2015.05.12

Vlastimil Vohánka

Modality, Logical Probability, and the Trinity: In Defence of a Weak Scepticism

Vlastimil Vohánka, Modality, Logical Probability, and the Trinity: In Defence of a Weak Scepticism, Editiones Scholasticae, 2014, 320pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868385496.

Reviewed by Ludwig Jaskolla, Hochschule für Philosophie München


A main area of dispute in contemporary epistemology of religion revolves around the criteria and conditions for the epistemic justification for religious beliefs. One important discussion concerns whether some form of evidentialism applies to religious beliefs, in the sense that such beliefs have a positive epistemic status only if conclusive or at least highly probable proof can be given for them.

In this book the Czech philosopher Vlastimil Vohánka takes a stance in this dispute. His main argument comes down to the assertion: religious experience aside, it cannot be evident (in a sense of psychological necessity, which is defined in chapter II) that the Christian doctrine of the Trinity of the Godhead is logically possible -- he calls  this assertion "weak modal skepticism about the Doctrine of Trinity" or WMST (83). But if the doctrine of the Trinity is indeed essential to Christianity, it cannot be evident that Christianity is logically probable (in the sense that there is non-minimal support for the truth of the respective thesis). Nevertheless, Vohánka argues that it might still be the case that Christianity and in particular the doctrine of the Trinity are justified in a weaker sense than the logical one. Accordingly, he defends a form of weak skepticism about the epistemic justification of Christian religious beliefs.

The volume revolves around two central lines of thought, which I will sketch briefly. In an introductory section, Vohánka introduces and discusses the concepts essential to his arguments and his explication of WMST within the relevant debates in analytic philosophy. I think that this section is extremely helpful if used as a guide to the following arguments. The first central line of thought delineates the consequences of WMST (for more details see below). Vohánka then presents his argument in favor of WMST -- the second central line of thought (for more details see below). He closes his volume with two chapters: The first addresses reasonable constraints on the concept of logical probability. The second addresses questions that are loosely attached to the main argument -- e.g., the question concerning the epistemic justification of the doctrine of the Trinity and of Christianity as a whole: "Whatever I said, I do not wish to deny that belief in the doctrine of Trinity, or in its logical possibility, is epistemically justified or rational" (244).

This idea brings me back to the starting point concerning the epistemic justification of religious beliefs, sketched above. Vohánka argues that WMST alone does not suffice to substantiate the irrationality of Christian beliefs. Rather, if supplemented by religious experience, Vohánka seems to be content to admit that epistemic justification can be had.

Nevertheless, one problem remains: in the conclusion, Vohánka argues that only a few people have had religious experiences. Does this mean that no justification can be had for belief in the Trinity? Vohánka does not think so. Rather, he takes his argument in favor of WMST to support the idea that perhaps philosophers of religion should seek other -- lower -- standards for the epistemic justification than probability.

But let us now return to those two lines of thought that make up the conceptual heart of the volume. The first line of thought consists in two formal arguments that explore what follows from the assertion that it cannot be publicly evident in the sense that it can be ascertained only based on natural theology and apologetics that the Doctrine of Trinity is logically possible. The arguments are interconnected and aim to provide evidence for two conditional claims.

First, if we consider whether the truth of Christianity is publicly evident, then we are forced to conclude that Christianity cannot be anything more than minimally probable. Accordingly, the truth of Christianity cannot be shown to be probable without recourse to religious experience. Vohánka's argument rests on a certain relation between the truth of the Doctrine of Trinity and the truth of Christianity: if a proposition P has a non-minimal probability that is publicly evident, then any proposition that entails P has non-minimal probability that is publicly evident.

Vohánka uses this entailment relation in order to show that if you adopt WMST, then you have the resources to show that the Doctrine of Trinity cannot have non-minimal probability that is publicly evident. The reason is that WMST entails it cannot be publicly evident that the Doctrine of Trinity is not analytically false -- falsehood "in virtue only of the contents of its concept" (36). But if some proposition is analytically false, then it has a minimal probability -- indeed in this case probability 0. Accordingly, it cannot be publicly evident that the Doctrine of Trinity has non-minimal probability.

If you agree with Vohánka thus far -- and there seems to be good reason to do so -- and you additionally accept that the Doctrine of Trinity is entailed by Christianity, then you are drawn to the conclusion that the truth of Christianity lacks non-minimal probability that is publicly evident. This means that in order to think of Christianity as evident (in the sense that it is sufficiently, epistemically supported), deductions from natural theology or apologetics are not enough. Rather, you need at the very least further sources of evidence -- for example sources from religious experience.

Second, there is another argument for the same conclusion, i.e., the conditional claim mentioned above. However, rather than discussing this argument in detail, I would like to return to the structural features of both arguments for a minute. I will try to carve out those essential structural features:

1.     The conclusion of both arguments is a conditional claim connecting the probability of Christianity with the possibility of the truth of the Doctrine of Trinity: if the former is publicly evidently logically probable, then the latter is publicly evidently possible.

2.     But if WMST holds, then the Doctrine of Trinity cannot be publicly evidently possible.

3.     Hence, Christianity cannot have publicly evidently non-minimal logical probability.

Premise 2 of this reconstruction of the heart of both arguments leads directly to the second central line of thought mentioned above. Vohánka argues extensively for WMST.

At the heart of this second line of thought are three argumentative steps: The first step makes up the bulk of the discussion. Vohánka presents a systematic tableau of strategies (cf. 122), which could be defended if one were to embrace the contraposition of WMST. He discusses these arguments in favor of the claim that the Trinity thesis is publicly evident:

[option 1] . . . from the Trinity thesis alone based on testimony.

[option 2] . . . from the Trinity thesis alone based on non-testimonial factors that are known a priori.

[option 3] . . . from the Trinity thesis alone based on non-testimonial factors that are known a posteriori.

[option 4] . . . not from the Trinity thesis alone based on testimony.

[option 5] . . . not from the Trinity thesis alone based on non-testimonial factors that are known a priori.

[option 6] . . . not from the Trinity thesis alone based on non-testimonial factors that are known a posteriori.

Vohánka discusses, in turn, each of these possible substantiations of the logical possibility of the Trinity thesis being publicly evident. I will cite one example, He discusses the idea that the logical possibility of the Doctrine of Trinity might be true from the Trinity thesis alone, might not be based in testimony, and might be evident a priori: this would come down to the idea that the Trinity thesis is self-evident. But the philosophical tradition agrees that this is not the case -- that the Trinity thesis is not in classic terminology per se nota. Vohánka presents and criticizes those different strategies, arriving at the conclusion that neither of the above strategies is convincing.

Vohánka infers from this discussion that the most promising way to substantiate the logical possibility of the claim that the doctrine of the Trinity is publicly evident is to show that there is evident experiential knowledge of it, which is not rooted in the truth of the Trinity thesis alone, but which is derived from testimony, and in addition which is not based in religious experience. But even these attempts fail. Accordingly, he concludes: "from the exploration of the main and most promising attempts, it strongly seems to me no human so far has acquired p[ublic]-evidentness that the Trinity thesis is logically possible" (210).

This negative conclusion gives rise to the second step of the aforementioned argument. This step generalizes the idea developed in the first step. Vohánka points out -- and he is completely correct in this -- that the first step of his argument, which in effect poses a last-man standing argument in favor of WMST, could be criticized for not considering all of the possible and relevant options, because a last-man standing argument is always open to the criticism that there might be relevant options that have not been considered.

The second step is tailored to answering this criticism. Vohánka presents an abductive argument for his more general claim that the logical possibility of the Trinity thesis is not publicly evident:

"If (i) one looks for reasons p-evidently establishing the logical possibility of the Doctrine of Trinity, (ii) in conditions favourable to such enquiry . . . and (iii) finds no such reasons, then probably (iv) the logical possibility of the Doctrine of Trinity has not been p-evident to anybody." (215)

Vohánka presents four philosophical arguments underlining the conclusion that, even to philosophers who are Christians or who are friendly toward Christianity, the Trinity thesis is not p-evident. Accordingly, he thinks himself warranted in generalizing the findings of the first step: the logical possibility of the Trinity thesis is not publicly evident to any philosopher or theologian right now.

The third step of the second line of thought is probably the most important. Vohánka tries to motivate a modal reading of our knowledge of the Trinity thesis. In a nutshell, this third step in the second line can be summarized the following way. We have already seen that the logical possibility of the Trinity thesis has not been publicly evident to philosophers or theologians. We must now show that it is indeed impossible for the logical possibility of the Trinity thesis to be publicly evident. This modalized claim would entail that there are in principle no human beings who would be able to provide sufficient support that the Doctrine of Trinity is publicly evidently logically possible.

Again, Vohánka tries to motivate his idea by means of abduction. One way he does so is by drawing an analogy between the public evidentness of the Trinity thesis and a classic position in the philosophy of mind. Colin McGinn argued -- and Vohánka shows based on similar reasons -- that the mind-body problem is not solvable for human thinkers. Vohánka closes this third step with a meta-philosophical reflection on the argumentative reach of his discussion:

I do not mean it as an evidently sound argument. . . . I have merely tried make an acceptable . . . case for WMST. . . . Outside the ken there may be an evidently sound demonstration, independent of religious experience, that the Doctrine of Trinity or even Christianity is logically possible. The abductive steps from my critical review to the general failure, and from general failure to the psychological impossibility, are also acceptable rather than evident. (229-230)

I have tried to present the central lines of thought in Vohánka's book. I have argued that he tries to make weak modal skepticism about the Trinity (WMST) acceptable as a philosophical thesis, and I have shown how he deduces the idea that Christianity cannot be publicly evidently true with non-minimal probability. At this point, I would like to express two critical questions about Vohánka's arguments.

(1) Although Vohánka introduces his central ideas in ordinary English, the full extent of his arguments are presented formally. This may deter some readers. Nevertheless, I think that this is one of the few cases in which a formal representation brings clarity to the arguments it formalizes. In particular, the formal representation helps readers identify both strengths and weaknesses of the argument.

But there are also problems with the formalization. One is that the rules of inference could have been explicated in more detail. To repeat: I find the arguments as depicted in ordinary language -- as discussed above -- clear and convincing. Nevertheless, if one wants to provide a more formal presentation of these arguments, I would consider a more detailed motivation of the rules of inference to be important -- consider for example the detailed ways in which the β-rule has been motivated as a version of the modus ponens for the N-operator in consequence-style arguments in the free-will debate.

One example in which I am left wondering about how those rules of inference are motivated is on pages 106-107. There, Vohánka makes use of substitution, material implication, double negation, and transposition for both standard modal operators as well as non-standard operators for coherence and analyticity. Although he mentions some ancestors of his formalization in footnote 214, I think it would have been important to explicate why the standard inference rules used in the formalized argument apply to the non-standard operators. Without an explication of these inference rules -- or, even better, an axiomatic clarification of the relationship between non-standard operators and standard modal logic -- the arguments end up floating in an argumentative vacuum.

I think that the abovementioned example case underlines this problem: on page 107, Vohánka argues that the analyticity operator on a negated proposition is equivalent to the negated standard-possibility operator on a negated proposition. But within the standard modal logic K, this means that the analyticity operator is equivalent to the standard necessity operator. This conflation of modalities might be well motivated; yet without an independent motivation for these non-standard elements, I am left wondering why Vohánka uses the analyticity operator if it is equivalent to the standard necessity-operator. Again, I think that an explicit motivation would have helped to substantiate the formalized versions of the arguments.

(2) Some readers might wonder how Vohánka's WMST extends to the classic idea that some truths about the Divine can be discovered by reason while others require a special kind of experience grounded in revelation. For example, in Aquinas we find the idea that the existence of God, i.e., in the form of the proofs for the existence of God, can be discovered by the rational faculties of mankind alone; he similarly claims that some divine attributes, such as divine simplicity, can be discovered by reason.

Nevertheless, Aquinas is adamant that the way in which the Divine reveals itself to mankind cannot be concluded from rational theology and apologetics alone. Rather, he holds that the revelation of the divine as the Father in the first Person, as Jesus Christ in the second Person, and as the Holy Spirit in the third Person is something that is evident only through a concrete, historical act of revelation.[1]

I think that it would have been interesting for Vohánka to show how his account of the epistemology of the doctrine of the Trinity differs from some of the classical epistemological approaches. It seems, at least to me, that there are interesting analogies between Vohánka's approach and that of Aquinas. It might even be that a Thomistic epistemology of the doctrine of the Trinity could profit from Vohánka's findings. Basically, I think that Vohánka should have included at least sample discussions of those authors whom he mentions briefly in the Appendix (cf. 308-310), where he provides a list of authors who think that the doctrine of the Trinity cannot be derived by apologetics alone.

Something similar seems true of one of the main distinctions in recent approaches to the Trinity. Although Vohánka explicitly argues that he will not be concerned with the "details" of the different models of the Trinity, I think it might have been a good idea for him to have discussed whether his arguments differ when supplemented by forms of social or Latin trinitarianism. As Thomas Schärtl makes clear, this difference is important to both the ontology as well as epistemology of the doctrine of the Trinity.[2]

In his 2015 Gott denken: Ein Versuch über rationale Theologie (English: Thinking about God: An Essay in Rational Theology),[3] German philosopher of science Holm Tetens advocates a renewal and inner reformation of systematic rational theology. He claims that the inferential dependence, interconnectedness, and embedding of rational-theological hypotheses with our best theories about the natural world as well as with those experiences essential to everyday life make a powerful argument in favor of theism, and might well be the only consistent setting in which rational theology seems possible in the 21st century. I believe that Vohánka's essay on the epistemic justification of belief in the doctrine of the Trinity fits perfectly into this project in the sense that he tries to disentangle important dependences in the doctrine of Trinity and shows how far a purely rational account of the doctrine of Trinity can take us. Vohánka's concise and analytic presentation of an admittedly classic position in the philosophy of religion will be an interesting addition to the project of a rational theology.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENTS

I would like to thank Godehard Brüntrup, Thomas Schärtl, and Christina Schneider for helpful discussions about Vohánka's volume. Nevertheless, any remaining misunderstandings are mine.


[1] de Aquino, Thomas: Primae redactiones super De Trinitate. Cf. 1.1, ad 5, 1.3.

[2] Schärtl, Thomas: Trinität als Gegenstand der analytischen Theologie. In: Zeitschrift für katholische Theologie 135.1 (2013), 26-50. Cf. 28-29.

[3] Tetens, Holm: Gott denken. Ein Versuch über rationale Theologie. Stuttgart: Reclam 2015.