2015.10.27

Frederick C. Beiser

The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796-1880

Frederick C. Beiser, The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796-1880, Oxford University Press, 2014, 610pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198722205.

Reviewed by Lydia Patton, Virginia Tech


This book is about a group of philosophers faced with existential challenges to philosophy. In their lifetimes, the successes of scientific explanation had resulted in conflicts between religion and science and between science and philosophy. Materialist and naturalist scientific explanations, including Darwinism, materialism about consciousness, and the physiology of perception imperiled religious views about the origin and special status of humankind and aesthetic views about the qualitative character of consciousness. The practical and academic success of science threatened philosophy itself. Philosophy, once the "mother" of the sciences, now was excluded from the sciences altogether and was thrust into an identity crisis. Academic philosophers had to defend the right of their departments to exist as psychologists were hired for positions in philosophy departments. Philosophy was threatened with obsolescence.

This group of philosophers faced questions and challenges that sound very familiar to many contemporary academic philosophers. What is the nature of perception? Of consciousness? Do we perceive reality directly? Is philosophy a science? Are its methods empirical? Should it be allied with or even founded on anthropology, psychology, or history? What reason is there for philosophy, as an independent discipline, to exist?

Are pessimism and cynicism the only appropriate responses to the looming threats to human life and flourishing? Are such pessimism and cynicism tools of politically reactionary elements in society? Can philosophy prescribe some remedy? Is finding a resolution to disputes about materialism, pessimism, Darwinism, consciousness, human evolution, and the like the exclusive domain of natural science? Are there problems of this kind that philosophy itself can contribute to solving? Or can philosophy cooperate with the sciences in finding solutions?

In this intricately crafted history by Frederick C. Beiser, the neo-Kantian philosophy is not merely a doctrine or an approach to philosophical questions; it is also a strategy. From the beginning, the neo-Kantians were concerned to establish the independence, relevance, and power of philosophy. The historical situation of the neo-Kantian tradition is distinct from ours. On Beiser's telling, the historical context only puts into sharper focus how much their predicament is ours and how many of their preoccupations we share.

Mosaics and Guiding Questions

As a scholar of the German approach to history (The German Historicist Tradition, Oxford University Press 2011), Beiser appreciates the distinct approaches to history and to history of philosophy. One of the more gratifying aspects of this book is that Beiser inhabits, to an impressive degree, the philosophical perspective of each thinker. In many cases, these are remarkable, creative thinkers, and their work deserves the sort of excavation Beiser has given it, the careful dusting of each fragment of the nineteenth century city.

This archaeological approach is reminiscent of Hermann Cohen's musings on history at the end of his essay on the Trendelenburg-Fischer debate, an essay given a satisfying treatment here. Cohen ranges himself against the sort of speculative history that makes wild hypotheses about the motivations of the historical actors. But he also observes that merely constructing a mosaic of evidential tiles excavated from history will not answer the questions we want to ask the historical actors, especially the philosophical questions. We must find a guiding thread, a narrative, that will explain the events at hand.

Without very many signposts that this is to be the case, Beiser's book does provide such a narrative. I found the implied narrative compelling but not entirely explicit. This review will attempt not only to summarize Beiser's reasoning but also to make its import more obvious.

The text is divided into three parts, each of which corresponds to a period of neo-Kantian history. One aim is to tell the story of the genesis of the three major neo-Kantian schools: Marburg, Southwestern, and neo-Friesian (pp. 1-2). Beiser begins with the "Lost Tradition" of anthropological and psychological neo-Kantianism, found in the work of Jakob Friedrich Fries, Johann Friedrich Herbart, and Friedrich Eduard Beneke. In the second section, he explores the "Coming of Age" of neo-Kantianism in the work of Kuno Fischer, Eduard Zeller, Otto Liebmann, Jürgen Bona Meyer, and Friedrich Albert Lange. Finally, Beiser explores "The New Establishment," in the form of Cohen, Wilhelm Windelband, and Alois Riehl. While Beiser includes sections that investigate and propose common themes and questions addressed by these figures, the very faithfulness and documentary precision of Beiser's presentation raises the question: what overall narrative claims are being made? What themes or commitments unite these figures?

The "Lost Tradition", which consists of Fries, Herbart, and Beneke, responds to "speculative idealism" or "neo-rationalism", in the persons of Reinhold, Fichte, and Schelling at first, and later of Hegel and Schopenhauer. In each of these cases, Beiser is rehabilitating a figure. Fries was dismissed by later neo-Kantians (on this retelling) as a "psychologistic" thinker who confused the quid juris, the question of right or justification, with the quid facti, the question of fact. It is true, Beiser argues, that Fries is the originator of the anthropological and psychological reading of Kant (p. 24). Beiser reads Fries's work as recognizing and responding to the distinction between quid juris and quid facti.

Whether the charge against Fries is true or false, it was the subject of a debate between Ernst Cassirer, scion of the Marburg School, and Leonard Nelson, a prominent neo-Friesian, between "the Marburgers' rationalist and objective idealist interpretation [of Kant] versus the Friesians' anthropological and subjectivist interpretation." As Beiser rightly says, "Every Kant scholar has to find his way between these rival interpretations" (p. 26).

Fries, Herbart, and Beneke respond to speculative idealism by emphasizing Kant's critical method and by locating that method within their own anthropological and psychological approaches. Beiser's analysis here is impressively detailed and does unearth a lost tradition, one given far too little attention. But the very detail and faithfulness of Beiser's account raises questions: Is this really a tradition? What is the common thread among all these thinkers? The obvious answer is: Kant's philosophy. But why Kant's philosophy, in particular? Was there even a reading of Kant common to Fries, Beneke, and Herbart? Beiser notes that Herbart rejected Kant's claim that space and time are a priori intuitions, his claim that acts of synthesis are the origin of the unity of the manifold, and other central Kantian tenets (p. 90). The strands of Kantianism in this tradition are the limitation of knowledge to experience (see for instance p. 92, pp. 175-77) and the preservation of Kant's distinctions between natural and normative (pp. 90-91, p. 36). Even then, Beneke, the "neo-Kantian martyr", is the odd man out -- he argues for a radically empiricist reading of Kant, a reading on which the synthetic a priori is anthropological and psychological (§8, p. 174, for instance).

In this early tradition, which extends to the beginning of the nineteenth century (Fries's Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling appeared in 1803), the appeal to Kant is a way to respond to the neo-rationalists, who follow a deductive, apriorist method as Reinhold does (Fries, pp. 48-50), who postulate a self-positing or absolute ego capable of intellectual intuition as Fichte and Schelling do (Herbart, pp. 96-8), and who argue for a notion of historical necessity as Hegel does, which some neo-Kantians take to have failed as an explanation (Beneke, p. 180). Those in this tradition define themselves as "Kantianer" in a negative sense -- they are not Reinholdians or Fichteans strictu sensu. But no coherent neo-Kantian picture of Kant's philosophy or method emerges yet in this group.

Materialism and Darwinism

The lack of a coherent picture of Kant in early, anthropological-psychological Kantianism is an intentional feature of Beiser's history. One way to read Beiser's telling of the story is that neo-Kantianism finds its sure footing in the great controversies of the nineteenth century. The neo-Kantians may have opposed German idealism, but what spurred them on were developments in the 1840s and 1850s. This period often is considered to be philosophically barren but scientifically rich. One of the finer achievements of Beiser's work is to put this historical error to rest once and for all.

Beiser captures the significant philosophical reflection on psychology, physiology, and physics in the 1840s and 1850s, the "Interim Years". But that very reflection came to constitute an existential threat to philosophy itself. The "materialism controversy" began with Rudolph Wagner's 1854 lecture, with the untranslatable title "Menschenschöpfung und Seelensubstanz". This lecture inaugurated Wagner's "holy war against materialism" (p. 184). Wagner's more than worthy opponent was the charismatic and phlegmatic Carl Vogt, a materialist physiologist who wrote famously that the mind secretes thoughts as the kidneys secrete urine (p. 185). With his materialist comrades-in-arms Heinrich Czolbe, Jacob Moleschott, and Ludwig Büchner, Vogt argued that the failures of idealist philosophy and the "rapid rise" and success of the empirical sciences in formulating explanations should lead us to the conclusion that "philosophy is dead" (p. 189).

In the "Coming of Age" of neo-Kantianism, Fischer, Zeller, Liebmann, Meyer, and Lange set out to prove that the reports of philosophy's death were exaggerated. Beiser's description of these figures is a menagerie of contrasting views. Fischer is a "Hegelian Kantian," Liebmann a critical metaphysician, Meyer a psychologistic neo-Kantian, and Lange a materialist manqué.

These years saw several transitions significant to the development of the movement. Liebmann was among the first, on Beiser's reading, to "see the problems with the psychological interpretation of Kant" (p. 284). He is a transitional figure between the anthropological, psychological, and physiological readings that dominated between the 1790s and the 1860s, and the epistemological readings associated with Cohen, Windelband, and Riehl that took over from the 1870s to the 1890s. In a further illustration of the diversity of this transitional era, Meyer continued to defend the psychological reading (pp. 337ff.).

While he is indispensable to any chronicle of nineteenth century neo-Kantianism, Lange stands on his own in Beiser's account and in history. He contributed the great History of Materialism, written in the 1850s and 1860s and first published in 1866, a work given careful attention here. Though Lange was a politically engaged figure, Beiser focuses on the philosophical content and context of Lange's thought. His interpretation of Kant was naturalist, influenced by the views of Fries, Beneke, and Helmholtz. He "interpreted the a priori in terms of what he calls our 'physical-psychological organization'" (Beiser p. 382, History of Materialism second ed. Book II, p. 30). Lange is really the heir of the anthropological-psychological reading, a reading that emphasizes the Kantian empiricist thesis that "The limits of natural knowledge are the limits of knowledge in general" (p. 388).

If one assembles a mosaic of their views, the thinkers of the Coming of Age are just as fragmented as those who came before. The great strength of Beiser's account is that he shows the unity of the neo-Kantian accounts, during these years, as coming from the disputes in which they participated.

In particular, the materialism controversy galvanized Lange, Helmholtz, and other physiological neo-Kantians to distinguish their views from those of Büchner, Moleschott, Czolbe, and Vogt. By the end of the nineteenth century, Ernst Haeckel and the German Darwinians were some of the main sources of support to Darwinianism generally (p. 422; the work of Robert Richards also emphasizes the Darwinian sources and influences in Germany). The neo-Kantians were not opposed to Darwin himself. Lange was quite sympathetic, though others including Meyer were more critical (chapter 11, §2). However, in Die Welträtsel, Haeckel directly attacked neo-Kantianism. In general, Haeckel's view left no room for Kantian distinctions between theoretical and practical reason, fact and value, appearance and reality, or mind and world.

The Establishment of the Schools

By the time of the "New Establishment" of the Marburg, Southwest, and neo-Friesian schools, many central preoccupations and questions of neo-Kantianism were well established. Beiser's work puts this conclusion beyond doubt. The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism raises a number of questions of interpretation.

One of these is the relative importance of transcendental idealism, versus the critical method, to neo-Kantian thinkers. As Beiser notes, one of the signal accomplishments of Cohen was his "discovery of the transcendental" in the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience (1871). Cohen emphasized the transcendental, a priori nature of Kant's principles, as opposed to the anthropological, psychological, or physiological readings given by Fries or by Beneke. Beiser carefully notes Cohen's early engagement with the Herbartian, psychological tradition of Völkerpsychologie, and marshals the meager available evidence to evaluate the reasons for Cohen's turn toward a transcendental, epistemological reading of the a priori.

A major piece of evidence regarding Cohen's reading of the a priori is his essay on the Trendelenburg-Fischer debate, which appeared around the same time as the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience. Here, Cohen raised questions that would become central to future neo-Kantianism: the nature of the a priori, the question of the discovery or genesis versus the justification of concepts and principles, the quid facti versus the quid juris. This sphere of validity or justification is independent of the empirical results of the particular sciences and is the domain of philosophy.

The conclusion of The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism turns very much on the question of the identity crisis of philosophy. One context in which this crisis arose was the pessimism controversy, discussed earlier in chapter ten. Kant had criticized (rather ineffectually) Voltaire's pessimistic response to the Lisbon earthquake and Rousseau's pessimism in general. In the nineteenth century, mass poverty and failed political revolutions may have contributed to the popularity of Schopenhauer's and Eduard von Hartmann's pessimism (p. 400), which brought the practical aspects of neo-Kantianism to the forefront. The neo-Kantians emphasized the "Promethean," Fichtean practical philosophy of action and of the will, "their faith in human autonomy, the power of human beings to change the world" (p. 401, see also p. 413).

Windelband argued that the pessimistic stance that life is not worth living is "a question of value", not of fact. Answering the question of whether life is worth living requires establishing a criterion of "worth", which is subjective in this context (p. 404). Windelband, like Cohen, emphasizes the "quid juris," and one of his contributions is to see philosophy "as a normative enterprise" (p. 494). Windelband interprets this quite literally, arguing that philosophy is a "science of norms": "The task of philosophy is to determine the basic norms that bestow value upon all human activity" (p. 497). His response to the existential crisis of philosophy is to argue that if philosophy becomes psychology, or epistemology, it will lose: philosophy must defend its independent domain, evaluating claims of value or of normativity, whether in epistemology, in ethics, or in aesthetics.

Riehl, who revived Herbartian realism in the late nineteenth century, had a distinct strategy. He distinguishes Kant's transcendental idealism, his distinction between phenomena and noumena, from his critical method, and in this, Beiser notes, we can hear faint echoes of the "lost tradition" (p. 531). Philosophy was to focus on its "proper object", which is "the scientific investigation of consciousness, its objects and laws" (Riehl 1872, Über Begriff und Form der Philosophie. Berlin: Carl Duncker, 28; trans. Beiser 2014, 543). This gave Riehl a clear (but problematic) way to distinguish philosophy, which studies mental products, from psychology, which studies mental processes (p. 543).

The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism ends with the account of Riehl's philosophy, without an explicit summing up of the import of the work. But the conclusion of the section on Riehl is, in its way, a capstone of the project. Beiser concludes by saying that students in the 1890s, frustrated with the sterile epistemology provided to them by university philosophy, were "turning towards philosophers like Nietzsche and Schopenhauer". Riehl faced "an uncomfortable choice: move with the times or become an irrelevance". As a result, Riehl's interests "moved more towards ethics and aesthetics", and toward philosophy as a worldview rather than as a bare theory of knowledge (p. 570).

Throughout the work, Beiser has emphasized these influences on neo-Kantian thought: the success of the empirical sciences, on the one hand, and the desire students of philosophy have for philosophy as a "guide to life", on the other. Neo-Kantians saw themselves as defending the independence of philosophy from the empirical sciences and as forging an approach to ethics and to aesthetics that avoided pessimism and cynicism. It is a signal achievement of the book that these preoccupations come to the fore as opposed to seeing the genesis of neo-Kantian thought in a merely scholastic dispute between the German Idealists and the neo-Kantians, for instance.

Rival accounts exist. Beginning with the mosaic of tiles that are dusted and assembled so carefully here, we could arrive at distinct and conflicting ways to assemble a narrative of the history and strategy of neo-Kantianism. Each scholar who does so should recognize that her task is made easier because Beiser has the ability to inhabit the philosophical perspective of each thinker to such a remarkable extent. His work has value as an explanatory account of the development of the tradition. But it is also a re-telling of that tradition from within, taking the self-understanding of the actors seriously. Because it is so faithful, the questions central to the narrative -- the identity crisis of philosophy, the methods of philosophical inquiry, the limits of perception and of scientific explanation, the questions of fact and value -- come through clearly. The extent to which those questions remain to be solved comes through equally clearly.