Daniel A. Bell

The China Model: Political Meritocracy and the Limits of Democracy

Daniel A. Bell, The China Model: Political Meritocracy and the Limits of Democracy, Princeton University Press, 2015, 318pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691166452.

Reviewed by Tongdong Bai, Fudan University

In Daniel A. Bell's writings, there seem to be two Bells, Bell the political theorist and Bell the political observer. This duality may have had something to do with his communitarianism, which, although a philosophical view, emphasizes the particularities of community, history, and culture. I take myself to be a political philosopher in a traditional sense, focused on the universal or the universalizable. Thus, I can appreciate much more of Bell the political philosopher, although Bell the political observer, with in-depth exposure to both the West and East Asia (both theories and practices) and sometimes with a contrarian bent, can often offer new perspectives on politics and culture that are interesting and thought-provoking.

A common theme of Bell's writings is to challenge the belief that liberal democracy is the end of history and to propose alternatives. What is new in this book is that he goes further down the "particularist" road. The last book of his I reviewed was Beyond Liberal Democracy: Political Thinking for an East Asian Context. The main title sounds universalist, while it is only the subtitle that suggests a particularist leaning. The title of his new book reverses this order. Here is why:

my earlier writings on political meritocracy tended to be inspired more by Confucian philosophy than by actual politics. Over the past few years, I came to realize that China's political system has meritocratic characteristics, if only because my own high-achieving students at Tsinghua University were being increasingly recruited in the CCP. (12)[1]

Thus, in this book, instead of offering a Confucianism-based alternative of governance, he proposes one based on the contemporary Chinese regime. For him, the latter has features from both traditional Chinese regimes and Confucian classics. He uses materials from all these sources, but the main emphasis is on contemporary Chinese governmental practices.

Although the mainstream belief is still that liberal democracy is the best possible model of governance, both the failures in the West and the successes of China have given momentum to questioning this belief, which Bell acknowledges in the Introduction. He then sets out to defend what he calls political meritocracy. He distinguishes this from the existing meritocracy in liberal democracies, in which experts are selected to work in narrowly defined domains and in a neutral manner, and also from economic meritocracy, which follows the principle "from each according to his ability, to each according to his contribution" (5). On the economic issues, Bell is firmly on the left with political theorists such as John Rawls and even the "higher communism" that follows the principle "from each according to his ability, to each according to his needs" (5).

In order to make space for political meritocracy, Bell has to challenge the tenet that democracy is the least bad regime. Political realists, such as Samuel Huntington, and even the party conservatives in China, "warn us that democracy cannot readily be established in poor, developing countries" (15), but the issue is really about timing, not about the desirability of democratization.  By contrast, in Chapter 1, Bell points out "four key problems with electoral democracy: the tyranny of the majority, the tyranny of the minority, the tyranny of the voting community, and the tyranny of competitive individualists" (20). By the first tyranny, he means that the majority of citizens, which has a decisive role in political decision-making, is ignorant of politics, and rationally so. One might argue that in spite of this ignorance, the collective wisdom of the voters should be trusted, but Bell argues that the collective wisdom is wisdom only if the participants are already informed. Unfortunately, the political reality is that those who deliberate on politics don't participate in it, and those who participate in it don't deliberate on it. You could defend one-person-one-vote by arguing that it is a fair procedure, but Bell's retort is: why don't we just flip a coin? Our rejection of this procedure indicates that we do care about desirable consequences, which the majority of ignorant voters doesn't deliver. The second problem is the dominance of the super rich that results from increasing economic inequality. In spite of the lack of economic and political mobility, Americans somehow manage to believe the opposite, which, to Bell, is but an illusion. The third problem is that voters of a state can decide about affairs that have repercussions beyond the state and its citizens, such as climate change and torture of enemy combatants and alleged terrorists. The last problem derives from Bell's belief that the fierce individualist competition in democratic politics is the root cause of smear campaigns and partisan politics, so that the value of harmony, which is taken seriously by Confucianism and Confucian states, is ignored.

Bell suggests that the contemporary Chinese regime, especially its meritocracy, may address some of the problems of electoral democracy. But an issue is whether the Chinese regime would be better than electoral democracy, even if it did better address these problems. But Bell considers discussing the Chinese regime (maybe in a slightly idealized form) worthwhile for the following reasons. First, from Chapter 2, we can at least see that electoral democracy is not clearly better than other alternatives. Second, the Chinese regime offers a real-world model of meritocracy rather than some imagined regime that may be easily dismissed as unrealistic. Third, China's one-party rule is not about to collapse soon, and to discuss its merits and defects can at least help understand and improve on Chinese politics, which has clear benefits.

In Chapter 2, Bell discusses an issue key to meritocracy: how to select leaders on the basis of their merits. There are a lot of discussions of leadership in business, but they don't fully apply to the political case because leaders in business tend to have simpler goals (making profit being the most important) than leaders in politics. One method of selection Bell suggests is an updated form of traditional Chinese keju, "the public service examinations (misleadingly translated as 'civil service examinations')" (78), which tends to focus on the candidate's intellectual capacity. The social skills of political leaders also matter but are hard to measure. Bell suggests that we should take seriously traits that reveal one's social skills, such as age and gender. Another political merit is virtue. Tests on classics that are full of the celebration of virtues help because these classics could tacitly shape one's character. War heroes or those who devote themselves to non-profit organizations also tend to be virtuous. Most importantly, an evaluation by peers could be a very good way to measure one's virtues.

In Chapter 3, Bell deals with a few problems with political meritocracy and proposes solutions. The first issue is corruption, and his solutions include the rule of law, freedom of speech, law enforcement, the market-based salary system, and moral cultivation. The last item has also been emphasized by some Chinese communists, but according to Bell, this came from the Confucian tradition rather than the Marxist tradition, which doesn't pay much attention to moral cultivation. To Bell's regret, "the party has yet to take the formal step of officially replacing communism with Confucianism" (124).

The second issue is ossification, and as examples, he mentions the problem that the political elites in Singapore and France lack sympathy and are full of arrogance toward the masses. The solutions he proposes are strengthening sympathy and humility, including in the political elites those from different backgrounds or sending the best and the brightest to poor regions for a few years as part of their training, and most importantly, promoting economic equality that would close the gap between the elites and the masses. Different merits should be sought in the selection procedure for different situations. For this to happen, there also needs to be sufficient freedom of speech to allow open discussions and experiments in attracting people with different kinds of merits through different channels. Equally important, the central government needs to be able to put successful experiments from one region into national practice.

The third issue is legitimacy. Bell argues that one-person-one-vote is not the only source of legitimacy. In non-democracies, there can be other sources of legitimacy. One is nationalism. The nationalism the Chinese Communist Party (CCP) has used is resentment-based, telling the people how China was humiliated by the West and has been saved by the CCP. This nationalism can be toxic, and it has recently been transformed, though not completely, into a pride-based nationalism that is rooted in the re-embrace of traditions. The second source is performance. But this is risky and doesn't guarantee stability because the CCP's legitimacy will be in danger if the Chinese economy goes bad and because economic development has always led to pressure for democratization. The third source is the recognition of the inner worth of political meritocracy. A problem with this is the discontent of those who fail in the meritocratic selection process. In traditional China, those who failed to make to the top of the meritocratic ladder could still enjoy social and political roles in local communities and were thus absorbed into the system, which Bell welcomes. There should also be a stronger recognition of the value of those who are not in the meritocratic system. More participation by the people helps as well. "Ultimately, the only way is to show without a shadow of doubt that the people support political meritocracy. In other words, democracy may be necessary to legitimize meritocracy" (150).

Therefore, in order to defend the real-world political meritocracy, Bell is led to discuss the reconciliation between democracy and meritocracy, which then leads to the discussion of three ideal models. The first model is to combine democracy and meritocracy at the level of voters, meaning plural voting, which was proposed by Mill and suggested by Lee Kuan Yew. But voters with fewer votes would feel insulted, and plural voting may perpetuate the dominance of those with more votes and thus lead to corruption, for politicians would give extra votes to their own kind and would do special favors to those with extra votes. An objective and reliable procedure to determine who should get how many votes is also elusive.

The second model is a hybrid of democracy and meritocracy, which can be implemented by a bicameral structure with a house of "meritocrats," a model Bell himself championed before. He discusses the proposals made by Sun Yat-sen, Friedrich Hayek, and Jiang Qing, as well as the English House of Lords, and argues that the meritocratic house will be overshadowed by the democratically elected house when people enjoy a sense of empowerment through one-person-one-vote. East Asian societies cannot bet on the meritocratic heritage because Japan, South Korea, and Taiwan have all embraced electoral democracy instead of a Confucian hybrid regime.

The third model is democracy on the bottom, and meritocracy on top (through selections that are discussed in Chapter 2).  In the Concluding Remarks, Bell also adds a middle level that allows experiments in combining meritocracy and democracy.  He calls this three-level structure the China model. But in order for meritocracy on top to work, the potential candidates, when going through a long period of training, need guarantees that their training will be rewarded. This means that one-party rule is a pre-condition. Then, the problem of the legitimacy of such a meritocracy can only be ultimately solved by a referendum that can render legitimacy to this regime for a long period of time (say, 50 years) until the next referendum.

In the Concluding Remarks, Bell first discusses the defects of the China model in reality, and suggests ways to correct them. Then he speculates on whether this model can be exported. Being a good communitarian, he thinks that this model is rooted in history, culture, and the fact that the Chinese government is very powerful, and so maybe it can only be exported partially. He also argues that for China to be a model for the rest of the world, the Chinese government needs to be less oppressive and more tolerant. In addition to the replacement of communism with Confucianism, he also suggests that the CCP talk the talk, that is, change its name to "the Chinese Meritocratic Union." There are also two appendixes available on line. One of them is a Harmony Index that ranks countries according to factors that would make a society harmonious, which is extremely innovative and provocative.

As mentioned earlier, Bell's China model is based on observations of traditional Chinese regimes, the contemporary Chinese regime, and Confucian ideas. The scope of these  observations is impressive and they often offer interesting perspectives, but it is only natural that many of them are controversial. Moreover, the diversity of the sources Bell draws from in order to present the China model also leads to the issue of whether these sources can be used to present a consistent picture. Most importantly, there is a danger of marrying one's normative proposal too closely to the apparent success of the contemporary Chinese regime. He has reasons to do so. As he acknowledges, he was "ruthless savaged by critics, accused of being everything from an apologist for the CCP to an agent for Goldman Sachs (my wife's employer)" (12), which is a motive for him to write a book offering detailed and nuanced argumentation.

But this book has also been ruthlessly savaged by (some) critics with similar accusations. Many of these critics sound like ideologues. Their belief in the alleged open society of liberal democracy is closed to open discussions. To them, anyone who dares to challenge the desirability of liberal democracy must be either foolish or evil. They owe us an explanation about why the West has been failing in so many fronts, and China has been doing relatively well. Moreover, Bell is not painting a purely rosy picture of China, and he offers critical remarks on the Chinese regime. Nonetheless, I feel that Bell gives too much credit to the present Chinese regime and not enough to criticisms of it. While criticizing the end-of-history view about liberal democracy, he himself seems to think that China will continue to be successful under the present Chinese regime, with its present way of doing politics. I am not that optimistic.

I share with Bell many of his criticisms of contemporary liberal democracy and many of his normative proposals. But some of his ideas seem somewhat one-sided. For example, he argues that to have one-party-rule is essential to meritocratic selection, but I think the key is really that when one's party is not in power, the meritocrat-in-training can find meaningful employment, which presupposes different channels for the politically talented and their mobility in society -- something American society does offer and the Chinese authority has been calling for recently. Also, his claim that American federalism wouldn't work as well as the middle-level experimentation in his China model sounds arbitrary to me. As for the general methodology, I think that a safer ground is to go back to one or two Confucian thinkers or texts, tease out the political models they would advocate, update them to the contemporary settings, and then defend their desirability. Other Confucian texts and practices in traditional China should only be used when they are possible illustrations of this model.

On this basis, I have defended a hybrid model in which, with the rule of law and basic liberties, there is pure electoral democracy at the bottom, quasi-autonomy in the middle (which, in traditional Chinese centralized government, is expressed by Confucians' support to "feudalism"), and the combination of democracy and meritocracy on top. This model is based on a coherent set of Confucian ideas (mostly from Mencius) and is insulated from the ups and downs of a real-world regime thanks to its normative nature. Bell criticizes the viability of such a regime by arguing that the democratic element on top will eventually erode the meritocratic one. But his own China model also has to derive legitimacy from a referendum that takes place every 50 years or so. This arrangement can be challenged, especially when this model keeps failing. Bell's answer is that performance is not a stable ground for legitimacy, and education helps. But then why can't we educate people to see the beauty of the hybrid regime on top? Yes, even East Asian countries have gone down the road of pure electoral democracy, but maybe this is because electoral democracy has appeared to be the sole winner. But the wind has turned a bit, and there is a hope for an open-minded search for better models. The China model is one possible candidate, but by that, I don't mean one based on the real-world contemporary Chinese regime, but on the one envisioned by Mencius and other Confucian philosophers.

[1] Alums from Peking University, myself included, would be quick to point out, with scorn and self-righteousness, that this is just typical of Tsinghua, an engineering school that produces technocrats and careerists.