2015.11.05

Edward Slingerland

Trying Not to Try: The Art and Science of Spontaneity

Edward Slingerland, Trying Not to Try: The Art and Science of Spontaneity, Crown, 2014, 295pp., $26.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780770437619.

Reviewed by Bongrae Seok, Alvernia University


In his recent book, Edward Slingerland explains and analyzes one of the unique ideas of Chinese philosophy, viz., wu-wei (無爲). The term is used mostly in Daoist texts, but the concept is discussed broadly in many schools of Chinese philosophy. Wu-wei is usually translated as non-action or non-doing, but it does not mean not doing anything. Rather it means doing things in a spontaneous and natural manner. If you act without a strongly imposed or premeditated intention or will, you are very close to the natural flow of wu-wei. Chinese philosophy, whether it is Confucianism or Daoism, focuses on the question of living a meaningful and happy life with a sustained effort to achieve natural spontaneity. Yet this specific ideal of spontaneity hasn't been fully articulated and explained in philosophy. With his broad understanding of Chinese philosophy and cognitive science, Slingerland provides a coherent picture of how the ancient Chinese wisdom of wu-wei can be defined, explained, and promoted.

Slingerland explores different forms of wu-wei such as Confucian-Xunzian wu-wei (chapters 3 and 4), Mencian wu-wei (chapter 5), Laozian wu-wei (chapter 4), and Zhuangzian wu-wei (chapters 1, 2, and 6). But he also discusses derivational forms or applications of wu-wei, such as green wu-wei (noble savage wu-wei, p. 105), wu-wei in musical improvisation (p. 35-37), wu-wei in martial arts (p. 109), wu-wei in relaxation/wellbeing (p. 191), and wu-wei in military strategies (p. 204). He clearly separates the instrumental forms of wu-wei (such as Sunzi's deceptive tactic [p. 204] or the village poseurs' social maneuver [p. 80-81]) from serious philosophical efforts in bringing spontaneity to the center of morality and virtue. To those who are not familiar with Chinese philosophy, the whole gamut of wu-wei can be overwhelming or confusing. Particularly, in the first two chapters, the term wu-wei is interchangeably used with the notions of behavioral spontaneity and smooth effectiveness (cool and refined manners of artistic virtuosity), which may give a false impression that wu-wei is just for effective behavior or attractive appearance. But as he explains, wu-wei goes deep and wide yet unifies its diverse forms through embodied and affective sensitivity and activities of the mind.

Unlike spontaneity at the level of behavior (spontaneity observed in uncontrolled, quick, intuitive, relaxed, effective, and seemingly natural actions or behaviors), wu-wei is often involved with the deeply personal or broadly social dimensions of the mind and the person. We want to live naturally rewarding and spontaneously meaningful lives by revealing our true selves and developing genuine characters. We tend to trust people who act naturally, i.e., people who are naturally sincere and do not hide their true intentions and feelings. As Slingerland suggests, wu-wei has these broader and deeper dimensions that include the whole mind, person, and community over and beyond particular actions or behaviors. Zhuangzi's suggestion of the mind fasting (the process of clearing the mind of its ulterior motives, hanging biases, and hidden agendas) and Confucius's emphasis on self-cultivation (the process of forming an affective and natural foundation of virtue in one's mind) through ritual and cultural activities, for example, can be understood clearly in these extended personal and social dimensions of wu-wei. Simply, wu-wei is not just for action. It is also for the whole person, the whole society, and the whole world.

In addition to a penetrating philosophical explanation of wu-wei, Slingerland provides an interdisciplinary analysis of wu-wei from the perspective of cognitive science. He explains that wu-wei is not just a philosophical doctrine of Chinese philosophy but also a particular form of cognition. That is, wu-wei comes out of hot cognition, a distinctive form of cognitive processes that are quick, intuitive, affective, and embodied. Typically hot cognitive processes are less deliberate but more spontaneous and naturally expressive, so that they often affect the way people make decisions, specifically on personal relations and social interactions. Suddenly, in Slingerland's hands, this vague Chinese notion of spontaneity becomes a powerful tool to understand both Chinese philosophy and recent development of cognitive science. It is definitely a cool thing to do Chinese philosophy of wu-wei from the perspective of hot cognition that is not fully explored and investigated in many traditional (i.e., computational) approaches in cognitive science.

One of the challenging natures of wu-wei is its elusiveness. You cannot easily get wu-wei if you intentionally concentrate on it. Wu-wei is like a rainbow. As you come close to a rainbow to touch it, it goes away from your sight. This is the paradox of wu-wei: if you try hard to get wu-wei, you never get it. Wu-wei only comes when you are not obsessed with it you are not preoccupied with the thought of getting it. This paradox is not only a philosophical but also a practical conundrum. Many people want to be naturally skillful, socially attractive, and trustworthy, but most of them do not know how to become naturally virtuous. For many, it is practically impossible to be purposefully natural and almost an oxymoron to talk about spontaneous virtue or virtuous spontaneity. Hence the paradox of wu-wei (chapters 7 and 8): you never get it if you try hard.

Slingerland starts his book with this paradox and proceeds to discuss it from three different angles, i.e., Confucianism, Daoism, and cognitive science. Basically, there are three different ways to cultivate wu-wei. Confucian wu-wei is the result of hard work, careful understanding, and nourishment of the ideal self to stimulate naturally given dispositions (Mencius's wu-wei) with diverse social, cultural, and other communal activities, such as ritual, music, and ancient texts (Confucius's and Xunzi's wu-wei). In some ways, ideal Confucian virtue can be compared to beautiful Jazz improvisation, i.e., spontaneous yet refined expression of the self that is always appropriate, natural, effective, and harmonized with others. In Daoism, however, wu-wei is not the end result of hard work but rather the ongoing process of personal transformation that emulates the cosmic harmony and dynamic balance. Here the goal is not refined and cultured spontaneity through effortful cultivation but rather effective and balanced spontaneity through non-effortful attunement of the self to the cosmic flow. A person needs to interactively follow the flow of things with minimal disruption or interference. From the perspective of cognitive science, however, the spontaneity of wu-wei is understood from the perspective of hot cognition. Wu-wei belongs to hot cognition, which comprises quick, intuitive, and affective states and processes of the mind. The reduction of cold cognition and/or the careful nourishment of hot cognition, therefore, are the ways to develop and enhance the power of natural virtuosity or wu-wei. Regardless of one's choice, wu-wei represents a unique psychological and philosophical approach to living a happy and meaningful life. That is, happiness or a meaningful life is achieved in the process of trying not to try.

There are two main messages in Slingerland's book. First, he explores and interprets classical Chinese philosophy from the perspective of wu-wei. Deep and genuine spontaneity is a good (or arguably the best) way to understand classical Chinese philosophy. Although Confucian and Daoist schools of Chinese philosophy develop different ideals of human goodness and social order, their views, according to him, are different approaches to the same destination, i.e., morality and virtue that are based on deeply engrained dispositions of spontaneity. Therefore, for him, wu-wei is a penetrating thread or a grand vista point of classical Chinese philosophy. Since wu-wei is originally a Daoist notion of ideal human virtue and moral engagement, Slingerland's grand interpretation of Chinese philosophy via wu-wei looks a bit ambitious. But he is conscious of the difference between Confucian wu-wei and Daoist wu-wei (p.233) and explains their distinctive orientations and common objectives.

The merging point of the diverse approaches to wu-wei, however, is a perennial question of human existence: how to live a good and meaningful life. So wu-wei is basically a Chinese way to answer this question. That is, cool rational reasoning and intentional control are important parts of our conscious intellectual life, but they are not sufficient for ideally good life. They help us to survive in constantly changing environments, but they also generate distrust, confusion, and fear. The early Confucian and Daoist philosophers, therefore, suggest that we should focus on concretely grounded and affective forms of cognition that promote cool efficiency, interpersonal charisma, and social trust. One simply needs to be virtuously (i.e., trying) spontaneous (i.e., not to try). Slingerland believes that Chinese philosophy, whether Confucian or Daoist, has this foundational inclination towards and emphasis on the deeply personal and transformative power of spontaneity. Wu-wei, therefore, is Slingerland's grand vista point that provides us with a unified look of Chinese philosophy.

Slingerland's second message regards his cognitive interpretation of wu-wei. To explain how wu-wei functions and why it is an important concept not only for Daoism but also for Confucianism, he discusses recent studies in cognitive science. Wu-wei, according to him, is hot cognition. It comprises evolutionarily primitive but concretely embodied, strongly affective, directly motivational, and highly effective cognitive processes that take place in or around the limbic system. In contrast, cool cognition involves fully conscious, deliberate, and rational functions of the mind supported by the functions of the wide spread regions of the brain, particularly the prefrontal cortex.

Cold cognition has been the dominant model of the formal computational approach of cognitive science. According to the computational approach, cognition is computation (i.e., formal symbol manipulation) and deliberate reasoning is a paradigmatic example of thinking. The best way to study the mind and its function, in this approach, is to study formal processes of information processing in computational devices such as a digital computer. To borrow an analogy, the brain is the hardware of a computer and thinking is information processing run by a computer program. Recently, however, cognitive scientists have begun to deviate from the classical model of formal and sequential computation and to develop alternative models of information processing that are not strictly formal or sequentially algorithmic. That is, they have begun to study cognition (perception, memory, decision-making, reasoning, etc.) from the perspective of interactive and dynamic processes of a physical system with non-digital or modality specific media or representations. For example, many cognitive functions in perception, social cognition, and moral cognition are run by parallel, interactive, and affective processes that are not easily explained by digital computational processes. Slingerland explains the genuine power of wu-wei in this context of alternative forms of cognitive processes. Wu-wei is not an elusive and hallucinatory state of the mind or simply a skillful behavior but rather a very special form of cognition that can be found in affective, embodied, and self-transformational processes of the mind. It is typically exemplified in quick, intuitive, unconscious, affective, and embodied processes of cognition. This distinctively active pattern of cognition is often recognized as hot cognition and contrasted with more deliberate and controlled patterns of cold cognition. Slingerland identifies the cognitive nature of wu-wei in this style of hot cognitive processes.

Although I agree with Slingerland and others on the "general" distinction between two sets of cognitive processes in the human mind/brain, I believe that the two systems of cognition are not necessarily or intrinsically exclusive or competing systems. They work together to provide the sustained and balanced state of spontaneous focus, one of the important characteristics of wu-wei. Slingerland, of course, is fully aware of the importance of integration and discusses the cooperation between the two systems of cognition. He says "The goal of wu-wei is to get these two selves working together smoothly and effectively" (p. 29). But his discussion of Buddhist meditation seems to suggest the conflicting or competing relation between the two. For example he says that "meditation downregulates the conscious, cold-cognition centers of our brain, thereby creating room for hot cognition to do its thing" (p. 211). Although his view is not wrong in general, I think this contrastive characterization of hot and cold cognition in Buddhist meditation can misrepresent the genuine nature of the meditative state and wu-wei. The effectiveness of cognitive control and executive function, at least in its careful management of attention, is not suppressed in Buddhist meditation. It actually increases during (and over the extended period of) meditation practice, as many brain imaging studies report.

In spite of these concerns about technical details, I find Slingerland's cognitive scientific interpretation of wu-wei enlightening and inspiring. It explains the psychological nature of wu-wei very clearly and, at the same, helps us to understand the unified message of wu-wei in seemingly contrasting viewpoints of early Chinese philosophy. On a practical note, he argues that the key to getting wu-wei and living a meaningful life is to find ways to stimulate this hidden potential in the mind that is not fully explored and analyzed in Western philosophy and science. Certainly, it is a fascinating and inspiring way to connect Chinese wisdom, cognitive science, and a spontaneous way to live a good life.