2015.10.03

Simona Forti

New Demons: Rethinking Power and Evil Today

Simona Forti, New Demons: Rethinking Power and Evil Today, Zakiya Hanafi (trs.), Stanford University Press, 2015, 388pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804792950.

Reviewed by Brad Evans, University of Bristol


Simona Forti's book is a sophisticated and theoretically rich text, which demands wide readership. Connecting the historical experiences of organized violence with modes of political and philosophical enquiry while attending to the paradigmatic importance and realism of speculative fictions, the book takes the reader on a journey through the corpse littered landscapes of the twentieth century. In doing so, not only does it expose more fully the reductionisms of a number of dominant schools of thinking on the problem of violence, it both critically addresses and moves beyond that most timeless of philosophical questions -- unde malum -- whence the evil? Indeed, fully in keeping with the critical orientation of a number of key continental thinkers populating the text, its strength is to move beyond defining its theological terms of engagement, asking more purposefully how we might understand evil as both an organizing principle and diagnostic tool integral to understanding the way violence functions today.

It is worth beginning by outlining the book's structure as it evidences Forti's commitment to a genealogical method. This method consciously attempts to map a history of the present of evil onto the ways this provides (at the micro-political levels of consciousness and desire) a more challenging appreciation of the human condition. The book is divided into three parts, each of which could easily be read in isolation. Part I, "Absolute Demons: The Power of Nothingness", sets out the framework for the critique by introducing what is identified as "The Dostoyevsky Paradigm". Drawing particular attention to the figure of Nicholas Stavrogin from Dostoyevsky's powerful and prophetic masterpiece Demons, it points to a predominance of a historically grounded and deeply structured understanding of mass violence, in which absolute power is wagered against the absolute victim. Central here is the focus on a particular reading of historical nihilism as understood through a certain will to nothingness. Such nihilistic tendencies are made all too real via some earthly death drive. Nietzsche and Freud thus appear here as part of an unholy alliance in the psychic life of analytical power and critique, which in turn underwrites an entire body of simplistic and reductionist explanations for the causes of widespread slaughter and human destruction.

Building on this, Forti sets about to dismantle the absolutist paradigm in an Interlude, which turns to the Foucauldian concept of the bio-political as a way for rethinking power and violence in more positive and progressive ways. Within this short segment, "Hypermoral Biopolitics", which is arguably the strongest and most compelling part of the book, the critique of violence moves away from fixed positions onto more complex narratives which, foregrounding the problem of life itself, demands a rethinking of the question of violence by taking into consideration the vexed question of human agency. Once the problem of violence as enacted in the name of life is introduced, Forti completes the critique by offering a new paradigm for understanding evil and power in the world today, which, moving through the logics of pastoral power to provide a rigorous critique of the human compulsion for obedience, insists upon the need to re-conceptualize questions of political theology in ways that are more attendant to its more widespread and troubling manifestations. "Mediocre Demons" then becomes an analytical frame through which it is possible to ethically interrogate why so much killing takes place so that life can thrive.

Starting from the proposition that 'many of the concepts' used to think about evil 'are no longer useable' (p.1), Forti sets out to explain more intuitively the relationship between good and evil at the level of actual human suffering. It is no coincidence to find that Emmanuel Levinas is the first philosopher to appear in this defense, for it is precisely through his thinking on "useless suffering" that we can move beyond abstract theorizations of evil and violence, attending instead to the all too real facts of pain and suffering which are 'produced out of human relations, and which propagate with varying intensity and range on the basis of the social and political context'. In order to effectively reintroduce the political into this discursive field (with the political here understood in terms of human agency), Forti outlines the grandest of dialectical tensions as exemplified by what she calls "The Dostoyevsky Paradigm" to ultimately expose its limitations. Focusing on the ghost of Stavrogin who, like a fallen angel, is said to be the most magnificent and the greatest of the damned in all of Dostoyevsky's work, Forti recognizes how his body is inscribed with the veritable markings of the violence of a century, in particular its ontologically determined signature of evil which is largely explained in terms of the "abyss of freedom":

Along with him comes the ghost of the next century: the specter of nihilism makes its appearance, in all its multiple facets. In Dostoyevsky's view, nihilism was the last era of humanity when Nothingness insinuated itself into history to take the place of God, whose place had already been usurped by man, deified in his turn by positivist optimism . . . It is almost as if he [Stavrogin] were a divine substance, endowed with infinite attributes and equally infinite behaviors, all of which lead to nothing. (pp. 15, 16, 37)

Forti accredits the Russian genius with definitively naming the "secret" that Kant's account of "radical evil" failed to address. As she writes, while Kant couldn't explain why evil deeds are committed when they intentionally appear to violate moral laws,

for Dostoyevsky the various demons, which correspond to the various ways in which evil makes itself visible, share the same absolute desire: to take the place of God and his infinite freedom. However, as finite creatures, since they are incapable of creating, they can only destroy (p.4).

Hence in a continuation of Carl Schmitt's now well established claim that all modern concepts reveal traces of the theological -- especially sovereign power and its violence, Forti focuses on the triangulation between "nihilism, evil and power" as key to the conceptual apparatus which offers a 'kind of secularization of the theological assumptions' informing the way many twentieth century philosophers 'believed it was possible to circumscribe the tragedies of their history' (p.5). Definitive here is an account of political events, which often analyze their occurrence by invoking foundational typologies, neatly marking out wicked demons and absolute victims. Forti explains this by recounting Stavrogin's confession to Bishop Tikhon in a crucial chapter on the desecration of the young girl Matryosha:

The freedom that makes him capable of destruction goes past the point of no return. It does so, without any possibility of redemption, when the wickedness he is capable of has its object the absolute innocence of the victim. It is one of the greatest literary moments in the book, but also one of its most philosophically eloquent. This relationship of oppression -- with an all powerful perpetrator on one side, faced by the total powerlessness of the victim on the other -- expresses what I believe is Dostoyevsky's concept of evil in its absolute pure form . . . And if in this case of the radical action of evil is portrayed in the microcosm of a personal relationship between two people, a little later it will be ready to be projected on a large scale and refined, providing his twentieth century heirs with the hermeneutic key to absolute political evil. (p. 40)

Dostoyevsky thus overcomes the phenomenological tendency to write of evil as the perversion or absence of reason, positing instead its calculative and omnipotent reasoning. Evil thus enters the world by becoming less a substance and more an activity 'pursued through destruction, by dominating the world in order to destroy it, and by dominating other human beings in order to annihilate them' (p. 53). Having then set out the philosophical and political contours of the Dostoyevsky paradigm, Forti seeks to dismantle its reductionism such that the "scene of evil" is no longer simply explained in terms of the wickedness of idols, the will to nothingness, and the power of death. This process begins through a return to another of Dostoyevsky's classic texts, The Brothers Karamazov, and the often-cited tale of "The Grand Inquisitor", which appears in the fifth book of part two. As Forti writes, while 'The link between evil, nihilism, and power is firmly established' further in this text, 'it is portrayed from another angle, which will lead us to look in a different direction' (p. 183). Indeed, whilst as is often interpreted, the Grand Inquisitor offers a completion of the picture where 'the phenomenology of the powerful' manipulates the passive and obedient masses, Dostoevsky does allude to the fact that there 'must be another dimension at work in the balance of power' (p.185). This points to something of the order of a "voluntary servitude".

While Dostoyevsky nuances his grandiose dialectical tensions here, thereby offering a more subtle and purposeful embodiment of evil that complicates absolutist explanations by pointing specifically to the 'desire for norms and subordination' (p.189), nevertheless he is still found wanting when this tale is applied to the behaviors of the masses. In ways that are reminiscent of the warnings provided by Wilhelm Reich on the Mass Psychology of Fascism, as Forti explains, the Grand Inquisitor fable is limited insofar as rests upon an understanding of the organization of violence that draws upon the docility of populations. It thus falls short when accounting for techniques of domination through which power can manipulate the desire for violence in life affirming ways, whether this is encouraging the masses to embrace policies of racial and social engineering that often revel prejudices already existent within the political system, or more troubling still, positively investing in the willful subjugation of others.

The allied response for Forti is a return to Foucault's concept of the bio-political contra Arendt and Nietzsche. This opens up a number of interesting moves, not least through the normalization of evil (a term preferred to banalisation), onto the way in which ressentiment can be positively harnessed to sanctify violence in the name of species life. Students of violence will certainly appreciate the familiarity of these connections, although Forti is keen to indicate why her approach differs from notable contemporaries such as Giorgio Agamben, Roberto Esposito and Adriana Caverero. As she states 'All these thinkers basically want to leave evil behind by siding with what a malicious politics had to define as evil in order to be able to exert itself' (p. 178, italics omitted). That is to say, what actually marks out the theoretical difference, as she sees it, concerns the "ultimate expressions" of "bare life" "the impersonal" and "horrorism", which it is argued still end up affirming the position of the absolute victim as most cruelly witnessed with the figure of the muselmann. Forti's position should be emphasized here. It is not that she denies there are evildoers and absolute victims; rather (and ultimately) it is that she doesn't believe the theological terms of engagement are applied widely enough. It is then necessary to apply the terminology and its ontological significance to a more densely populated landscape. As she writes:

Evil, I will never tire of repeating, is an event that makes itself into a system. However, it is not the anonymous system of a fatalistic history. Rather, it is a system in the sense of a tangle of subjectivities, a network of relations, whose threads pull together into a pernicious event thanks to the perfect complementarity between (a few) wicked actors and originators, (a few) zealous, committed agents, and (many) acquiescent, not simply indifferent spectators. Only this combination can produce the absolute victim as the ongoing condition of a power system that makes itself into domination (p. 179).

Forti returns to the politics of life as a way to logically invert the will and presumptions regarding death, foregrounding instead the problematic of life and its forms of violence that take place out of life necessity. This offers a particular mediation on the thanatopolitical decision regarding what can live and what must die in order for the living to thrive. Having reiterated the importance of bio-political analytics in terms of offering a more rigorous assessment of race and political animality -- notably the hyper-moralization of social and productive functions that are less about the nothingness of the void than they are about progressive narratives of betterment, the reduction of life to the question of survival also becomes significant. For in the process of exposing life to the raw realties of the pure biological fact of being, in all its vulnerable and insecure permutations, it is possible to gain more tangible purchase on the problem of "obedience" which is ultimately the root of evil in its more mediocre and normalized forms:

This, then, is how the circularity between subject and power is structured in the West: if power requires submission and obedience to determine the conduct of others, the same is required by individuals to fulfill their need for someone or something that transcends them, be it God or the norm. Submission and obedience serve them in order to receive confirmation from others, and from the other, of their redemption, that is, the promise of salvation from the danger of death. (p.255)

While staying true to the proposition that violence does require a certain dehumanization and desubjectification of the future victim, Forti thus unsettles those rigid asymmetries, which too often "objectify" the study of violence. This is not just an analytical point of contention. It points to the limits of ethical dispositions which although concerned with the suffering of human beings end up abstracting the very subject for concern -- namely the human -- out of the analytical frame. Hence, in the process of providing a limited account of violence by proposing clear and definitive claims regarding systemic abuses of power, what follows is an object-orientated study that fails to attend to the microphysics of oppression -- not least, the human compulsion for obedience and the willful subjugation of others.

The book concludes with a powerful and impassioned return to Primo Levi's The Drowned and the Saved. Positioning this text as a refutation of both the Manichean conception of evil that is exemplified in Demons and the passive obedience of the masses as portrayed in the Grand Inquisitor, Levi provides a more purposeful philosophical enquiry into the normality of evil that sheds a different light on the complex nature of violence and its bio-political drivers. More than confronting the 'paradox of bearing witness', it is argued that Levi draws upon personal testimony from the "Gray Zone" to offer 'the most sober, but perhaps also the most effective, refutation of all demonological conceptions of power' (p.309). In this regard, not only can we rightly oppose Levi to Dostoyevsky as imagined in this book, but it is also possible to counter the likes of Agamben and the recurring motif of absolute victims even as life appears in its most degraded form:

Thus, by ideally opposing Levi to Dostoyevsky and what the Russian writer represents, we can conclude that the Muselmann -- what resulted from the degradation of the camp -- was not solely and not predominantly the product of the abyssal freedom of a subject who had taken the place of God; nor was he the object on which the perverse jouissance of the death impulse had been discharged. He became what he became through a dense but ordinary weave of intentions, actions, and objectives whose weft proved fatal. (p.308)

Without in any way trying to detract from the significance of the book's many insightful contributions to the critical study of violence, there are three particular concerns that should be mentioned. Firstly, it might be argued that Forti effectively sets Dostoyevsky up for a fall, which not only offers a rather particular reading of his corpus, theology aside, but also ultimately ends up affirming a position that has largely been theorized elsewhere. Indeed, whilst the literary engagement with Demons provides an exemplary case of trans-disciplinary methods, not least in showing how authors such as Dostoyevsky manage to purposefully illustrate the importance of fiction as an analytical tool, the foregrounding of life as something, which is central to our understanding of modern violence, is well established. What is more, while the genealogical triangulation among Arendt, Nietzsche and Foucault allows for a meticulous critique of regimes of power in terms of the bio-political maxim of doing what is necessary out of life necessity, aside from the attempts to hold onto the importance of evil as a fundamental philosophical category, the originality of its political import is at least apparent. From Reich to Zygmunt Bauman, amongst others, there are a number of quite notable absences -- especially concerning the relationships between governmentality, the psychic life of power, desire and obedience.

Secondly, leaving aside the much broader and more in depth discussion that needs to be had regarding Forti's insistence on rescuing the concept of evil as a way to properly name the fact of suffering, there are questions to be raised concerning the moral genealogy of the bio-political. Kant it seems gets off very lightly in this regard. Indeed, whilst Forti recognizes the importance of Kant in terms of thinking about contemporary understandings of evil, his theological relevance to modern liberal societies is arguably underplayed. There is certainly a case to be made here for reading Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone through a bio-political lens, thereby drawing out the way Kant more positively contributed to a moral economy of the contingent that has proved so necessary to the defining bio-political assumption that life is forever burdened by the guilt of its own (un)making. Hence, the need rethink the legacy of Kant in terms of the way his theological contributions rework the idea of the fallen subject with lasting political significance should be further encouraged in this line of political enquiry.

And finally there are a number of concerns with the way New Demons is still tied to twentieth century modes of thinking. This is particularly evident with the bio-political, for even though Forti acknowledges that ours is a different historical moment to that of Foucault, the narratives concerning the optimization of life are still tied to rather outdated notions of unlimited progress and species advancement. There are of course many different forms of bio-politics operating in the world today. What, however, seems to mark the liberal bio-politics of security in the contemporary period is less about life as a source of infinite potential and productive ambition than about a conception of life that is increasingly burdened with the weight of unending catastrophe to the point of its very extinction. There is no promise of salvation anymore. Insecurity has become the new normality. Making sense of this philosophically, politically and theologically demands a rethink on the very idea of The Nothingness of Life as an alternative unfolding drama.