Susan Wolf

The Variety of Values: Essays on Morality, Meaning, and Love

Susan Wolf, The Variety of Values: Essays on Morality, Meaning, and Love, Oxford University Press, 2015, 263pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780195332810.

Reviewed by Sara Protasi, University of Puget Sound

Few essays evoke the same enthusiastic praise for their combination of rigorous reasoning, elegant writing style and influential thesis as Susan Wolf's "Moral Saints."[1] Its placement as the inaugural piece in this collection allows one to see that it is not only chronologically but also conceptually prior to Wolf's subsequent essays. It contains the seeds, in Wolf's own metaphor, from which sprouted an impressively cohesive collection of arguments concerning the forcefulness and inescapability of moral demands, and the significance and resilience of nonmoral values.

In the introduction, with a mixture of humility and pride, Wolf calls attention to the systematic nature of these thirteen articles (only one of which is previously unpublished), and details the connections among them. She highlights central, recurrent ideas and explains how the essays relate to the original themes of "Moral Saints," namely how there is more to value than morality, how moral considerations may be less forceful than moral philosophers have often portrayed them, and how different value reasons can pull us in opposite directions. The first part of the book, "Moral and Nonmoral Values," focuses on the nature and importance of nonmoral values, and their relation to moral ones. The connected topic of the structure and importance of morality is discussed in part 4, "The Concept of Duty." In the middle, part 2 ("Meaning in Life") explores the topic of meaningfulness, and part 3 discusses "Love".

Wolf devotes the final section of the introduction to the cover of the book, which features a still life by Willem Heda, the Dutch painter, depicting the remains of a luscious feast. Wolf tells us that she appreciates the Dutch Golden Age genre because of its rich textures, and one cannot help but think of the rich textures of her philosophical writing. Wolf explains that she is attracted by what she considers these paintings' characteristic "ambivalence and ambiguity" (8): in the Calvinist context where they were produced and sold, sensual pleasures and appreciation of material goods were condemned, and still lifes were allegories of transience, warnings against appreciating things that are doomed to decay. But the paintings themselves are magnificent objects, and their melancholic message is obfuscated, contradicted, and possibly nullified by the very means with which it is conveyed.

Wolf is here pointing to a tension that infuses all the essays, one way or the other: the tension between moral demands ("don't value material goods!") and the demands of beauty, of taste, and, in general, of nonmoral value. She constantly shows us how decent, well-rounded agents cannot, and should not, always wholeheartedly comply with their moral obligations, for two reasons. First, because nonmoral values are intrinsically important, and Wolf convincingly articulates this importance throughout the book, highlighting the shallowness of the dichotomy morality vs. self-interest that was characteristic of moral philosophy when "Moral Saints" was published. Second, because morality cannot keep its irreplaceable role of requiring us to take into account the needs and interests of others, if it is too demanding. When we conceive of morality as overriding every other practical consideration, people will not have "the freedom to live lives that they can find to be good and rewarding" (228) and will be less inclined to respect moral imperatives.

Notwithstanding her commitment to the plurality of values, however, Wolf ends up neglecting some crucial aspects of what is symbolized in her beloved Dutch Golden Age paintings: our embodied, emotional nature, our being subject to impulses and unendorsed habits, our being attuned to and appreciative of simple pleasures, such as the pleasures of the table that are the subject of Heda's still lifes.

To start with this last point: Wolf rarely talks in positive terms about the more mundane kinds of nonmoral values that occupy a central role in most people's lives. For instance, in "Good-for-Nothings" (ch. 5), she rejects a welfarist theory of value, arguing that there can be things that are good independently of the fact that they benefit us: "These things are not good because they benefit us; they benefit us because they are good" (76). Her examples of good things are: reading Middlemarch, watching The Wire, practicing the cello, training for a marathon, appreciating seventeenth century Dutch paintings, and more generally "good art, good philosophy, good science" (73). She explicitly contrasts these activities and pursuits with less valuable counterparts: reading The Da Vinci Code, watching Project Runway, and playing Angry Birds.

Wolf's examples of good things are well-chosen to resonate with her audience of professional philosophers in the Anglophone tradition, in its current demographic make-up. Extending Wolf's point to different cultural and socio-economic contexts seems relatively straightforward. For instance, we could talk of reading the Mahabharata, watching Taiwanese puppetry shows, practicing the djembe. However, this expansion would leave unaltered the most significant feature of Wolf's examples: they are all meant to be expressions of excellence. After saying that art, philosophy, and science are among the "things of immeasurable value" (76) with which the world is replete, and that "we may think of our lives as better, and more fortunate, insofar as we are able to be in appreciative touch with some of the most valuable of these" (76), Wolf goes on to say that "a good human life involves 'enjoyment of the excellent'" (77). But having immeasurable value is not the same as being excellent, and treating them as equivalent has two consequences.

First, it makes one more likely to overlook admittedly less complex sources of values, such as those stemming from appreciation of natural beauty, or from sensual activities such as eating, or having sex, the kind of transient but valuable experiences that were shunned by Dutch Calvinists.

Secondly, it risks restricting the chance of a "better, and more fortunate" life to those who are capable of experiencing excellence. Consider a cognitively disabled person. Her impairment prevents her from intellectual excellence: she cannot read Middlemarch, nor understand The Wire, and she could never distinguish a Rembrandt from a Kinkade. She does, however, watch Project Runway, she can read children books, and she really enjoys eating juicy apples and walking in the park. Her impairment also prevents her from moral excellence. While she may be naturally virtuous, in the Aristotelian sense, she cannot achieve practical wisdom, distinguish between hypothetical and categorical imperatives, or maximize utility. Finally, while she is affectionate to her family members, her loving behavior is often immature and self-centered, comparable to that of a toddler. But even though moral, intellectual, and "interpersonal" excellence are bound to be out of her reach, she is in appreciative touch with some things of immeasurable value, and I hesitate to think that her life is less good and less fortunate than mine.

Another context in which Wolf's view could be enriched by taking into consideration a greater variety of psychological profiles is her discussion of personal love. Love is the main topic of chapters 9, 10 and 11, but also comes up in other essays as an exemplary source of "values . . . that compete both motivationally and normatively with moral values" (5). In "The Importance of Love" (ch. 10), Wolf defines love as "caring, deeply and personally, for a person for her own sake" (191). It is an "orientation in the world" that "gives us reasons to live" (191).

Wolf's account is close to the commonsensical understanding of love, and similar to other influential philosophical accounts, such as Harry Frankfurt's.[2] But specific to her approach is how Wolf envisions the role of love's reasons in practical deliberation. In "Morality and Partiality" (ch. 3), for instance, Wolf defends a conception of morality that incorporates what she calls the Impartialist Insight -- "the claim that all persons are equally deserving of well-being and respect" (33) -- in a "moderate" way, so as to be compatible with the demands of partiality "without apology" (35). Her approach on the one hand acknowledges that friendship and love are valuable in themselves, independently of their contribution to morality, but on the other also embraces the possibility of a radical choice in favor of partiality, even at a grave moral cost: the choice of a woman to hide her criminal son from the police, causing an innocent to be imprisoned in his place. Wolf suggests that the woman's hesitation to act according to morality is not only understandable but "positively reasonable . . . . After all, if the meaning of one's life and one's very identity is bound with someone as deeply as a mother's life is characteristically tied to her son's, why should the dictates of impartial morality be regarded as decisive?" (41). She goes on to say that such a woman might be as worthy of admiration and respect as her counterpart who decides not to shelter her son.

While I am sympathetic with Wolf's picture, I worry that she relies on an all-too-rosy picture of motherhood and maternal love, thus implicitly moralizing love itself. To the extent that Wolf convinces us that partiality can reasonably trump impartiality, she succeeds in doing so by describing the mother as engaging in "tortured deliberations" (42), ready to sacrifice her own well-being for the sake of her son's: "Do to me what you like . . . . Judge me as you will. I will go to hell if I have to, but my son is more important to me than my moral salvation." (41). This mother is a selfless martyr. Some readers might in fact take issue with precisely this quasi-fanatical aspect: perhaps she should worry more about the innocent man who will go to jail in her son's place than about her own moral salvation. But even those who feel the pull of Wolf's example, and I am one of them, should bear in mind that there are darker and less valuable ways in which maternal and filial identity are tied up, than pure maternal altruism. Consider the case of a mother who is affected either by narcissistic or borderline personality disorder, or is just plain selfish.[3] Such mothers will be pained at the prospect of their child's going to jail because of the suffering it would cause to them. The shared sense of identity characterizing these relatively common relations is deeply problematic. To the extent that Wolf succeeds in showing that the mother's choice is respectable, or even admirable, she does so by relying not so much on the value of love itself, but on the value of a moralized picture of love.

Consider also Wolf's example in "'One Thought Too Many': Love, Morality, and the Ordering of Commitment" (ch. 9). The essay examines Bernard Williams' famous discussion of the man who rescues his wife instead of another drowning stranger, and who ought not, according to Williams, be motivated by the thought that she is his wife and it is permissible for him to favor her over a stranger.[4] Wolf reviews different interpretations and consequent responses to Williams' thesis, and concludes that the most common reaction is to agree with Williams that "the thought of moral permissibility would be one thought too many if it is understood to occur at the moment of action" (145, original emphases). This view, according to Wolf, is compatible with finding "nothing wrong with a person wondering, in a cool and reflective moment, under what conditions one may give preference to one's loved ones and under what conditions one may not" (146). But -- she argues -- there is in fact something wrong with the husband who reflects, in cold mind, about whether what he did was morally permissible: it is an unappealing personal ideal of a lover. In the essay she offers an alternative ideal, or rather "glimpses of a psychological profile that could be filled out so as to constitute an ideal" (161): a lover who would not constrain his actions to only those that are morally permissible, and who is unlikely to engage in moral deliberation, even hypothetically, over Williams' scenario. Wolf highlights that this is a personal and not a moral ideal, one she wishes she could realize and that she wishes for her children and friends.

Wolf claims to have sketched a psychological profile, but she does not pause to consider whether the husband depicted by Williams is a psychologically ordinary husband. Wolf is clearly sensitive to the constraints imposed on our moral ideals by nonmoral values. But there are also other constraints, imposed by our psychology.

I myself know that I fall short of being the kind of person that Wolf has in mind. I engage in the post-hoc reflections about what morality requires that Wolf deems as obtrusive, and the reason I do is that I sometimes need morality to nudge me to fulfill the demands of love.[5] Lovers are not always capable of putting their beloveds' interests before their own, for a variety of factors: weakness of the will, egoism, and, more relevant to Williams' scenario, primal instincts and emotions such as the hunger that made fathers fight with their sons over a piece of bread in concentration camps,[6] or the panic that makes a man flee in front of an avalanche instead of protecting his wife and children,[7] or, less dramatically, the sleep deprivation and exhaustion that causes petty fights between parents of a newborn.

One might respond on Wolf's behalf that she is explicit about the ideal nature of her lover, so that we should exclude those psychological facts that count as character flaws. But imagine a case in which our husband is a military rescuer. He has been trained to defeat his survival instinct, so there is no risk of him running for his life in front of an avalanche. However, he has also been trained to save perfect strangers. This is not only a deeply engrained habit, but also a part of his identity. When the avalanche approaches, his wife is at 50 meters from him, but another woman, older and less fit than his wife, is closer. It would be physically possible for him to run faster and save his wife. However, his training and professional identity kick in and he runs to save the stranger. Would a post-hoc reflection be inappropriate in this case? Could this person not be a desirable, even ideal love partner?

Wolf's decent human agents are very decent, but sometimes not quite human enough. Reflecting over less idealized profiles of lovers allows us to see also how the very boundaries between normative and axiological domains are sometimes, maybe often, blurry: in real life situations, it is often difficult to distinguish between different kinds of reasons and values. Whether or not a tired woman wakes her husband when the baby needs to be changed may be a complex deliberative act, and the final decision might be justified by a moral reason (he changed the baby earlier in the night, so it's only fair she lets him sleep), a loving one (he is sleeping so well, poor thing), both, or none (there was no time to think, she just instinctively rushed to the crib). Appreciating the variety of values means also appreciating the variety of value, its own internal miscellaneous messiness.

This remark is of course Wolfian in spirit, and I see it showcased by the essay where we find the most psychologically realistic, and thus highly flawed, examples of human agents: "Loving Attention: Lessons in Love from The Philadelphia Story" (ch. 10). Wolf uses the movie The Philadelphia Story as a case study for understanding Iris Murdoch's notion of loving attention as a moral virtue. Wolf's conclusion is that loving attention can be a moral virtue insofar as it is interpreted as "loving of the world" (177). This conclusion is reached through a detailed analysis of the movie and the loving styles of it characters. This method of inquiry, inherently attuned to the complexity of human psychology, not coincidentally leads Wolf to minimize the differences between the domains of value: personal love is argued to be fundamentally analogous to loving the world, including people who are evil and thus unworthy of love, and to love of the arts, and even, maybe, love of chocolate and basketball (cf. footnote 11, 179).

If I had to summarize the gist of my critical remarks in a slogan, it would be: "more chocolate and basketball, please". But I would not be in the position of making such remarks had it not been for Susan Wolf's ground-breaking articulation of the importance of not being saintly.

For their feedback on this review I thank Aaron Meskin and Shen-yi Liao, and especially Michael Della Rocca and Tyler Doggett for extensive discussions.

[1] Journal of Philosophy 79(8): 419-439 (1982).

[2] It would have been interesting for Wolf to compare her view to Frankfurt's view in The Reasons of Love (Princeton University Press, 2006), especially given their opposite perspectives on the relation between love for others and self-love.

[3] Lydia Davis portrays such a mother in "Selfish" (The Collected Stories of Lydia Davis, Penguin, 2011, 441-442). The story is chilling because the mother is not depicted as abnormal in a clinical sense, even though of course the distinction between a psychological pathology and a moral flaw may not always be easy to draw.

[4] Bernard Williams, Moral Luck, Cambridge University Press, 1981, 1-19. For simplicity throughout the paper I maintain the husband/wife language, which does not imply endorsing a conventional picture of romantic love, according to which lovers are heterosexual, married, etc.

[5] I do not mean to imply that Wolf is not aware of the existence of conflicts between one's self-interests and the interests of our beloved, as she explicitly talks about these conflicts (see, e.g., the conclusion of ch. 3, p. 46). What I argue here is that the existence of these conflicts should play a larger role in determining what ideals of love are obtainable, and thus desirable.

[6] As recounted by Primo Levi in If This is a Man, Abacus, 2013.

[7] This example is inspired by the movie Force Majeure.