2015.10.10

David Roden

Posthuman Life: Philosophy at the Edge of the Human

David Roden, Posthuman Life: Philosophy at the Edge of the Human, Routledge, 2015, 211pp., $38.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844658060.

Reviewed by Kasper Raus, Ghent University


We are all aware of the fact that technology such as information technology or medical technology is advancing fast and that the limits of what it might do have not yet been reached. These technologies will undoubtedly prove to have great influence on humanity, either due to certain technologies directly targeting the human body or human capacities and/or indirectly due to technology changing the way we interact with each other or the world. For some there exists the possibility of technology having such a great impact that it eventually disconnects our descendants from humanity, thereby creating so called 'posthumans'. If such posthumans could exist, the fairly obvious question arises: 'what will posthumans be like?'

In his book, David Roden considers two common views of the possible effect of future technology. One is that of human enhancement, which, as the name suggests, involves improving or perfecting human abilities. Others are more pessimistic and see future technologies as potentially threatening or degrading our human nature. Both answers rely on the comparison between our current selves and our future selves; Roden argues that it might be incorrect to assume that such a comparison is even viable. We might not be able to know what it would be like to be posthuman and how posthumans would look at the world. This reminds me somewhat of Thomas Nagel's 'What Is It Like to Be a Bat'. Nagel famously argued that when thinking about a bat's conscious experience, there is undoubtedly something it is like for a bat to be a bat, but this subjective experience is inaccessible from our human point of view. Like the bat's experience, potential posthumans' phenomenology might be unrecognizably different from our own and thus inaccessible. Roden provides many arguments supporting this claim and investigates its implications for technological, political and ethical thinking about posthumans.

Much to his credit, Roden devotes much effort to ensuring that his book can be read by a broader audience. He uses a clear structure and often refers the reader to previous or future chapters where similar points were made or where a certain point is dealt with in more detail. Also helpful is the fact that he ends each chapter briefly summarizing the previous chapter and looking forward to the next. Roden's greatest strength is his conceptual clarity; he successfully applies 'the rule that all key concepts should be explained in terms accessible to a reader unfamiliar with the relevant traditions or discourses' (7). His entire first chapter is devoted to clarifying some of the key concepts used in the book as well as in the broader debate on posthumanism. This assures readability and generates a conceptual clarity that is refreshing in a debate where concepts are often vague or used in an insufficiently nuanced way. One of the most important distinctions Roden draws is that between transhumanism and speculative posthumanism (SP). Whereas the former involves the ethical claim that enhancing humanity using technological means would be a good thing, SP is devoid of such an ethical claim and merely involves the metaphysical position that such posthuman beings could exist. This allows him to leave out normative assessments for the first chapters and to focus on the metaphysics of what means to be human and hence what it would mean to be posthuman.

Nevertheless, though this book might be accessible to readers less aware of the literature on posthumanism and transhumanism, it does require considerable knowledge of phenomenology and metaphysics as many of Roden's discussions of Heidegger and Deleuze are particularly technical. Though this is undoubtedly a strength for those at home in modern phenomenology, it might prove highly challenging for those with less philosophical expertise.

From the conceptual chapter on, Roden's book follows a logical structure where he carefully argues his position point for point. Roden first responds to some arguments claiming that such a thing as 'posthumans' could never exist. Postulating the possibility of posthumans that are substantially different from us requires there to be an 'us' from which posthumans are to be distinguished. Posthumanity, it is often claimed, could only exist if there is an essential property of humanness that all humans possess and all posthumans lack. If true, this would seem to commit SP to a view of human nature that is essentialist and plausibly false. Roden, in my opinion, convincingly throws back the argument by saying it is actually these critics who wrongly assume 'that the only significant differences [between biological categories] are differences in the essential properties demarcating natural kinds' (49). Posthumanism is compatible with both essentialist and anti-essentialist reasoning, which thus leaves open the possibility of there ever being such posthuman entities.

Having argued that such posthumans could exist, Roden moves on to show that there is no a priori or a posteriori limit to their phenomenological weirdness. In chapters 3 and 4 he deals with possible a priori constraints. These look promising since Kantian transcendentalism and its successors (e.g., pragmatism and phenomenology) have shown the strict Cartesian distinction between our internal world and the external world of objects to be incoherent. Rather than being passive observers of the world, we are discursive agents within a common life-world, a world that, one could claim, potential posthumans would have to share and of which they might have a different, but nevertheless accessible, interpretation. Roden argues in chapter 4 that the constraints imposed by phenomenology fail, as there might be 'dark phenomenology' which involves phenomena that could 'influence the dispositions, feelings or actions of the experiencer without improving her capacity to describe them'. Both our phenomenology of perception and of time involve such dark phenomena. Phenomenology could thus provide us with an account of temporality or perception as a thing in this world but not of a priori conditions of time and perception. Put differently, there are no fundamental reasons why posthumans would have to share our world and the phenomenology accompanying that world.

We cannot know what they would be like, but it is worthwhile to think, as Roden does,  about the process that could lead us to become or create such posthumans. If we know what it would take to create posthumans, we can decide whether to allow or forbid such an event or technology. However, this image of quite simply stopping certain technologies we consider dangerous shows a lack of understanding of how technological advances work. Roden rightly points out that we are unable to predict now what the effect of a certain technology will be, so it is most likely that we will flag technologies too late. This leaves us with a curious position. Though certain present or future technological evolutions are dangerous, there is no way of knowing in advance which ones. 'We will cross that bridge when we get there' is an approach commonly taken with regards to future technologies, but Roden makes us painfully aware of the fact that we might not even realise we are crossing a bridge until we are on the other side looking back. We might well be underway in the process that will lead to the eventual creation of posthumans. The only alternative is to stop technological advance altogether, but this is, of course, unrealistic and probably most undesirable on the whole.

The greatest strength, in my opinion, of Roden's book lies in the fact that it is a single argument that leads up to the final three chapters in which some political and techno-ethical questions regarding the possibility of posthumanism are dealt with. These are, for me, the strongest chapters; in them all the book's theoretical discussions come together. These chapters create a disquieting image that requires the reader to rethink some basic conceptions of agency, technology and ethics.

In chapter 6 Roden tackles the issue of agency, a central concept in philosophy and ethics. In the history of philosophy, agency has often been reserved for humans, where to be an agent is to exhibit certain characteristics such as emotions, thought and reflection, or attributing values to objects or events. Agency is also, traditionally, what distinguishes us from computers or robots who cannot be held responsible for what they do (though their programmer can). Roden, however, attempts to construct an account of agency that is free of any human psychology and thus makes it possible for non-human (or even non-living) entities to be considered 'agents' or, in Roden's terminology, a 'functionally autonomous system'. The implications of such a view of agency for ethics would, of course, be dramatic as our beliefs about ethics, responsibility, accountability, etc. are based on the concepts of humans as autonomous agents. This chapter, perhaps, could have provided the opportunity for more reflection on the difference between agency and moral agency. The fact that posthumans could be agents does not imply they can be moral agents. Roden uses a post-Kantian rationalistic perspective on morality in which 'autonomous beings are intentional agents that determine their principles of action by reflecting and deliberating about the desires and principles that they should be moved by' (p. 125). Posthumans might then be better at both reflecting and deliberating and thus be more moral. In my opinion this focuses on a single aspect of morality and ignores other elements such as moral motivation and emotion.

Chapter 7 was, for me, the most thought provoking. It deals with the question of what a technology is and to what extent we are in control of technology. Naturally we like to believe we are very much in control of technology and technological advances. When it comes to science we frequently take a human agency perspective where we often think of great scientists or famous inventors who advanced technology. One can take Roden's argument to show that this is fundamentally unsound (at least for today's technological advances). It is better to think of science as self-augmenting as there is a 'tendency for techniques to have a multiplicative effect on the development of other techniques in adjoining or separate domains' (p.155). What causes science to advance is a multitude of small causes that come from different and unexpected domains. This makes science a domain that is no longer under complete human control as no one can foresee where technology will take us. This is an important claim. Roden shows the dangers that arise when science loses the human input and therefore loses the moral input and a certain finality. Technology itself has no inherent goal or finality and does not know right from wrong. Perhaps then we have to let go of the idea of adapting technology to our moral worldview and accept the inevitability of having to adjust our perception of the world to ever advancing science and technology.

In view of what we know, should we fear posthumanity and can we take an ethical stance for or against it? This important question is the last one Roden addresses. There seem to be many potential threats. If posthumans are indeed as weird as Roden argues they can be, it might be impossible to include them in our human moral community. As mentioned above, posthumans might be agents without being moral agents, in which case the end of what we know as morality could be at hand. A credible approach would therefore be one of precaution. However, and this is where Roden's previous chapters come in, this idea of precaution presupposes some sort of control over the process of creating posthumans. Perhaps we have already started to explore those technologies that will eventually lead to there being posthumans, but if we cannot identify what those technologies are, we cannot put a stop to them. Second, we do not know what posthumanity will be like and thus cannot make any meaningful claim about it. The only way to know whether posthumanity is desirable or not is to create posthumans. As Roden argues 'What appears to be a moral danger on our side of a disconnection [between humans and posthumans] could be an opportunity to explore morally considerable states of being of which we are currently unaware' (p. 181-2). Roden's ethics starts from the acknowledgment that issues of posthumanity will arise and that we would do best to tackle these issues head on rather than a 'comic or dreadful arrest in the face of something that cannot be grasped' (p.192). Despite the concerns raised in earlier chapters, Roden somewhat surprisingly finishes with a rather optimistic view of the possibilities for the future and potential posthumans.

In summary, I would recommend Roden's book to readers with at least some expertise in modern day ethics and phenomenology. Its greatest strength is that it is conceptually clear with a logical structure. The arguments are well worked out and lucid. Reading this book will lead readers to reflect about their own intuitions and preconceptions.