Andrew Janiak


Andrew Janiak, Newton, Wiley Blackwell, 2015, 203pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405187282.

Reviewed by Ori Belkind, Tel Aviv University

Andrew Janiak's book is part of the Blackwell Great Minds series. His aim is to present Newton as a natural philosopher, and the content of Newton's science is mostly absent from the book except when it becomes relevant for understanding Newton's philosophical approach. Janiak is a natural choice for the series as he is an important contributor to a recent renaissance of scholarship about Newton.

To bolster Newton's place as a "thinker", Janiak argues in Chapter 2, perhaps somewhat apologetically, that we ought to think of Newton as a natural philosopher rather than a scientist. Janiak claims that the criterion for distinguishing the two can be taken from Kuhn's sociology of knowledge. A scientist is someone who works within an agreed set of methods, doctrines and explanatory standards. In contradistinction, a natural philosopher is someone who engages in fundamental debates about the methods for acquiring knowledge and the metaphysical nature of the entities of the world. Since Newton is clearly engaged in foundational debates with his contemporaries, he counts as a natural philosopher rather than a scientist.

Janiak is correct in emphasizing that the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries took the role of the natural philosopher to be wider than that of a modern day scientist. However, I find Janiak's criterion for distinguishing natural philosophy from science unhelpful. Kuhn argued that there are some similarities between a pre-scientific age and the age of scientific revolution. During a scientific revolution, when a scientific paradigm runs into crisis, scientists often find themselves engaged in foundational questions. If one insists on Kuhnian terminology, one may view Newton as displacing the mechanistic paradigm of his day and his role as that of a revolutionary scientist. Moreover, it is also clear that Newton's own work and style of analyzing phenomena was influential in inspiring the distinction between philosophy and science. Thus a more helpful analysis would explain the continuity between Newton's natural philosophy and the boundaries he attempts to erect between scientific theories and the philosophical critiques they may encounter.

Another strategic choice that Janiak makes results from the fact that getting a sense of Newton's fundamental views requires detective work. Although he was well read in the philosophy of his time and in personal contact with thinkers such as G. W. Leibniz, Henry More and John Locke, Newton did not publish a systematic work of philosophy. Thus, one has to reconstruct Newton's philosophical thinking from various unpublished writings, letters, and commentaries and queries in his published work. Janiak's strategic choice is to largely focus on controversies that Newton engaged in. The idea seems to be that Newton's philosophical views necessarily come out more clearly when he criticizes others or is forced to defend his views. Reflecting this choice, Chapter 3 is devoted to the controversy between Boyle and Hobbes and the controversy between Hooke and Newton. Chapter 4 is devoted to Newton's struggle with Descartes. Chapter 5 is devoted to the role of mathematics in Newton's philosophical thinking and the reception of Newton's mathematical treatment of force. Chapter 6 focuses on Newton's struggle with Leibniz. The final Chapter 7 is devoted to Newton's concept of God and Newton's own approach to reconciling between revealed theology and natural philosophy.

Janiak's approach has obvious benefits as controversies have forced the ever cautious Newton to speak his mind. However, he does not attempt to provide any systematic account that explains how Newton's views might form a coherent (or incoherent) set of beliefs, leading to a fragmentary view of Newton's philosophy.

Newton's most foundational engagement is with Descartes's program of articulating a mathematical theory of physics, which Janiak recounts in Chapter 4. In reconstructing Newton's critique of Cartesian science, he brings to bear his deep knowledge of the historical context and a sensitivity to where the issues lie. Janiak also has a knack for articulating in engaging and clear language some of the most intractable problems.

Newton believed that Descartes's metaphysical views do not cohere with his science of motion. While reconstructing Descartes's theory of motion, Janiak uses the notion of "action" to delineate where the philosophical problems lie. In some cases this interpretive strategy is successful, but at other times it distorts or provides a limited understanding of Newton's thinking. For example, Descartes's account of the "vulgar" or the "common" understanding of motion involves the action of a body in changing from being present in one place to being present in another (p. 66). Janiak claims that one of the reasons for Descartes's rejection of the common understanding of motion is that it is in conflict with Descartes's first two laws of motion, according to which a body preserves its state of uniform rectilinear motion unless deflected by the action of some external body (p. 68). How can any action be employed when a body's state of motion remains unchanged? However, the conservation of the state of motion could be considered as its own sort of action, so the tension between the common understanding of motion and the laws of motion must lie elsewhere. The common understanding of motion allows for many possible definitions of "place", depending on the bodies that are used as reference. Thus the tension between the apparent nature of the common understanding of motion and the objective description of motion implicit in the laws of motion.

However, the concept of action is indeed helpful when Janiak reconstructs Newton's argument against Descartes's theory of motion. Descartes argues that true motion, unlike common motion, is the transfer of a body from the bodies that are in immediate contact with it (i.e., the ambient bodies that determine the body's place) to another place determined by another set of ambient bodies. Newton argues in a famous tract, known as the De Gravitatione, that if Descartes's (relational) definition of true motion is valid, one could change the true motion of a body by acting on the bodies that determine its place. There would then be no correlation between the force operating on a body and changes in its true motion. Thus, as Janiak recounts, if one is to preserve the laws of motion and utilize them in studying the forces of nature, one has to provide an alternative to Descartes's relational definition of true motion. Janiak thinks that Newton's argument holds against any relational definition of true motion. The consequence, according to Janiak, is that one can decide whether to take true motion as intrinsic or as determined in relation to absolute space. In this it seems as if Janiak is overestimating Newton's argument, given that Mach's definition of true motion in relation to the center of mass of the universe evades Newton's dilemma.

It follows from Newton's argument against Descartes's theory of motion that one ought to provide an alternative definition of true motion. Newton posits the existence of immovable places, i.e., parts of absolute space. Newton further concludes that absolute space cannot be a substance because the non-moving places are inert and do not exert any actions on bodies. He also claims that one should distinguish between empty space and impenetrability, which is the property that defines bodies and differentiates them from space. The property of impenetrability later forms the basis for Newton's Quantity of Matter or mass.

Janiak provides a mostly clear and engaging account of Newton's critique of Descartes's philosophical views. However, missing from Janiak's account is the part that explains how Newton articulated the concept of mass and an account of Newton's distinct version of the atomist view. (For a seminal paper on Newton's atomism see McGuire (1970).) Reading Janiak's account we get a view from without into Newton's thinking, but not a sense of Newton's philosophy as an organic whole.

A distinction that has become fashionable in recent scholarship is that between empiricist and experimental philosophy. While both philosophies use empirical findings, in experimental philosophy, scientific propositions are tested via carefully manipulated experiments. In Chapter 3, Janiak follows two important debates, one between Hobbes and Boyle and another between Hooke and Newton.

The debate between Hooke and Newton, which erupted after Newton published in 1672 an article about his optic experiments, is concerned with the evidentiary role of experiments. Newton argued that his optic experiments demonstrate that color and refrangibility are qualities we can attribute to light. Newton also argued that a plausible explanation of these results is that light is made of corpuscles. Hooke took these claims to be paradoxical as the conclusion that color is a quality of light (and not, say, a secondary quality of bodies or of a medium through which a wave moves) is inconsistent with the spirit of corpuscularism, which does not admit the existence of any qualities in bodies other than the "primary" ones. Hooke argues that the undulatory theory of light better describes the nature of light. Newton claimed in response that his optic experiments demonstrate that color and refrangibility are qualities that we can attribute to light and that both the corpuscular and wave "hypotheses" are consistent with these results but only roughly so.

The Hooke-Newton controversy is essentially a debate about how to use experiments. According to Janiak, Newton takes his experiments to establish certain doctrines (experimental outcomes) as true, and it is perhaps after these doctrines are established that hypotheses can be constructed. I would perhaps sharpen somewhat Janiak's reconstruction of the distinction between doctrines and hypotheses. For Hooke, an experiment has to be used in tandem with a hypothesis that makes the phenomena intelligible. Newton thought that experiments should be believed even when they are not entirely intelligible within a certain interpretive stratagem.

Janiak devotes Chapter 5 to the role of mathematics in Newton's study of nature. Janiak claims that a tension exists within Descartes's program of mathematizing physics given Descartes's plenism. If a particle moves through a fluid, without a background space, there are too many interactions to be summarized with the help of mathematical formulae. So for Janiak, the idea that the true motion of bodies is defined relative to absolute space increases the relevance of Newton's mathematics in analyzing natural phenomena.

According to Janiak, the novelty in Newton's approach is that for Newton, the mathematical principles of natural philosophy articulate descriptions of the various species of forces without the need to speculate on the material causes that bring these forces about. This to a large extent frees Newton from the mechanistic paradigm of the Cartesians but also suggests to his contemporaries that he is evading his primary responsibility as a natural philosopher.

There are two crucial elements missing from Janiak's account of Newton's mathematical philosophy. As George Smith's work shows (e.g., Smith (2002)), Newton introduces a certain style of mathematical modeling that is able to use approximating methods to get as near as possible to a full description of the phenomena. Newton explored mathematical modeling, showing how it is possible to begin, say, with modeling the motion of the earth around the sun as a two-body problem. A more complex model can later be developed, one that is used to find better approximations. It is in devising the technique of mathematical modeling that Newton's work has truly shaped modern science in many of its branches and disciplines.

Second, Newton thought that there are certain quantities that have a privileged role in describing natural phenomena. As his Rule III for the Study of Natural Philosophy makes clear, Newton had in mind a certain rule for universalizing qualities. Rule III argues that if a quality is observed in all bodies and cannot be intended or remitted, it can be universalized. The rule has often been interpreted as claiming that inherent qualities, those that are left invariant under external manipulations and circumstances, are deemed universal (for example, mass and extension seem to be considered as universal by this rule). Given this interpretation of Rule III, it is not clear why Newton thinks that gravity is also a universal quality given that its intensity varies with the distance to the central body. However Rule III is to be interpreted, it is clear that Newton had in mind some unique criterion for identifying physical quantities. Janiak's analysis of Newton's methods ignores Rule III and argues that physical quantities are those that can be measured (p. 106). But for Newton, the quantities representing physical qualities are a very small subset of measureable quantities.

Chapter 6 is devoted to Newton's "struggle" with Leibniz. Leibniz criticizes Newton's theory of gravity since he believes that Newton should have attributed gravitational motion to the impact of ethereal fluids that fill out what seems like the empty regions of the solar system. In response Newton appeals to our observations of the planetary orbits and argues that the existence of mechanical ether is inconsistent with the regular recurrence of the orbits (p. 122). Janiak argues that this is not merely an observational statement and states that Newton treats gravity as its own independent action because he thinks about the force mathematically. Again, Janiak's use of the notion of action does not fully explain Newton's reasoning. If a mechanical ether were to exist, argues Newton, there would have been some friction between the planets and the ether. Since no ether drag on the planets is observed, we may conclude that the action of the gravitational force cannot be reduced to the operations of an interplanetary fluid. Moreover, gravity observes the strictures of Rule III, and it should therefore be deemed a universal quality. Thus Newton's argument against the ether is a counterfactual set of reasoning premised on what we should have observed if the operations of the force of gravity were mechanical in origin and what characterizes physical quantities.

Janiak's discussion of the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence is clear and straightforward. The main difference between Newton and Leibniz seems to be that Leibniz took his physics to be based on his own metaphysical foundation and his Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), according to which nothing is the case that does not have a reason why it was thus rather than otherwise. Leibniz uses the PSR to derive the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles (the PII) and used those principles to argue against Newton's absolute space and absolute time. According to Leibniz, given that absolute space and time are homogenous, there is no sufficient reason why God would create the world in place x and time t or create the world in another place and time x' and t'. Clarke, acting in part as Newton's spokesperson, replied that the PSR cannot be used to argue against absolute space given that the reason for creating the world in one way rather than another stems directly from God's will, which requires no reason to act. Essentially, the debate between Leibniz and Clarke is whether brute facts, such as the absolute places where God created material objects, cohere with a theistic view, according to which the world is created by an omnipotent, omniscient divine being.

Janiak argues that the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence is a debate whether physics should be based on a metaphysical foundation or whether it can be pursued even in tension with the most plausible version of metaphysics. This depicts Newton as someone who would like to disentangle scientific reasoning from any external limitations posed by a philosophy of nature. But it seems to me that Newton's approach to metaphysics should be characterized differently. While Descartes and Leibniz seek a metaphysical theory for being qua being, Newton attempts to provide the metaphysical theory that secures the inferences from motions to the mathematical description of their putative causes. Thus, there is a metaphysical foundation to Newtonian science, but this foundation is geared towards explaining how scientific knowledge is possible.

Chapter 7 reconstructs Newton's unique solution for reconciling Scripture with science. On the one hand, Newton is a puritan and belongs to a Protestant, literalist tradition that cannot abide by an Augustinian inspired Galilean interpretation of Scripture, according to which Scripture ought to be interpreted metaphorically. Nevertheless, Newton does not construct a natural philosophy according to constraints imposed by revealed theology, as Descartes seemed to be doing in his theory of motion. Finally, Newton's approach is also distinct from Boyle's according to which there is division of labor between revealed theology and natural philosophy. Newton's approach was rather to distinguish between the way things appear to humans and how they really are. Thus, Scripture is the literal truth, given that it describes correctly how things appear, that is, how the phenomena are revealed to the senses. But these sensible measures (of time, space, and motion) are relative, apparent and common, and ought to be distinguished from the absolute, true and mathematical measures.

Janiak's book provides historically situated views into Newton's thinking, views articulated via the main controversies Newton was involved in. It is a synthesis of many resources and an unprecedented, concise summary of how Newton's work reflected on his contemporaries and how they reflected back on him. For a wider audience the book can serve as good introduction to Newton's philosophy. For scholars, it provides clear and accessible views of Newton's engagement with the philosophy of his time, although I am skeptical of some of Janiak's interpretive strategies. Ultimately, however, one is left with the desire to know more about the internal engines of Newton's worldview, the bridges which allowed him to navigate between scientific methodology, metaphysics, mathematical reasoning and theology.


McGuire, J. E. (1970). Atoms and the 'analogy of nature': Newton's third rule of philosophizing. Studies In History and Philosophy of Science Part A 1(1), 3-58.

Smith, G. E. (2002). The methodology of the principia. In I. B. Cohen and G. E. Smith (Eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Newton, pp. 138-172. Cambridge University Press.