2015.11.01

Wayne Waxman

Kant's Anatomy of the Intelligent Mind

Wayne Waxman, Kant's Anatomy of the Intelligent Mind, Oxford University Press, 2014, 582pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199328314.

Reviewed by Reed Winegar, Fordham University/Freie Universität Berlin


Wayne Waxman's book provides a detailed "psychologistic" interpretation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, focusing primarily on Kant's key arguments in the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Analytic.[1] As Waxman explains in front matter, his book should be regarded as the second of a two-volume work that includes his earlier Kant and the Empiricists (Oxford, 2005). But Waxman also notes that his new book "is written to stand alone, presupposing no knowledge of my previous publications" (viii). And while I agree that one can profitably read this new volume by itself, potential readers should be warned that the book is heavy going even by the standards of Kant scholarship. Waxman's main target throughout the book is a tradition of commentary that aims to divorce Kant's epistemology from his transcendental psychology. In opposition to such interpretations, Waxman argues vigorously for the importance of Kant's faculty psychology to any proper interpretation of Kant.

However, Waxman's aims are much more ambitious than merely to promote the importance of Kant's psychological language for interpreting the first Critique. He also develops a sophisticated interpretation of Kant's faculty psychology, the details of which pose a direct challenge to standard interpretations of Kant. The central plank of Waxman's interpretation, in terms of which he claims "the success or failure of this book should be measured," is the suggestion that Kant recognizes a prediscursive aspect of apperception and, consequently, recognizes a prediscursive aspect of human understanding (5). In contrast to other commentators, Waxman denies both that the categories are necessary conditions for apperception and that human understanding is essentially discursive, i.e. conceptual (5). He fully recognizes that the central plank of his interpretation will strike many readers as highly controversial. Indeed, he proudly stresses the iconoclastic nature of his interpretation, claiming that his book should "oblige" readers to "unlearn virtually everything they think they know about the doctrines of the Transcendental Analytic and their role in the critical philosophy as a whole" (viii). Waxman works hard to justify his interpretation throughout the book's 563 densely argued pages, and even readers who might remain skeptical of his central thesis will find much to think over and appreciate in his detailed discussions of Kant's individual arguments.

Given the scope of Waxman's book (which treats almost all of Kant's major arguments in the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Analytic), I cannot possibly present the entirety of its contents here. Instead, I will initially provide a brief catalogue of what strike me as Waxman's major claims in the book's eighteen chapters and, then, evaluate in more detail his evidence for his central claims regarding apperception and understanding.

Waxman opens in chapters 1-2 by laying the foundation for his psychologistic interpretation of Kant. He argues that Kant embraces a psychologistic, sensibilist position. According to him, Kant's position is "psychologistic" because Kant determines the content of mental representations by tracing mental representations back to their psychological sources (61). Moreover, Kant's position is "sensibilist" because, according to Waxman, Kant takes this psychologistic process to reveal that sensibility is crucial to the content of all mental representations (38). He argues that Kant's psychologistic, sensibilist outlook is extremely close to that of Hume. According to Waxman, Kant's chief differences from Hume result from the fact that Kant, unlike Hume, recognizes an a priori aspect of sensibility (63 and 67). In particular, Kant claims that space and time are a priori forms of intuition and that our intuitions of space and time are also a priori; thus, Waxman contends that Kant's philosophy is both sensibilist and a priori.

In chapters 3-8, Waxman further develops his interpretation of Kant's theory of sensibility by analyzing the Transcendental Aesthetic's arguments regarding space and time. According to Waxman, Kant's fundamental reason for introducing space and time as pure intuitions is to account for the "the unity of sensibility" (75; italics in original). More specifically, Waxman claims that pure intuitions are necessary to unite the manifold of appearances in one consciousness so that the components of this manifold can then be further compared and associated with one another. As Waxman states, "pure intuition . . . [is] an individual representation that contains all its manifold (possible as well as actual) within it and so serves to necessarily unite all appearances of its form in one and the same consciousness entirely a priori" (91; italics in original).

In order to play this unifying role, our pure intuitions must themselves possess some type of unity. Waxman claims that this unity of space and time relies on a prediscursive (i.e., non-conceptual) aspect of human understanding. He writes,

Instead of being essentially and fundamentally a discursive faculty, defined in terms of an operation such as judgment, understanding becomes first and foremost the faculty of apperception, responsible for all unity of consciousness, even the purely aesthetic, prediscursive unity of sensibility effected by pure space and time. (135; italics in original)

Here Waxman identifies human understanding with the original synthetic unity of apperception and (contrary to most commentators) argues that the original synthetic unity of apperception is not fundamentally discursive. Instead, the original synthetic of apperception includes a prediscursive aspect in addition to its more familiar discursive. Moreover, Waxman claims that the relevant unity of space and unity of time depend on this prediscursive aspect of understanding, rather than on the categories. He contends that this prediscursive unity is very minimal. For example, the pure intuition of space serves merely to unite in a single consciousness the components of the manifold of intuition as juxtaposed to one another (158). And Waxman attempts to exploit this allegedly minimal unity to argue that Kant's theory of space does not actually rule out the possibility of various non-Euclidean spaces (158ff.).

Waxman concludes his discussion of sensibility by examining the consequences of Kant's theory of sensibility for Kant's theory of transcendental idealism, including Kant's prohibition on knowledge of things in themselves. Waxman argues that his psychologistic, sensibilist interpretation of Kant can explain Kant's empirical realism about space and time, render Kant's commitment to the existence of things in themselves consistent, and account for why Kant takes his arguments in the Transcendental Aesthetic to entail that things in themselves can be neither spatial nor temporal. Regarding this last point, Waxman takes Kant's sensibilism to entail that the contents of our representations of space and time are inextricably tied to their psychological origins in the human mind and, thus, cannot be legitimately applied to mind-independent things in themselves. As Waxman writes,

If the psychological operations responsible for forming a representation can be shown to contribute contents essential to that representation, it becomes inconceivable that the representation could correspond to anything in mind-independent transcendental reality. (198; italics in original)

In chapters 9-11, Waxman turns to the opening sections of Kant's Transcendental Analytic, including the metaphysical deduction of the categories. In the metaphysical deduction, Kant uses the table of the logical functions of judgment to identify an exhaustive list of the understanding's categories. As Waxman reminds readers, Kant takes the analytic unity of apperception to depend on the original synthetic unity of apperception. According to Waxman, however, the analytic unity of apperception depends on the original synthetic unity of apperception in its prediscursive guise (247). Moreover, he argues (on the basis of B133-4n) that "attaching the analytic unity of consciousness" to a sensible manifold of intuition converts the sensible manifold of intuition into a universal representation, i.e., a concept (252). Additionally, Waxman explains that there must be forms that allow us to become conscious of the relations between the concepts produced in this way (261). And, according to him, these forms are the logical functions of judgment. On the basis of this interpretation, Waxman offers a limited defense of the completeness of Kant's table of the logical functions of judgment, according to which we can, he tells us, be confident (but not certain) that the table of the logical functions of judgment is, in fact, complete for the particular type of discursive understanding that humans possess (286). Moreover, Waxman provides an interpretation of how all twelve of the categories follow from the twelve logical functions of judgment (287ff.).

In chapters 12-15, Waxman argues for the importance of Kant's transcendental psychology to the first Critique's transcendental deduction of the categories, and he presents detailed interpretations of the transcendental deduction in both editions of the first Critique. Here Waxman argues for a bold reinterpretation of the so-called subjective and objective deductions. In the A Preface, Kant famously divides the transcendental deduction into objective and subjective components. The objective deduction answers the question "What and how much can understanding and reason cognize free of all experience?" (Axvii). Thus, the objective deduction establishes both the rightful application of the categories to objects of possible experience and the prohibition on knowledge of things in themselves. But the subjective deduction answers the question "How is the faculty of thinking itself possible?" (Axvii). Thus, the subjective deduction focuses on the details of Kant's transcendental psychology. Many commentators have taken Kant's claim that only the objective deduction "belongs essentially to my ends" to justify downgrading the importance of the subjective deduction for Kant's aims in the transcendental deduction as a whole (Axvii). Thus, for many commentators, the transcendental deduction primarily concerns the question of the categories' rightful application. In contrast, Waxman forcefully argues that the subjective deduction is integral to Kant's aims. In fact, Waxman contends that the crucially important sections of text that commentators normally refer to simply as the A-Deduction and B-Deduction -- namely, A95-130 and B129-69 -- contain merely the subjective deduction. According to him, the earlier passage at A92-3/B124-5 (which Kant singles out in the A Preface as "sufficient by itself" for convincing the reader of the objective deduction's "full strength") constitutes the entire objective deduction (Axvii; Waxman, 330ff.). Because A92-3/B124-5 is essentially identical in the A and B editions, Waxman's interpretation entails that the objective deduction does not change between the two editions. But Waxman further argues that A95-130 and B129-69, which Kant did significantly revise, are largely consistent with one another, differing primarily in exposition rather than content (343).

On Waxman's interpretation, the transcendental deduction does not modestly aim to show that we require the categories in order to represent appearances as objects; instead, it attempts to explain how empirical objects themselves are "products of the understanding" such that "the understanding is the creator (Urheber) of nature and its fundamental laws" (341-3). Only in this way, Waxman tells us, can Kant carry out the transcendental deduction's main task of bridging "the gap between the completely undifferentiated, indeterminate manifold of pure apprehension and the differentiation and determinateness requisite for properly cognitive empirical and mathematical spatial and temporal synthesis" (382). In other words, the transcendental deduction appeals to the details of Kant's transcendental psychology in order to show how the categories are necessary for transforming the unity of sensibility provided by the prediscursive aspect of understanding (which is merely the unity of an undifferentiated, indeterminate manifold) into a differentiated, determinate manifold adequate for mathematics and empirical cognition. Waxman follows up his general analysis of the transcendental deduction in chapters 16-18 by offering extremely detailed interpretations of the schematism chapter and of the entire system of principles.

As noted previously, Waxman hinges the success or failure of his book on the claim that Kant ascribes a prediscursive aspect of understanding to human beings. Perhaps Waxman is not entirely fair to his book here. His book covers an enormous range of topics, and many of the individual points that Waxman makes along the way, including his forceful case for the general importance of transcendental psychology to the first Critique, do not depend directly on his controversial thesis regarding understanding. Nevertheless, in the remainder of this review I will focus specifically on the textual evidence that Waxman presents in favor of his central thesis regarding understanding. For the sake of clarity, let us distinguish two separate aspects of Waxman's interpretation: (1) his claim that Kant ascribes a prediscursive aspect of understanding to human beings, and (2) his claim that the unity of space and the unity of time as pure intuitions depends on this prediscursive aspect of understanding. Allow me to discuss these two components in turn.

First, Waxman claims that human understanding has a prediscursive guise in addition to its more familiar discursive aspect. Consequently, he denies that human understanding is defined by its discursive character. He builds his case for this claim by, first, identifying understanding with the original synthetic unity of apperception and, second, arguing that the categories are not necessary conditions for the original synthetic unity of apperception. Waxman primarily bases his identification of understanding and the original synthetic unity of apperception on a footnote, where Kant writes, "And thus the synthetic unity of apperception is the highest point to which one must affix all use of the understanding . . . indeed, this faculty is the understanding itself" (B133-4n). Waxman's most direct piece of evidence for denying that the categories are necessary conditions for the original synthetic unity of apperception is at A401, where Kant writes, "Apperception is itself the ground of the possibility of the categories, which for their part represent nothing other than the synthesis of the manifold of intuition, insofar as that manifold has unity in apperception" (A401). According to Waxman, Kant here denies that the categories are necessary conditions for the original synthetic unity of apperception; instead, the original synthetic unity of apperception is a necessary condition for the categories.

There are, however, reasonable grounds for resisting Waxman's ascription of a prediscursive aspect of human understanding to Kant. To begin, although one might try to interpret the above passages as Waxman does, Kant nowhere directly and explicitly ascribes a prediscursive aspect of understanding to human beings. Instead, Kant directly claims that discursivity is the defining feature of human understanding. For example, in the Prolegomena, he writes, "the specific nature of our understanding consists in thinking everything discursively" (4:333). Additionally, throughout the critical period, Kant operates with a distinction between two kinds of understanding -- discursive understanding, which humans possess, and intuitive understanding, such as God would possess. In the third Critique, Kant claims that an intuitive understanding can be conceived "negatively, merely as not discursive" (5:406). Thus, Kant seems to accept that the only type of understanding other than a discursive understanding is an intuitive one. But where would Waxman's prediscursive aspect of human understanding fit on this divide? As prediscursive, it differs from discursive understanding. But it also cannot be intuitive. After all, Kant denies that humans possess intuitive understanding, and he also argues that an intuitive understanding, unlike Waxman's prediscursive synthetic unity of apperception, would not involve synthesis of any kind (A256/B312; 5:406-7). Moreover, although Waxman claims that a prediscursive aspect of understanding grounds the unity of space and time as pure intuitions, he does not explain as clearly as one might like exactly how it does so. If Waxman takes it to do so by synthesizing the a priori manifold of intuition according to a rule, then he would seem to be committed to a conceptual synthesis. But if it does so in some other way, then what exactly is this other way? And how exactly does it differ from synthesis according to rules? Answers to these questions were not evident to me. Finally, I doubt that one must interpret the passage at A401 to claim that the original synthetic unity of apperception does not depend on the categories. Granted, Kant states in the passage that apperception is the ground of the categories. But what exactly does Kant mean by this? Here one might argue, contrary to Waxman, that this passage (which, incidentally, Kant excised in the B edition) should be interpreted as claiming that the transcendental deduction's argument for the objective validity of the categories (and, thus, for the "possibility of the categories") depends on the necessity of the categories for apperception (A401). In this sense, Kant's appeal to the original synthetic unity of apperception grounds his argument for the possibility of the categories.

Yet, I suspect that the above remarks overlook one of Waxman's deepest reasons for ascribing a prediscursive aspect of understanding to Kant -- namely, Waxman's desire to accommodate both the suggestion, which Waxman finds in the transcendental deduction, that the unity of space and the unity of time as pure intuitions depend on the understanding and the suggestion, which Waxman finds in the Transcendental Aesthetic, that the unity of space and the unity of time are not conceptual. If correct, Waxman's interpretation would provide an elegant solution to this interpretive puzzle. However, I would like to raise some questions regarding the textual evidence that he offers for his solution to this puzzle, even though I will not presume to venture an alternative solution here.

Waxman's main pieces of textual evidence appear to be the footnotes at B136n and B160-1n. In the footnote at B136n, Kant reiterates the Transcendental Aesthetic's claim that the representations of space and time are intuitions, rather than concepts. However, as Waxman emphasizes, Kant proceeds to claim in the footnote that the representations of space and time are "found to be composite, and consequently the unity of consciousness, as synthetic and yet as original, is to be found in them" (B136n). Here Kant claims that the original synthetic unity of apperception is found in the intuitions of space and time. But, according to Waxman, this original synthetic unity cannot be conceptual because the unities of space and time in the Transcendental Aesthetic are not conceptual. Thus, the footnote must refer to a prediscursive aspect of the original synthetic unity of apperception and, thus, to a prediscursive aspect of understanding. However, the placement of this footnote in §17 of the transcendental deduction seems to place significant pressure against Waxman's interpretation of this footnote. In §17, Kant famously distinguishes between space as a mere form of intuition and an intuition of a determinate space. According to Kant, space as a mere form of intuition "is not yet a cognition at all" because it lacks the unity of a representation (B137). But a representation of a determinate space, which qualifies as a cognition, relies on concepts. As Kant writes,

But in order to cognize something in space, e.g., a line, I must draw it, and thus synthetically bring about a determinate combination of the given manifold so that the unity of this action is at the same time a unity of consciousness (in the concept of a line), and thereby is an object (a determinate space) first cognized. (B137-8)

Moreover, Kant directly connects this conceptual determination to the original synthetic unity of apperception, when (in the next sentence) he adds, "The synthetic unity of consciousness is therefore an objective condition of all cognition" (B137-8). If one interprets the footnote at B136n in the context of §17's overall argument, one may plausibly take the footnote to indicate, as §17 does, that a cognition of determinate space depends on a conceptual synthesis of the manifold provided by space as a mere form of intuition and, therefore, depends on a discursive version of the original synthetic unity of apperception. In this sense, a cognition of a determinate space is, as the footnote claims, a "composite" that depends on the "unity of consciousness, as synthetic and yet as original" (B136n). At the very least, the footnote's placement in §17 puts significant pressure on Waxman's suggestion that Kant's brief remarks in the footnote commit Kant to a prediscursive aspect of understanding that grounds the unity of space but to which Kant never clearly and explicitly appeals anywhere in the first Critique.

Let us now consider Waxman's treatment of the famously obscure and controversial footnote at B160-1n. In this footnote, Kant distinguishes between space as a form of intuition, "which merely gives the manifold," and a formal intuition of space, which "gives unity to the representation" (B160n). According to Waxman, the source of the unity in a formal intuition of space must be the understanding in its prediscursive guise. As he notes, Kant claims in the footnote that the unity of a formal intuition "precedes all concepts" and belongs "not to the concept of the understanding" (B160-1n). However, the footnote also claims that the unity of a formal intuition "presupposes a synthesis" (B161n). If the unity of a formal intuition precedes all concepts but depends on a synthesis, then (Waxman concludes) this synthesis must be non-conceptual. Yet, the footnote also claims that "the understanding determines the sensibility" (B161n). Consequently, he claims that Kant must be referring to a prediscursive aspect of understanding that grounds the synthetic unity of a formal intuition of space.

One cannot help but admire the elegance with which Waxman seems to account for Kant's various claims in this footnote. Yet, Waxman's interpretation is less neat than it might first appear. Kant ends the footnote at B160-1n by referring back to §24, which discusses Kant's distinction between an intellectual synthesis and a figurative synthesis. In §24, Kant notes that the figurative synthesis, which is undertaken by the imagination, belongs to sensibility, even though it determines intuitions "in accordance with the categories" (B152). But why Kant would refer us back to the imagination's figurative synthesis in accordance with the categories to argue that the unity of space and time depends on a prediscursive aspect of understanding is unclear. Indeed, Waxman acknowledges that his interpretation is committed to the claim that Kant implicitly recognizes two different figurative syntheses -- one that is in accordance with the categories and one that is not. Waxman writes,

Although their [i.e., space and time] being given as intuitions depends on productive imagination's synthesis speciosa [i.e., figurative synthesis], it is evidently not the transcendental synthesis speciosa mentioned at B151-2 [i.e., §24] since the unity of the categories unquestionably does belong to that synthesis. (139)

Yet, §24 gives no indication of two different figurative syntheses. In fact, §24 claims that the figurative synthesis "in accordance with the categories" is "an effect of the understanding on sensibility and its first application (and at the same time the ground of all others) to objects of the intuition that is possible for us" (B152; underlining added). But if this figurative synthesis in accordance with the categories is the first effect of the understanding on sensibility (as Kant explicitly states), then I have difficulty seeing what room remains for the alleged effect of a prediscursive aspect of understanding on sensibility. Granted, one must provide some account for why Kant claims in the footnote at B160-1n that the unity of a formal intuition precedes all concepts and does not belong to a concept of the understanding. Unfortunately, anything one says here is guaranteed to be controversial, but (for the sake of example) one alternative strategy would be to argue that Kant's claims merely highlight that the figurative synthesis of the imagination is prior to our deliberate application of concepts to intuitions in judgments.

I suspect that Waxman himself would respond to my comments by arguing that the alternative interpretations of B136n and B160-1n sketched above place too much emphasis on conceptual unity and, thus, promise no easy reconciliation of the transcendental deduction with the Transcendental Aesthetic. But certainly we need to be cautious about any interpretation that, no matter its other benefits, renders the relationship of B136n and B160-1n to §17 and §24 highly mysterious, especially when that interpretation relies on the ascription of a prediscursive aspect of understanding to Kant that, as outlined previously, faces its own textual hurdles. Yet, despite these worries, there can be no doubt that Waxman offers a distinct alternative to many traditional interpretations of these texts as well as to traditional interpretations of the first Critique as a whole. And Waxman's intriguing, if controversial, interpretation of Kant's transcendental psychology will certainly be of interest to all scholars of Kant's first Critique.

ACKNOWLEDGEMENT

I would like to acknowledge the support of a VolkswagenStiftung/Andrew W. Mellon Foundation Postdoctoral Fellowship in the Humanities that facilitated the completion of this review.


[1] I cite Kant's Critique of Pure Reason according to the standard A/B pagination. I cite Kant's other works by providing the volume and page number in the Akademie edition of Kant's works: Gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Preussische Akademie der Wissenschaften, the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin, and the Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Göttingen (Berlin, 1900ff.). All translations are from the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, edited by Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (Cambridge, 1992ff.).