Jay L. Garfield

Engaging Buddhism: Why It Matters to Philosophy

Jay L. Garfield, Engaging Buddhism: Why It Matters to Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2015, 376pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190204341.

Reviewed by Charles Goodman, Binghamton University

Over the past few decades, it has gotten easier and easier for analytically trained philosophers to engage with the Buddhist tradition and learn something in the process. Of the scholars whose diligent efforts have made this development possible, one of the most important is Jay L. Garfield, whose writings on the subject draw both on his mastery of Western philosophy and on his rigorous and long-sustained engagement with the Tibetan Buddhist tradition. His valuable new book admirably serves its purpose of helping analytic philosophers understand some of what Buddhists have written about the very questions they study. In fact, Engaging Buddhism goes further, giving strong reasons to believe that contemporary physicalist philosophers of mind could strengthen their positions in important ways by drawing on Buddhist thought and that analytic philosophers more generally can find valuable insights in the Buddhist tradition.

This book has many strengths. The writing is crisp, technically precise, yet elegant and engaging. The discussion is at its very best when it draws on Garfield's impressive expertise in the philosophy of mind, but the whole book benefits from his wide-ranging and deep knowledge of Western thought. The coverage of Buddhism is broad both geographically and historically as he engages not only with Indian but also Tibetan and even Chinese and Japanese sources. Garfield is constantly aware of, and frequently calls the reader's attention to, the differences between the various traditions of Buddhist thought. He is especially strong in bringing out the diversity of the Tibetan tradition. The discussion explicitly and carefully distinguishes the core teachings that are widely accepted among Buddhists from the areas of controversy and disagreement within the tradition. Garfield has thought very carefully about how to translate Buddhist technical terms with English words that play similar philosophical roles, avoiding the tendency of some translations to mislead Westerners about the structure of Buddhist views. Though the presentation is pitched at an appropriate level for philosophically educated non-specialists, Garfield frequently offers striking interpretive insights that will be of benefit even to those most familiar with Buddhist thought.

Meanwhile, the weaknesses of the book are minor. For example, Garfield continues his longstanding habit of egregiously misspelling large numbers of Sanskrit and Pāli words, especially in the titles of texts. But this hardly matters since only specialists in the field will need the original-language titles or terms, and they can correct for these mistakes.

Chapter 1 covers some basic aspects of Buddhist teachings and does so remarkably well. Here Garfield offers a sensitive, rich and subtle discussion of the term dukkha and its role in Buddhism. The chapter also helps readers to understand the scope and limits of the book's intellectual goals and offers a brief sketch of the historical development of Buddhist thought that should help many readers get their bearings and put the discussions that follow into context.

Chapter 2 illustrates the relations between the Buddhist tradition's metaphysics and its philosophy of language. In this chapter, I was especially impressed by Garfield's clear and illuminating explanation of the key Buddhist distinction between causes and conditions.

Chapter 3 discusses the crucial Mahāyāna teaching of emptiness. Garfield's exposition of this topic is so skillful and precise that he makes the formidable task of explaining emptiness look easy. On the other hand, the chapter's discussion of the broader philosophical implications of Buddhist arguments for emptiness is somewhat disappointing. Here Garfield focuses on the claim that accepting emptiness commits Buddhists to dialetheism: the view that there are true contradictions at the limits of thought. Now this is a possible interpretation of the Mahāyāna and one that Garfield has himself ably defended, but it is also highly controversial and, indeed, has been rejected by many of the most philosophically impressive writers in the Tibetan tradition. Garfield alludes to the controversy in a footnote, but nevertheless, non-specialist readers might come away with the misleading impression that Garfield's bold dialetheist interpretation is a consensus view among Buddhists.

Chapter 4 offers a rich and nuanced discussion of the Buddhist doctrine of no self, engaging with a wide variety of views of self in the contemporary philosophical literature. He carefully discusses variations in how this teaching is understood and presented in several Buddhist traditions. In this regard, Garfield's account of the key differences between two seemingly similar Buddhist views of how persons exist -- namely, those of the Pudgalavādins on the one hand and the philosopher Candrakīrti on the other -- is wonderfully illuminating and helpful. Throughout, his presentation shows how powerful the reasons are for taking seriously the counterintuitive and strange-seeming Buddhist view on the self.

The perennially controversial topic of consciousness is the topic of Chapter 5. Here Garfield examines the concept of reflexive awareness, how it was defended by Indian Buddhist epistemologists, and the attacks on it mounted by philosophers from the Madhyamaka tradition, whose view he endorses. Garfield traces this debate through its development from India into Tibet, referring frequently to analogies between this conversation and moves made by contemporary Western philosophers of mind. The impressive Chapter 6 continues this discussion into the area of phenomenology. Garfield is careful to clarify what he means by "phenomenology" and to distinguish different approaches to this field. He offers very interesting remarks on what a phenomenological reading of Yogācāra Buddhism would look like.

But the real surprise that emerges from the discussion in Chapters 5 and 6 comes from Garfield's intriguing argument that Buddhist texts can be of great use to contemporary physicalism since they contain insights that can be used to respond to the zombie argument for dualism and indeed to undercut the motivations for accepting the reality of phenomenal qualia. This is true even though the historical Buddhist philosophers from whom these insights are drawn were unequivocally not physicalists. Nevertheless, in arguing against idealism and epistemological foundationalism, philosophers such as Candrakīrti in India and Tsong kha pa in Tibet rejected what Sellars called the "Myth of the Given;" and according to Garfield, their work "provides [a] more principled reason" than contemporary materialists do "for treating self-knowledge in the same way as knowledge of the external world" (p. 152). In this connection, Garfield shows that Tsong kha pa's abstract and difficult remarks about the non-existence of reflexive awareness are powerfully supported by recent psychological findings demonstrating that "our inner sense, like our outer sense, is fallible" (p. 173.) The discussion draws on Garfield's important 2006 article on the subject, while going beyond that piece in several ways. On the whole he makes a powerful case for a relational view of consciousness that does away with the intrinsic qualitative properties that have led to so many philosophical controversies and problems. His interpretation of Madhyamaka thus has almost diametrically imposed implications to that proposed by Dan Arnold in such recent works as Brains, Buddhas and Believing (Columbia University Press, 2012.) Though both of these readings are articulated with great sophistication and are supported by impressive arguments, it is Garfield's, on my view, that is more convincing in the end.

The most technical and complex philosophical discussions in the latter half of the first millennium CE in India were almost all about epistemological questions. Accordingly, considerable scholarly efforts have recently been devoted to the difficult interpretive questions posed by Indian epistemological texts. In Chapter 7, Garfield focuses mostly on one particular aspect of this broad topic: namely, the role of Buddhist epistemology in the Madhyamaka tradition. Here his discussion is strongly influenced by the views of Tsong kha pa. Garfield's attempts here to draw broader lessons for philosophy have some plausibility but do not go beyond ideas that have already been thoroughly discussed in the secondary literature.

The focus of Chapter 8 is on several paradoxes that Garfield finds in the works of Buddhist authors and on how those authors grapple with them. Much of this chapter is concerned with quite difficult and intricately convoluted East Asian texts. Even with Garfield's helpful explanations, many readers may find these parts of the discussion very hard to follow. But the chapter also contains a clear and illuminating exposition of Nāgārjuna's philosophy of language as presented in the Reply to Objections (Vigraha-vyāvartanī.) And Garfield explains and defends his interpretation of Madhyamaka as involving non-standard logic.

Chapter 8 concludes with an intriguing exploration of ways in which Buddhist views of language might be consonant with the project of naturalizing epistemology and philosophy of mind. Though Garfield's remarks are suggestive and well worth further investigation, they seem underdeveloped relative to the careful arguments presented earlier.

In Chapter 9, Garfield shows that Buddhism advocates a change in the way in which we relate to morally relevant aspects of our experience and illustrates this thesis with many helpful examples. Interested readers will learn much accurate information from this chapter about what is distinctive about Buddhist approaches to normative questions.

Garfield also wades into the ongoing debate about the underlying theoretical structure of Buddhist ethics, claiming that moral phenomenology constitutes the center of the tradition's normative views. Like other authors, he emphasizes the work of Śāntideva, who is perhaps the most interesting and important Buddhist ethicist. Unfortunately his case against competing virtue ethics and consequentialist interpretations of Śāntideva's thought seems to consist, for the most part, merely of conclusory assertions. Garfield does point out one major problem for the consequentialist interpretation I and others have advanced: the apparent absence of passages discussing tradeoffs between the welfare of different others. Moreover, he does show that his account has a kind of theoretical unity in that it explains the criterion of moral praiseworthiness as being based on the standard provided by the experience of the person who is awake.

Yet for the most part Garfield says little to support his rejection of the possibility that the transformation of moral phenomenology that he documents could be understood in the context of a consequentialist or virtue-ethics reading of the texts. Indeed, his own account could easily be classified as a form of virtue ethics. And he ignores almost all of the extensive textual evidence for these alternative interpretations. Garfield wants to say something like this on behalf of the Buddhist tradition: that moral cultivation has as its goal the development of awakened experience, after which one will behave in a way that is inconceivable, indescribable and inexpressible. But why not read the tradition instead as saying that moral cultivation has as its goal the development of awakened experience, after which one will behave in the way that brings the greatest benefit to sentient beings? There are indeed Buddhist texts of which the first account is a plausible interpretation, but the second fits Śāntideva considerably better. Garfield will have to say much more if he wants to convince other scholars in the field of the cogency of his particularist and phenomenological reading of Buddhist ethics.

The book concludes with some interesting remarks about the methodological challenges and possibilities of cross-cultural philosophy. In fact, it is a wonderful illustration of those very possibilities. The availability of such books makes the determination of some analytic philosophers to ignore Asian philosophy even more difficult to excuse. For the rest of us, Garfield has done a wonderful service in producing this impressive and intriguing book, which is always interesting and often enjoyable to read and which can open up new philosophical prospects equally well for both long-standing and newly minted students of Buddhist thought.