative forms of idealism still viable? Lotze (1817-81) stands out as central in the chapter on the materialism controversy. His Mikrokosmus attempts to chart a path between materialism and vitalism by demonstrating the proper use of mechanism. Lotze endorses the procedure of extending mechanical explanations beyond inorganic nature to the organic realm of physiology and the mental realm of psychology. Nevertheless, he claims that there is more to the universe than the world of natural experience, namely, the "realm of value without which we would never grasp the purpose and meaning of things" (64). Lotze's normative appeal to the validity of value (was gilt) allowed him to resuscitate idealism without needing to appeal to intellectual intuition and Hegel's dialectical reasoning about what exists (was ist). But unlike Neo-Kantians such as Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert, who adopted the validity of value on transcendental grounds, Lotze argued for a new teleological and monistic metaphysics that conceives of matter as the product of immaterial forces. Here Beiser indicates the influence that Leibniz had on Lotze (67-68).

Another central figure is Hartmann (1842-1906), the author of the Philosophie des Unbewussten. One of the main tasks of philosophy according to Hartmann is to "see as a whole what the particular sciences see only in scattered and separate parts" (46). Again we obtain a metaphysical system that Beiser sees as akin to Trendelenburg's organic view of the world. We are not told much about what Hartmann understands by the unconscious, except that it is like Schopenhauer's will. Schopenhauer first published his main work, Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung, in 1819 and only lived until 1860, but he is made the hidden force behind many of the controversies of Beiser's narrative. However, if Schopenhauer's views on the will as the thing-in-itself provide the background for Hartmann's philosophy of the unconscious, we are not given any details about the linkage. Beiser does cite Schopenhauer's claim in Book One that "the thing-in-itself is not something that lies beyond appearances," but is "the what that appears" (34) or inheres in them. The thing-in-itself is explicated as the content that is given visible form in appearances. This allows Schopenhauer to suggest that the task of metaphysics is to interpret and decipher appearances to learn the "meaning-content" of appearances, not the "laws" that govern them. On that basis Beiser criticizes him for not working out a hermeneutics: "It was a remarkable shortcoming for an old student of Boeckh and Schleiermacher, two fathers of modern hermeneutics" (35).

But these brief passages by Schopenhauer about interpretation and meaning come from Book One of Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung, which is about how we represent the world in mechanical or causal terms. If one moves on to Book Two, which is written from the standpoint of the will, one can see that Schopenhauer begins to solve "das Rätsel des Daseins" and can dispense with interpretive methods that are always indirect. Schopenhauer needs no hermeneutics because he thinks that the will can directly intuit what is real. Thus in Book Two, which Beiser ignores, we are given a "metaphysical explanation (Erklärung)" of natural phenomena "from the will as thing-in-itself." There Schopenhauer writes

I shall never believe that even the simplest chemical combination . . . will ever be capable of mechanical explanation, much less the properties of light, heat, and electricity. These will always admit of only a dynamical explanation, in other words, of one that explains the phenomenon from original forces entirely different from those of impact, pressure, weight, and so on, and thus of a higher order.[1]

The mechanical explanations of the sciences are of a lower order and must be supplemented by dynamical explanations of a higher order. Everything in both inorganic and organic nature finds its ultimate explanation in the will, which "is the true inner being of world and the kernel of all phenomena."[2] The matter of the materialists is merely the external form of the content of the will to which we have direct access from within. Here we have a metaphysics that is just as speculative as Hegel's, but instead of being directed by a rational telos of spirit, it is rooted in the irrational forces of the will.

Returning to Beiser's narrative, he characterizes Hartmann's metaphysics as a "paradoxical synthesis" of Schopenhauer's will and Hegel's reason. He also indicates that Hartmann's aim was to rehabilitate the organic and teleological conception of nature defended by Schelling and Hegel by replacing their deductive approach with the inductive methods of the empirical sciences (47). Here one could add that the real inspiration for Hartmann's synthesis was Schelling who had already attempted to relate "the unconscious activity that has produced nature and the conscious activity that manifests itself in willing"[3] on the basis of an ideal principle. But in place of Schelling's system of transcendental idealism, Hartmann proposed an organic system encompassing the sciences. He lived long enough to have to defend his organic worldview against the onslaught of Darwinism. Despite a sympathetic account of Hartmann's approach, he is ultimately dismissed with this final line: "Why appeal to a cosmic unconscious force to explain the origin of species when the theory of natural selection is sufficient?" (48).

A most interesting follow-up on these discussions of Trendelenburg, Lotze and Hartmann is the chapter on "The Ignorabimus Controversy." This controversy was inaugurated by a lecture on the limits of natural cognition by the physiologist Emil Du Bois-Reymond (1818-98). While endorsing the mechanical model for all scientific explanation, he also acknowledged its limits by claiming that we would forever remain ignorant of the nature of matter and of the connection between consciousness and the brain. According to Du Bois-Reymond we cannot understand matter by means of atoms because they are merely fictions, and consciousness cannot be explained by the Laplacian paradigm that can account for phenomena only on the basis of position, direction and velocity of particles (see 100-01).

Beiser elaborates on two kinds of responses to Du Bois-Reymond's lecture. The first response, as represented by Ernst Haeckel (1834-1919), refused to place any limits on the mechanical paradigm. The second, as exemplified by Dilthey (1833-1911), questioned this paradigm as an undue restriction on the scope of science. Haeckel maintained that if matter is not reduced to the inert extension of Descartes and Kant, then we can conceive it as active energy that allows us to think of mind as only a more complex form of matter. Haeckel also endorsed Darwin's theory of natural selection and thus challenged the teleological theories of Trendelenburg, Lotze and Hartmann.

Dilthey's very different response to Du Bois-Reymond was to argue for the need to supplement the natural sciences with another kind of science that could do justice to human social practices and historical life. For Dilthey the limits of the natural sciences are an invitation to develop another paradigm of scientific method that can account for the meaning of things even when they cannot be fully explained in causal terms. Whereas the explanation of nature proceeds in terms of causal laws, the understanding of history must first place events in their appropriate contexts and discern structural patterns among them. Whatever causal explanations can be found for historical events must be framed by an understanding of the social and cultural systems in terms of which human beings interact.

This crucial aspect of Dilthey's theory of the Geisteswissenschaften (human sciences)[4] is lacking in Beiser's account. On the one hand, he portrays Dilthey as claiming that human interactions are "formulable in term of laws of cause and effect" (150). On the other hand, he regards Dilthey's acknowledgment of local contexts as purely circumstantial, thus dismissing their organizational import. This leads him to make Dilthey into more of a historicist than he really was. Beiser claims that Dilthey's "critique of historical reason aims to expose the ahistorical pretensions of reason" (143) and thereby reduces everything to "its own time and place" (144). But Dilthey aims to articulate "the reason of things that was active in their history" in terms of the "uniformities operative in its formation."[5] These uniformities are arrived at through the disciplinary analysis made possible by the various human sciences and include contextual commonalities as well as causal laws. Dilthey rejected the attempts by Hegel and Comte to formulate laws that govern history as a whole. The uniformities that are relevant to the understanding of history are not always causal, and if they are, their scope tends to be limited to the social, economic and cultural systems that can be analyzed by the human sciences. This means that the historian has to weave together the differentiated uniformities found by the relevant human sciences and attain as coherent and objective an account of what is singular and individual about his subject matter as possible. Dilthey's analysis of the formation (Aufbau) of the historical world is meant to avoid the more traditional constructions (Konstruktionen) of teleological idealists. His historical approach aims at objectivity and rejects the simple ideographic-nomothetic alternative proposed by the Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband. Narrative description does not rule out lawful regularities.

We can follow up on Dilthey's conception of history by assessing Beiser's earlier discussion of the Identity Crisis of Philosophy and Worldviews. There he writes that for Dilthey "all philosophies are relative and historical" (50). But Dilthey's attempt to extract a typology of recurrent worldviews from the history of philosophy suggests otherwise. The fact that Dilthey shows that each worldview "arises from, and gets its meaning within, its own historical context" (50), does not stop him from analyzing and assessing it according to universal standards. In developing a threefold typology of worldviews, Dilthey clearly considers the naturalism of Protagoras, Hobbes, Hume and Nietzsche deficient, but seems to hesitate between the idealism of freedom of Plato and Kant and the objective idealism of Neo-Platonism and Hegel. I think that this hesitation stems from a realization that worldviews attempt to give a totalizing determination of the meaning and value of things that is beyond human limits. Any totalizing understanding will have to acknowledge indeterminacies. Ultimately, Dilthey would have to admit that he has something like the Du Bois-Reymond problem, but that does not make him a relativist. When examining how worldviews are formed, Dilthey writes: "there is a never-ending effort to find a universally-valid coherence in all this, an ever-growing experience of the limits of cognition, and of the impossibility of combining objectively what is given in these different ways of considering things, and so, finally, resignation."[6] But if resignation about the limits of cognition amounts to relativism, then almost everyone discussed in Beiser's chapter on "The Pessimism Controversy" would be guilty as well, including the Neo-Kantians he admires. Paradoxically, Beiser's own chapters on the Ignorabimus and Pessimism Controversies open the way to clearing Dilthey of his relativism charge.

Pessimism was a problem that Schopenhauer imposed on the late nineteenth century. The riddles of life that he formulated in Book One, and claimed to solve in Books Two and Four, left those who doubted his pessimistic conclusions with a challenge that none of them could answer definitively. Beiser concentrates on the way the Neo-Kantians tried to overcome Schopenhauer's pessimism.[7] Thus Windelband is shown to argue that it was for each individual to decide whether or not life is worth living: "there is no way of knowing what the purpose of life is in itself, and that is because metaphysics is impossible, just as Kant rightly taught" (169). Much of the controversy about Schopenhauer's pessimism concerned its implications. Hartmann was more sympathetic to Schopenhauer and rejected the charge that pessimism undermines morality by claiming that it only demonstrates the futility of egoism and the striving for personal happiness. Hartmann characterized his own form of pessimism as eudemonistic rather than moral, and tried to "foil his many neo-Kantian critics" (193) by claiming that Kant was, like himself, a eudemonistic pessimist and a moral, even evolutionary, optimist. There are many lesser-known participants in this fascinating debate that Beiser recounts in this his longest and last chapter. They include two women, one of whom was Agnes Taubert, the wife of Hartmann, and Olga Plümacher, who spent many years in a Swiss colony in Tennessee.

In sum, Beiser makes a good case that late nineteenth-century German philosophy is much richer in content than is generally recognized. The book provides a valuable resource for scholars, but the fact that everything is organized in terms of controversial debates also means that one gets scattered insights into the philosophers involved, and the assessments given do not always cohere fully as in the two cases discussed above.


[1] Schopenhauer, The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2. Trans. E.F.J. Payne. Pp. 299, 301-02.

[2] Schopenhauer, The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2. p. 294.

[3] Friedrich W.J. Schelling, Schellings Werke, vol. 2. ed. by Manfred Schröter, Munich: C. H. Beck’sche Verlagsbuchhandlung, 1977. P. 349.

[4] Beiser speaks of the Geisteswissenschaften as the "historical-social sciences," but they are more commonly referred to in the English language secondary literature as the "human sciences" because they also include what we refer to as the humanities.

[5] Wilhelm Dilthey, Introduction to the Human Sciences, Selected Works, Vol. 1, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989. Pp. 78-79.

[6] Dilthey, Gesammelte Schriften. Vol 5 . Göttingen: Vandenhoeck und Ruprecht, 1974, p. 390. Forthcoming in Dilthey, Selected Works, vol 6.

[7] Here Hermann Cohen’s name is mentioned, as in several other places. However, his work is never discussed, which is surprising given his importance as the leader of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism.