2015.07.17

Chenyang Li and Franklin Perkins (eds.)

Chinese Metaphysics and Its Problems

Chenyang Li and Franklin Perkins (eds.), Chinese Metaphysics and Its Problems, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 242 pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107093508.

Reviewed by Joseph A. Adler, Professor Emeritus of Asian Studies and Religious Studies, Kenyon College


As the publisher's blurb states, this "is the first English-language anthology devoted to Chinese metaphysics." With its twelve meaty chapters and a helpful introduction it is an extremely solid and welcome addition to the rapidly growing body of literature on comparative philosophy. The "problems" are not so much problems within Chinese metaphysics as they are problems in the Western understanding of the subject. In fact, the editors, in their Introduction, begin with the question, "Do the Chinese really have metaphysics?" -- suggesting not that it is really up for debate but rather that in some respects Chinese metaphysics is different enough from the Western variety that it may not be recognized as such by some philosophers steeped in the Aristotelian tradition and its offshoots. This is similar to the situation of some Western scholars studying Chinese religion before the mid-twentieth century, who didn't recognize it when they saw it because they brought with them the assumption that Christianity was the standard for what a religion must look like. Although philosophers trained only in the Western traditions may have some difficulty with the most detailed parts of these essays, they will undoubtedly benefit by reading what they can. As the editors' say:

Placing metaphysical questions in a comparative context helps us to broaden the formulation of our questions. It not only enables us to find new insights into the standard questions of Western metaphysics, but also helps us to see how those questions might be more provincial than they initially appear to be (p. 8).

One way of describing the fundamental difference between Chinese and Western philosophies, including metaphysics, was suggested in 1987 by David L. Hall and Roger T. Ames in theirThinking Through Confucius[1] and has been elaborated upon in many of their subsequent writings, including Ames' essay in this volume. Hall and Ames, inspired by Alfred North Whitehead,[2] described two ways of thinking about order: rational (or logical) order and aesthetic order. In brief, rational order presumes transcendent ordering principles that are instantiated in individual existents. Plato's idea of eternal forms and the Biblical notion of an uncreated creator god obviously fall into this category. In this way of thinking, contingent things derive their meaning and identity from the extent to which they reflect these transcendent principles. A contemporary example would be the claim that the idea of marriage has an essence (the union of one man and one woman) that cannot be changed by contingent changes in social ethics, and so same-sex marriage is not really marriage. Aesthetic order, on the other hand, presumes that the meaning and identity of things emerges from the ever-changing flow of contingent events; it is not imposed on things by a transcendent principle or law-giver. Change, not permanence, is real, and things are seen not as substances but as processes defined by their relationships with other things. This is the kind of thinking used by those who say that the true meaning of marriage can and does change. Of course, rational and aesthetic order as described here are ideal types and are not presumed to characterize either Western or Chinese thinking categorically. But it is clear that logical order has predominated in the West -- at least until Whitehead -- and aesthetic order has predominated in China.

I mention these categories because I think they provide a good foundational theory to account for the differences between Chinese and Western metaphysics. (Ames alludes to them in his essay, but no one else in this volume does.) Western metaphysics in general rests on a substance ontology, while Chinese metaphysics rests on process; processes and relations are primary entities, not secondary characteristics of primary substances. Brook Ziporyn, in his essay (chapter 10) on the eleventh-century Neo-Confucian thinker Zhang Zai, goes so far as to assert that Zhang Zai conceived "harmony as substance," contrary to the common-sense understanding that harmony must be the harmony of some things and that those things must be the primary substance(s). Zhang Zai has traditionally been considered a monist for whom the primary substance was qi氣 (translated nicely by John Makeham in chapter 12 as "vital stuff," although Ziporyn uses the less accurate "material force"). Zhang's other key terms were "Great Harmony" (taihe 太和) and "Great Void" (taixu 太虛), which are usually said to be predicates of qi -- Harmony describing it as concretized forms and Void as its dispersed state. Ziporyn, however, argues:

what all things really are is qi, but what qi really is is also the Great Void, and thus what both qi and the Great Void really really are is the Great Harmony. Qi is the one substance, but it turns out that its being-qi is a predicate of something more basic, the Great Harmony (175-176).

I suppose this argument rests on a meaningful distinction between "really" and "really really," but I was not convinced: I still think that qi in Zhang's thought is primary, although it must be mentioned that qi for him and all other Chinese thinkers is inherently dynamic, so it is not a substance in the sense of a static essence. Otherwise, though, this chapter is really clearly written and illuminating, especially its introductory discussion of monism per se. Ziporyn refers to Spinoza as a Western example of a philosophical monist, although he provides no description of Spinoza's philosophy, perhaps for considerations of space. Sankara would have been an excellent example too (although Western only in the sense of his Indo-European language context) and perhaps easier to summarize briefly.

The first two chapters of Chinese Metaphysics cover what are perhaps the two most fundamental concepts in traditional Chinese thought: yin/yang 陰陽 (dark/light, negative/positive, falling/rising, etc.) and qi 氣. Robin R. Wang's essay on the former (which she writes as yinyang) overlaps somewhat with her recent book, Yinyang: The Way of Heaven and Earth in Chinese Thought and Culture (Cambridge, 2012), for example, in describing the six primary forms of yinyang relations: (1) contradiction and opposition, (2) interdependence, (3) mutual inclusion, (4) interaction or resonance, (5) complementary or mutual support, and (6) change and transformation (22-26). What is new here includes a good introductory discussion of the Chinese term for "metaphysics," xing'er shang 形而上 ("above form") and its complement, xing'er xia 形而下 ("below [and within] form"), with an illuminating discussion of the fact that "form" is contained in both. In my view she overstates the symmetry of these terms, relying too heavily on the component characters themselves at the expense of their usage. Their non-symmetry is reflected in the translations I have given above. Still, the suggestion that the metaphysical realm is not fundamentally separate from the physical is right on the mark and in fact is one of those differences that has led some to say that "Chinese metaphysics" is an oxymoron.

JeeLoo Liu's essay on "qi-naturalism" begins with an excellent discussion of different forms of naturalism, e.g. scientific naturalism, liberal naturalism, humanistic naturalism. She then presents the case for qi-naturalism, including a historical survey of this way of thinking in China: the classical Daoism of Laozi and Zhuangzi, the Huainanzi (second century BCE), Zhang Heng (second century CE), Zhang Zai (eleventh century), Wang Fuzhi (seventeenth century), Xiong Shili (twentieth century), and a few contemporary Chinese philosophers (41-51). This section may be a bit routine for those already familiar with the history of Chinese thought, but others will gain much from it. In her concluding section on "the plausibility of qi-naturalism" she suggests that its value lies in its capacity to account for the emergence of mental phenomena in a non-reductionistic way. This is based on the fact that the concept of qi from the beginning included the whole spectrum of matter, energy, mind, and spirit.

Franklin Perkins' essay, "What is a thing (wu 物)? The problem of individuation in early Chinese metaphysics," is a wonderfully clear analysis of the differences between substance ontology and Chinese process ontology. His main point is that to be a thing is to be differentiated out, in a perceivable way, from an underlying unity, and it is the underlying unity that is ultimately real. Things are what they are only in relation to other things. In a nice bit of philosophical etymology he says:

When Western philosophers wanted to account for things, they went deep, to what literally "stands under" (substance/sub-stantia) or is "thrown under" (subject/sub-jectus) the appearances, a view that was theorized through the distinction of substances and their modes or modifications. Chinese philosophers went the opposite direction, toward the surface, so that to be a wu is just to be a certain distinct appearance, not an underlying entity which possesses that appearance (63).

Ultimately, though, the reality of a thing is both its differentiated form and its rootedness in the underlying unity; one in many and many in one. This kind of dynamic uniting of opposites without denying their real differences is characteristic of Chinese thought, as symbolized by the well-known yin/yang or taiji (Supreme Polarity) symbol .

Chris Fraser's chapter on the Mohist conception of reality attempts to show that some of the basic shared features of pre-Qin (221-206 BCE) thought were first explicitly enunciated by the followers of Mo Di (c. 470-c. 391 BCE). These include the focus on dao (the Way) and patterns or models, anti-reductionism, and the idea that reality is knowable through the senses. He succeeds in demonstrating some depth to a tradition that is sometimes dismissed as relatively superficial, but he admits that the Mohists did not provide answers to such questions as how we can know that the carpenter's set-square (as a pattern) is really square.

Ames' essay is "Reading the Zhongyong 'metaphysically.'" The Zhongyong中庸, traditionally translated as "Doctrine of the Mean" but more accurately as "Centrality and Commonality" or, by Ames, "Focusing the Familiar,"[3] is one of the "Four Books" of the classical Confucian canon (as determined by the twelfth-century Neo-Confucian, Zhu Xi), and is considered to be the most profound of the four. Ames' reading of the text focuses on the vital role of relationality, aesthetic order (here referred to as "the art of contextualizing") and "role ethics" (a compelling alternative to the "virtue ethics" category used by most contemporary philosophers studying Confucianism).[4] In this essay Ames demonstrates his talent for deeply exploring the meanings of Chinese words and following through on their implications. My one quibble with Ames is his penchant for over-translation, such as "trans-form-ing" for ti-yong 體用 (substance-function, 91), "world-making" for dao 道 (Way, 93), "that which is immanent" (misspelled here as "imminent") for yin 隱 (hidden, secret, 97), and "consolidate their virtuosic habits as an inner disposition for action" for shen du 慎獨 (cautious when alone, 97). While it is true that every translation is an interpretation, sometimes distinctions should be made between a translation and an explanation.

Jiyuan Yu's chapter is a thorough analysis of Heraclitus' concept of logos and Laozi's concept of dao. He begins by quoting A. C. Graham 's statement that "no Chinese thinker conceives the One and the constant as Being or reality behind the veil of appearance" (105) [5] and a similar one by Hall and Ames, "for the Chinese there is no 'being' behind the myriad beings (wanwu orwanyu), no One behind the Many, no Reality behind Appearance" (ibid., n.1).[6] Yu concludes, however, that the common observation that Heraclitus and Laozi have much in common is valid and that Laozi really does seek the reality behind appearances, demonstrating an exception to the generalizations of Graham, Hall and Ames. "The common point is not that they both talk about change, but rather that the unity of opposites (Heraclitus) or the balance of opposites (Laozi) persists through changes" (119). Of course, a single exception may in fact prove the rule rather than contradict it.

I will only briefly describe the rest of the essays. Michael Puett looks for metaphysical assumptions in some of the early Chinese ritual texts, primarily the "Liyun" (Conveyance of Rites) chapter of the Liji (Record of Ritual) and a bit from the Huainanzi. Hans-Rudolf Kantor dives deeply into the logic of emptiness in Chinese Mahayana Buddhism, focusing on the inseparability of truth and falsehood (epistemology) and reality and falsehood (ontology). Vincent Shen continues the exploration of Chinese Mahayana by examining the Huayan school's concept of event in relation to Whitehead's ontology. John Berthrong proposes a new formula for organizing Zhu Xi's cosmology and metaphysics in "four paradigmatic domains": benti 本體("coherent principles and conditions"), yong 用 ("dynamic functions or processes"), he/wen 和文 ("harmonizing cultural outcomes"), and de 德 ("axiological values and virtues") (196). And finally, John Makeham gives a perceptive analysis of Xiong Shili's (1885-1968) metaphysics of ontology/phenomenology, which was based largely on Yogacara Buddhism in a Confucian context.

The book is relatively well-produced, with a smattering of typographical errors. Footnotes rather than endnotes are provided, and Chinese characters are used liberally. On the whole the essays are well-written and extremely perceptive. Anyone with an interest in Chinese or comparative philosophy, with or without prior exposure to the Chinese side, will learn much from it.


[1] David L. Hall and Roger T. Ames, Thinking Through Confucius (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987), 11-21, 131-138.

[2] Alfred North Whitehead, Modes of Thought (NY: Macmillan, 1938), 60-63.

[3] Roger T. Ames and David L. Hall, trans., Focusing the Familiar: A Translation and Philosophical Interpretation of the Zhongyong (Honolulu: University of Hawai'i Press, 2001).

[4] See also his Role Ethics: A Vocabulary (Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2011).

[5] A. C. Graham, Disputers of the Tao (La Salle: Open Court, 1989).

[6] David L. Hall and Roger T. Ames, Thinking from the Han: Self, Truth, and Transcendence in Chinese and Western Culture (Albany: SUNY Press, 1998).