2015.06.04

David Boonin

The Non-Identity Problem and the Ethics of Future People

David Boonin, The Non-Identity Problem and the Ethics of Future People, Oxford University Press, 2014, 293pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682935.

Reviewed by Molly Gardner, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


If Jonathan Haidt's (2001) theory of moral judgment is correct, then philosophers are unusual. Unlike most people, who employ post hoc reasoning in support of pre-formed moral judgments, a philosopher can "reason her way to a judgment that contradicts her initial intuition" (Haidt 2001, p. 829). Haidt cites two philosophers whom he takes to do this -- Peter Singer and Socrates -- but it seems pretty clear that David Boonin belongs on the list.

Boonin's latest book is a model of philosophical reasoning. After carefully setting up the non-identity problem as an argument with what he terms the "Implausible Conclusion," Boonin devotes chapters two through six of the book to considering how people have tried or might try to resist each of the argument's five premises. He concludes, each time, that any attempts people have made or could make to resist the force of the premise at issue are doomed to failure. In the final chapter, he offers some reasons to think that the Implausible Conclusion is more consonant with commonsense morality than we might have thought.

The Implausible Conclusion has to do with a thought experiment in which a woman appears to wrong her own child by bringing her into existence. The woman's name is Wilma, and the child's name is Pebbles. The nature of the apparent wrong has to do with the advice Wilma receives just before she conceives. Wilma's doctor tells her that if she conceives right away, her child will have a disability that will detract from her quality of life, though she will still have a life worth living. On the other hand, if Wilma takes a pill once a day for two months before conceiving, her child will be born perfectly healthy. Wilma declines to take the pills and instead conceives right away. Her child, whom she names Pebbles, is born blind. If she had waited and taken the pills, she would have conceived a different, sighted child, whom she would have named Rocks. The Implausible Conclusion, which Boonin ultimately accepts, is that Wilma's act of conceiving Pebbles instead of Rocks is not morally wrong.

While the conclusion is about a fictional case, it has broad theoretical and practical implications. The theoretical implications are conservative: Boonin's view suggests that certain commonsense conceptions of harming and wrongdoing fare well in what we might call "non-identity cases" and need not be revised. The practical implications, on the other hand, tell in the opposite direction. If the commonsense intuition about Wilma's case is wrong, than many of the judgments that people make about human reproductive cloning, genetic screening, animal breeding, and even polluting the environment will need to be revised.

One of the strengths of the book lies in how thoroughly Boonin systematizes, clarifies, and critiques what others have written about the topic. Since the non-identity problem was discovered in the late 1970s, philosophers whose areas of specialization range from philosophy of religion, bioethics, and environmental ethics to ethical theory and metaphysics have wrestled with issues the problem raises. The literature spans so many sub-disciplines that, at times, the dialectic has faltered, as philosophers have failed to take note of and respond to each other's contributions. However, Boonin's book could help change all that. His "works cited" list would serve as an excellent resource for anyone planning a graduate seminar or writing a dissertation. But more importantly, his rigorous critiques of some of the major contributions to the literature will add clarity and common ground to the debate.

This is not to say that I fully agree with how Boonin frames the problem. As I noted above, he sets it up as an argument, which he formulates as follows:

(P1) Wilma's act of conceiving now rather than taking a pill once a day for two months before conceiving does not make Pebbles worse off than she would otherwise have been.
(P2) If A's act harms B, then A's act makes B worse off than B would otherwise have been.
(P3) Wilma's act of conceiving now rather than taking a pill once a day for two months before conceiving does not harm anyone other than Pebbles.
(P4) If an act does not harm anyone, then the act does not wrong anyone.
(P5) If an act does not wrong anyone, then the act is not morally wrong.
(C) Wilma's act of conceiving Pebbles is not morally wrong. (p. 27)

One minor quibble I have with framing the problem this way is that although P1 and P3 are formulated as specific claims about Wilma's act, P2, P4, and P5 are formulated as general principles. However, there is no need for the latter three premises to be generalizations; the argument could have been formulated this way:

(P1) Wilma's act of conceiving now rather than taking a pill once a day for two months before conceiving does not make Pebbles worse off than she would otherwise have been.
(P2*) Wilma's act harms Pebbles only if it makes Pebbles worse off than Pebbles would otherwise have been.
(P3) Wilma's act of conceiving now rather than taking a pill once a day for two months before conceiving does not harm anyone other than Pebbles.
(P4*) If Wilma's act does not harm anyone, then it does not wrong anyone.
(P5*) If Wilma's act does not wrong anyone, then it is not morally wrong.
(C) Wilma's act of conceiving Pebbles is not morally wrong.

The advantage of the more specific argument is that it reduces the temptation to think, mistakenly, that finding certain counterexamples to P2, P4, and P5 will yield a solution to the problem. For example, there are plenty of apparent exceptions to P4, the rule that wronging implies harming. Such apparent exceptions include cases where, although an individual is not harmed, her rights are violated, she is treated unfairly, or she is disrespected. Nevertheless, if such purported exceptions to this rule do not apply in Wilma's case, then they will not solve the non-identity problem. Indeed, Boonin argues that such exceptions do not apply in Wilma's case. If he could make reference to the specific version of the argument, he could conclude that P4* is true. But given his general formulation of the argument, he is left to draw the more awkward conclusion that "even if P4 does not turn out to be true, for purposes of generating the non-identity problem, it remains true enough" (p. 148).

In addition to this minor quibble, I have a second, more substantive concern about the way Boonin has framed the problem. The conclusion of the argument, as Boonin formulates it, is the claim that Wilma's act of conceiving Pebbles is not morally wrong. But the claim that an action is not wrong is not equivalent to the claim that there is no moral reason against an action. For example, it is permissible to break a promise about meeting your friend for lunch in order to save a child from drowning. In that case, saving the child instead of keeping the lunch date is not morally wrong. But, on some views at least, we can say that there was still a moral reason against breaking the promise. Although the moral reason was overridden by stronger countervailing considerations, its existence might nonetheless make it appropriate later on to apologize (or at least express some regret) to your friend, even though you did the right thing. The existence of this reason can also explain why, if we alter the circumstances of your action slightly, your action can change from being permissible to being wrong. If, for example, you break your promise, not in order to save the child, but in order to do some online shopping, then the reason to keep your promise is not overridden, and your action is wrong.

Boonin considers the claim that the actor in a non-identity case "would have a moral reason to wait" to have the child (p. 11). However, he writes that such a formulation "seems . . . like simply saying that it would be morally better for her to wait" (p. 11). He then argues that the claim that it would be morally better to wait does not generate the non-identity problem, so he opts to formulate the Implausible Conclusion in terms of all-things-considered wrongness. However, the claim that there is a reason to wait is not the same as the claim that it would be morally better to wait. In the promise case, there is a reason to keep your promise, but it is not morally better to keep your promise. Moreover, the claim that there is a reason for Wilma to wait does generate the non-identity problem: similar reasoning to that employed by the non-identity argument supports the claim that there is no reason for Wilma to wait, and this conclusion seems even less plausible than Boonin's Implausible Conclusion.

Indeed, it is worth emphasizing that whether we formulate the Implausible Conclusion in terms of a reason or in terms of all-things-considered wrongness matters to how plausible or implausible it really is. To see why, consider one of the supplemental arguments Boonin offers at the end of his book in order to show that the Implausible Conclusion is more consonant with commonsense morality than we might have thought. Boonin formulates the first two premises of the argument as follows:

(P1) If you must choose between conceiving a blind child and conceiving no child, it is not immoral to choose to conceive a blind child.
(P2) If you must choose between conceiving no child and conceiving a sighted child, it is not immoral to choose to conceive no child. (p. 199)

He then argues for a principle of transitivity. (The details of the argument and the principle are not relevant to my concerns here, so I have omitted them.) From P1, P2, and the principle of transitivity, he derives the following conclusion:

(C) If you must choose between conceiving a blind child and conceiving a sighted child, it is not immoral to choose to conceive a blind child. (p. 199)

This argument is highly plausible, given that each claim is formulated in terms of what is all-things-considered immoral. However, the argument would be less plausible if we reformulated each premise in terms of a reason against the action. I take it that on the commonsense view, there is a reason against conceiving a blind child, even if that reason is overridden by countervailing considerations, such as the consideration that this is your only chance to be a parent, or the consideration that the child would have a life worth living. So while it may not be wrong to have a blind child, it is still something a prospective parent should think about carefully. Here is what I take to be a plausible reformulation of (P1):

(P1*) There is a reason against choosing to conceive a blind child in a case where you must choose between conceiving a blind child and conceiving no child.

It is less clear how (P2) should be reformulated, but nothing here turns on this premise. Supposing that the commonsense view is that there is no reason against choosing to conceive no child, (P2) would become

(P2*) There is no reason against choosing to conceive no child in a case where you must choose between conceiving no child and conceiving a sighted child.

Given these premises, we could no longer derive the Implausible Conclusion, although (P1*) alone would support the following:

(C*) There is a reason against choosing to conceive a blind child in a case where you must choose between conceiving a blind child and conceiving a sighted child.

After all, the morally relevant features that generate the reason in the "this child or no child" case would presumably generate the same reason in the "this child or that child" case. Notice that (C*) does not provide any support for the Implausible Conclusion; if anything, it cuts against it, since the reason in the "this child or that child" case is less likely to be overridden.

That said, Boonin makes it clear that the transitivity argument is not supposed to be a stand-alone argument for the Implausible Conclusion. Instead, he writes that the argument for the Implausible Conclusion "has already been provided by the non-identity argument itself in conjunction with the objections I have raised against the various attempts to overcome the argument" (p. 191). Still -- although I won't defend this claim here -- I believe that my objection to the transitivity argument could motivate a similar objection to Boonin's treatment of other proposed solutions to the non-identity problem. Which solution we opt for may depend crucially on how we formulate the problem.

Despite these objections to Boonin's formulation of the problem, I think that, given his formulation, his argument is highly compelling. His negative arguments are thorough, clear, and insightful, and his positive arguments are illuminating. Anyone whose research relates to the non-identity problem -- and given the interdisciplinary nature of the problem, that is a large number of people -- would be well advised to read this book.

REFERENCE

Jonathan Haidt (2001). The emotional dog and its rational tail: A social intuitionist approach to moral judgment. Psychological Review 108(4), 814-834.