2015.04.11

John Cottingham

Philosophy of Religion: Towards a More Humane Approach

John Cottingham, Philosophy of Religion: Towards a More Humane Approach, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 192pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107695184.

Reviewed by Graham Oppy, Monash University


John Cottingham is critical of 'standard' approaches to philosophy of religion. In his view, they pay too much attention to intellectual arguments about the nature and existence of God (9). More generally, in his view, those approaches aspire to properly scientific ideals of 'neutrality' (3), 'impersonality' (4), and 'detachment' (5) that are inappropriate as ideals for philosophy of religion.

Against the standard approaches, Cottingham aims to develop a more 'humane' model for philosophy of religion: a model that connects the subject more closely with the moral and spiritual sensibilities that shape religious belief (9); a model that does not require philosophers to set aside their personal and emotional commitments (4); a model that makes a serious attempt to understand the context of culture and praxis within which religious belief finds its home (11); and a model that properly allows for the crucial role of imaginative, symbolic and poetic forms of understanding in deepening our awareness of ourselves and our world (8).

I share Cottingham's dim view of 'standard' approaches to philosophy of religion; and I agree with many of the criticisms that he makes of those standard approaches. However, it seems to me that, in some ways, Cottingham's book is itself a paradigmatically standard approach to philosophy of religion: in some ways, it is 'part of the problem' not 'part of the solution'.

First, and most obviously, Cottingham mostly neglects the fact that philosophy of religion is philosophy of religion. All philosophical questions that arise in connection with any of the world's religions are questions for philosophy of religion. But, in Cottingham's work, 'religion' is almost everywhere interchangeable with 'Christian theism', or some further circumscribed term, e.g., 'Liberal Catholic theism'. In his Preface, Cottingham notes that his philosophising is conducted within a particular cultural and historical context, and mentions 'a religious tradition whose roots go back to the Judaeo-Christian scriptures' (xi). But each of us should acknowledge that there is more to philosophy than his or her own philosophising. Someone whose cultural and historical context takes in a religious tradition whose roots go back to the Tipitaka could be no less seriously engaged in philosophy of religion without so much as contemplating the idea that there is a personal God.

Second, Cottingham mostly neglects the fact that philosophy of religion is -- and ought to be -- a cooperative social activity. True enough, there are aspects of philosophising that are often done in private -- e.g., thinking, reading, and writing -- but (a) some of those aspects of philosophising -- e.g., reading and writing -- are themselves properly understood as inherently social activities (we read what other people write, and we write for other people to read); and (b) whatever other goals we may have when we philosophise, we cannot avoid taking as one of our goals understanding the worldviews and forms of life of other people. If we are serious about improving our own worldviews, we do best to pay careful attention to those areas in which proponents of other serious worldviews disagree with us. But we cannot pay careful attention to those areas in which proponents of other serious worldviews disagree with us unless we make a genuine attempt to understand the worldviews and forms of life of the proponents of those other serious worldviews.

Third, Cottingham mostly neglects the fact that philosophy of religion admits of diverse forms of engagement. Within philosophy of religion, we can engage in philosophising from a particular standpoint: we can engage in Christian philosophy of religion, or Buddhist philosophy of religion, or Naturalist philosophy of religion, or the like. If engaged in an enterprise of this kind, then we can insist that certain kinds of Christian -- or Buddhist, or Naturalist -- claims are on the conversational scoreboard. These claims are disputed by proponents of other serious worldviews, but we are entitled to insist upon them because we are engaged in an enterprise from a Christian -- or Buddhist, or Naturalist -- point of view. However, within philosophy of religion, we can also engage in philosophising in which the only claims that go on to the conversational scoreboard are claims that are agreed no matter which serious worldview we accept (or no matter which of some circumscribed class of serious worldviews we accept). If we are genuinely interested in arguing with proponents of other worldviews about claims that are in dispute,then the premises of the arguments put forward must all be claims that are on the conversational scoreboard at the time they are advanced.

I agree with Cottingham that 'standard' approaches to philosophy of religion pay too much attention to intellectual arguments about the nature and existence of God. Not all religions are theistic. Even if all religions were theistic, arguing about the nature and existence of God would be one small part of philosophy of religion. And, in any case, extant arguments about the nature and existence of God -- both for and against -- fail because they appeal to premises that are not on the conversational scoreboard of any genuine conversation in which seriously disputing parties participate.

I also agree with Cottingham that there are parts of philosophy of religion where 'neutrality', 'impersonality' and 'detachment' are not appropriate ideals. If we are engaged in the project of elaborating and articulating our own standpoints -- or standpoints shared with all of those is in conversation -- then there is no reason to attribute special significance to ideals of 'neutrality', 'impersonality' and 'detachment'. More broadly, if we are engaged in the project of Christian philosophy of religion -- or Buddhist philosophy of religion, or Naturalist philosophy of religion -- then there may be no reason to attribute special significance to ideals of 'neutrality', 'impersonality' and 'detachment'. If we are engaged in one of those enterprises, then we may be perfectly well entitled to insist on our personal and emotional commitments, on the products of our moral and spiritual sensibilities, and on attitudes drawn from our imaginative, symbolic and poetic forms of understanding.

However, I part company with Cottingham in also thinking that there are parts of philosophy in which ideals of 'neutrality' are mandated. In particular, when it comes to the proper conduct of arguments between proponents of widely discrepant worldviews -- and, more generally, when it comes to engaged conversation between proponents of widely discrepant worldviews -- ideals of 'neutrality' must come into play in regulating what goes onto the conversational scoreboard. Moreover, if we are concerned to take seriously the views of proponents of other worldviews, then we cannot rest content with appeals to our own personal and emotional commitments, the products of own own moral and spiritual sensibilities, and attitudes drawn from our own imaginative, symbolic and poetic forms of understanding. Rather, to the extent that we think that it is legitimate to appeal to personal and emotional commitments, products of moral and spiritual sensibilities, and imaginative, symbolic and poetic forms of understanding, we who wish to take seriously the views of proponents of other worldviews need to consider the personal and emotional commitments of the proponents of those other worldviews, the moral and spiritual sensibilities of the proponents of those other worldviews, and the imaginative, symbolic and poetic forms of understanding of proponents of those other worldviews. Moreover, in giving this kind of consideration to the proponents of those other worldviews, we need to exercise a very considerable degree of sympathetic imagination: we need to make a genuine attempt to understand 'from the inside' what it is like to be a proponent of one of those other worldviews.

While Cottingham says that he wants to 'connect the subject more closely with the moral and spiritual sensibilities that have shaped religious belief over the centuries', he nowhere attends to more than the moral and spiritual sensibilities that have shaped a certain kind of liberal Catholic belief over the centuries. Of course, I have no in principle objection to that enterprise, thought of as a contribution to liberal Catholic philosophy of religion; however, I want to insist that it is wholly and utterly inadequate as an approach to the full sweep of philosophy of religion, properly understood.

Apart from these global considerations about the form that a properly humane approach to philosophy of religion ought to take, there are many particular questions that are raised by claims that Cottingham makes in the course of this book. I shall raise just one such question here.

On Cottingham's account, morality is the primary concern of religion: religious belief focusses on the deep structural problems of human life and our pressing need for moral transformation (72). Moreover, on Cottingham's account, the 'disciplines of spirituality' -- prayer, fasting, meditation, group worship, attentive reading of scripture, reflective silence at key moments of the day, and so forth -- are an absolutely crucial means to the needed kind of moral improvement (149). Finally, 'spiritual praxis' can be assessed -- at least in part -- by the moral difference that it makes to the lives of practitioners (155).

An obvious question to take up -- but one to which Cottingham gives no attention in this book -- is whether 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' do bring about moral improvement. If it is true that the aim of 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' is moral improvement, but there is considerable evidence that 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' do not actually lead to moral improvement, then that raises serious questions about the value of 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' as tools for moral improvement.

If 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' are efficacious as tools for moral improvement, then we should expect to find that those who engage in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' are morally better than those who do not engage in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality'. Of course, we antecedently expect that there will be a distribution of moral standing among those who engage in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality', and a distribution of moral standing among those who do not engage in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality'. So we should not suppose that we can decide the matter by pointing to particular individuals and sorting them according to their moral standing. Rather, what we need to do is to attend to large populations, to see how they measure up.

One population to examine is those who engage most intensively in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality'. How do they measure up against those who do not engage so intensively in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality'? Take, on the one hand, the class of Catholic priests, and, on the other hand, the rest of the population. To make it very concrete, let's just focus on Australia, since the Second World War. And let's turn our attention to the issue of sexual abuse of minors. The Victorian Inquiry into the Handling of Child Abuse by Religious and other Organisations and the Royal Commission into Institutional Responses to Child Abuse  have disclosed that (a) offense rates were much higher among Catholic priests than among the population at large; (b) that there was no reporting to relevant authorities by Catholic priests -- or anyone else in the hierarchy of the Catholic Church -- of acts of sexual abuse of minors (whereas there was reporting by other members of the community of acts of sexual abuse of minors); and (c) that the Catholic Church hierarchy actively protected known sexual abusers of minors by moving them between parishes when complaints were brought to the Church by parishioners (whereas no secular organisations participated in analogous corporate behaviour). In assessing the moral implications of these facts, it should be borne in mind that detailed knowledge of the appalling consequences of sexual abuse of children has been in the public domain since the 1960s (see Volume 1, p.47, of the Final Report of the Victorian Inquiry). 'Spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' seem to have been singularly ineffective in protecting Victoria's children from unutterably immoral behaviour, both on the part of individual priests who engaged in sexual abuse of minors, and on the part of an organisation that utterly failed to discharge its duties of care towards those minors who were abused by its members.

Perhaps it will be replied that the case of sexual abuse of minors by priests is a statistical blip in a much wider body of data that supports the claim that 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality' are efficacious tools for moral improvement. What we need to do is to look at global data about a whole range of matters on which moral considerations impinge -- murder rates, suicide rates, assault rate, rape rates, teen pregnancy rates, divorce rates, incarceration rates, state execution rates, and so forth -- and see how these vary between populations with higher and lower rates of engagement in 'spiritual praxis' and 'the disciplines of spirituality'. There are studies that have attempted to assemble and assess this kind of data: see, e.g., Gregory S. Paul (2009) 'The Chronic Dependence of Popular Religiosity upon Dysfunctional Psychosocial Conditions' Evolutionary Psychology 7, 398-441. While the identification and interpretation of this kind of data is controversial, and while it is clearly important to be cautious not to overstate the conclusions that can properly be drawn, it seems to me that we can say with a fair degree of confidence that the data that we currently have does not support the claim that 'spiritual praxis' and the 'discipline of spirituality' are efficacious tools for moral improvement. Given the costs of investment in 'spiritual praxis' and the 'discipline of spirituality', the returns -- at least when it comes to promoting moral behaviour -- are, at best, disappointingly elusive.

Although there are many places -- both at the level of method and at the level of discussion of particular topics -- where I am in deep disagreement with claims advanced, I think that there is much to admire about this book. For each of the M-topics that is the focus of one of the chapters of the book -- Method, Metaphysics, Meaning, Morality, Misfortune, Mortality, and Mathesis -- there is much food for thought, even for those who do not share the spiritual sensibilities of the author. Overall, it is an excellent introduction to one kind of liberal Christian philosophy of religion.