2015.09.05

Peter Hare

Pragmatism with Purpose: Selected Writings

Peter Hare, Pragmatism with Purpose: Selected Writings, Joseph Palencik, Douglas R. Anderson, and Steven A. Miller (eds.), Fordham University Press, 2015, 325pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823264322.

Reviewed by Lee McIntyre, Boston University


This handsome volume is a worthy tribute to Peter Hare, one of the most influential figures in American philosophy, who died unexpectedly in 2008 at the age of 72. One is grateful for the chance to measure the four corners of a busy scholar's thought and influence at the end of his consequential life. This volume fits the bill, bringing together many of Hare's most important papers on pragmatism, the ethics of belief, epistemology, naturalism, the philosophy of religion, poetry, and social critique. Although edited posthumously by three scholars who were close to Hare's work, it is hard to imagine that Hare himself could have chosen better or spent more care in presenting work that demonstrates the full scope of his thought.

What is most remarkable, though, is that even for a set of academic essays the man himself shines through. In the many obituaries of Hare that have appeared over the last few years we learn of his generous spirit, encouragement of young scholars, collaborative nature, and fair-mindedness. All of these virtues are in full display in this volume, made authentic by Hare's own words, as he analyzes the ideas that mean most to him.

The central idea that motivates many of the essays is -- not surprisingly -- pragmatism. Hare is known as a pragmatist, and this volume includes numerous discussions of how his own views compare to those of William James, Charles S. Peirce, John Dewey, and other scholars. Yet in the most intriguing essay in the collection Hare states:

I believe that it is seriously misleading to suggest that pragmatism is the chief American claim to importance and distinctiveness in world philosophical history. Instead our claim should be to have developed over many generations the most enriched naturalism in world philosophical history -- and what is usually called American pragmatism is a significant aspect of that enriched naturalism.

To me the short, previously unpublished essay ("The American Philosophical Tradition as Progressively Enriched Naturalism") from which this quotation is drawn is worth the price of the volume, for it is here -- later in life -- that Hare has the confidence to develop his own views in full-throated advocacy of what he believes, not just in comparison to others. It is surely enlightening in many of these essays to watch Hare dissect the views of other pragmatist thinkers and compare them to his own, but it is really only in this essay that we sees Hare plant a flag and boldly make predictions about the future of American philosophy. Here, for instance, we learn that Hare was not in the least disturbed by Richard Rorty's characterization as a pragmatist, given that his views are so orthogonal to the type of pragmatic naturalism that Hare advocates. In a pithy phrase, Hare tells us that obsession with refuting Rorty is not the right approach; instead "neglect" is what he deserves, for in 50 years Rorty's only contribution will be to have "enriched the naturalist tradition that he so labored to discredit." For a kind man who was so often given to restraint and humility, this sort of muscular advocacy for the views he thought correct was a welcome sight.

In some of Hare's other essays, where he focuses on the ethics of belief, causality, and what it might mean to say that epistemological facts are informed by but perhaps not ultimately reducible to more primary metaphysical relationships, we learn more about Hare's commitment to naturalism. For his work on pragmatism Hare is justly famous, but for his work on the philosophy of naturalism (and what Hare means by "pragmatic naturalism") this volume will provide great insight to the reader who perhaps so far has known Hare only by reputation as a pragmatist.

Still other essays in the volume, e.g., on the problem of evil, the Quine-Duhem thesis, the future of American philosophy, poetry, and social critique, demonstrate the full range of Hare's thought and the relevance (and coherence) of his views for many of the debates in modern analytic philosophy. Prior to reading this book, one might not have thought that pragmatism could have such reach into topics as diverse as ethics, the philosophy of science, religion, poetry, and politics, but Hare gives the lie to that prejudice.

It was his essays in the section on Social Critique, however, that I found most moving, for here Hare develops another aspect of his commitment to the pragmatist tradition: that philosophy should be about something more than just logic chopping and might even aspire to make the world a better place. Indeed through Hare's insights on civil disobedience and the death penalty, one feels a tug back to an earlier type of American pragmatism that predated even James, when Emerson and Thoreau tried to make sense of what human reason could tell us about contemporary life and human nature and advocated that scholarship which proceeded without a commitment to the world was hollow. For this, as well as other moments of coherence and insight into Hare's pragmatic naturalism, one recognizes the applied tradition in American philosophy as well, which must have motivated Hare to care about topics that he thought not only had intellectual bite but also might be useful in improving the human condition.

For all these virtues, I nonetheless found two flaws that, while not major, were at least a lost opportunity for the reader to learn more about both Hare and his work. First, I would have enjoyed seeing a biography of Hare written by someone other than himself. This is not to say that Hare's "Autobiographical Occasions" was not enlightening or appropriate for this volume -- just that it was too brief and incomplete. The editors were correct that the volume needed something about Hare's life at the outset but, perhaps in an ironic way, Hare was the wrong person to write it. For one thing, he is far too modest, ceding over half of his autobiographical reflections to a discussion of the work of John McDermott. It would have been useful to see someone attempt to sum up the four corners of Hare's life and influence in a way that Hare did not himself attempt. Fortunately, this problem can be remedied if the reader will go to the online document "Remembering Peter Hare," put out by the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy. It contains many pages of tribute written by Hare's students, colleagues, and friends and sheds interesting light not only on the man but also on his thought.

Second, I think it would have been useful to have included the dates of each essay. I understand the need to organize a book like this by theme, but at a certain point the reader will inevitably ask "when did Hare write this" and even "where did he publish this" in trying to judge how his beliefs may have evolved over time. The solution might have been as simple as including a list of sources so that those who were curious could see both where and when each essay was published, providing a bit more context for someone whose views certainly matured over a 40 year career.

It is perhaps telling that both of these critiques reflect a hunger to know more about the man behind the essays. In evaluating the work of a contemporary philosopher, we often do so outside the context of his life. With Hare, this is impossible, for he was not just a thinker but also someone who devoted his time to nurturing places that would help others to think: The Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy, the Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, and the Philosophy Department at the University of Buffalo. One of the most eloquent obituaries of Hare was written by John Campbell who quotes James Hayden Tufts: "the individual's span at best is short. His working years are soon counted. He can accomplish little alone. But man has learned to build institutions. Through these he gives cumulative strength and enduring life to aims and ideals of generations and ages." I can think of no more fitting epitaph for Hare's life and no better celebration of what he was able to accomplish in his too few years than what is included in this volume.