2016.01.26

James Kreines

Reason in the World: Hegel's Metaphysics and Its Philosophical Appeal,

James Kreines, Reason in the World: Hegel's Metaphysics and Its Philosophical Appeal, Oxford University Press, 2015, 290pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190204303.

Reviewed by Christopher Yeomans, Purdue University


Books on Hegel's Science of Logic either tend to get in and out of the text relatively quickly, mining a few conceptual moves to be refined and then alloyed for use in other philosophical industries; or they take the form of commentaries that march the reader through the twists and turns of the argument at speeds and levels of detail that vary widely according to the individual drill sergeant-interpreter's taste for cruelty. James Kreines, however, is neither in the resource extraction business nor does he fancy a turn on the parade ground. Instead, he offers a book that will surprise both seasoned Hegel hands with the order and connection of its arguments and contemporary metaphysicians with the cogency of those arguments on their own playing field. For Kreines argues that Hegel's Logic is metaphysically pluralistic first and epistemologically monistic second -- and he does so by a form of interpretation that attempts to reconstruct Hegel's arguments less in the light of their internal architectonic context than of the current array of live options in metaphysics. The result is a book whose innovations sometimes left me perplexed at the order of topics considered but more often illuminated well-worn territory with newfound clarity.

Again to simplify a (good) bit, approaches to Hegel tend to define him by reference either to Spinoza or to Kant. If the former reference is taken to be dominant, then the resultant Hegel is a metaphysician of the monistic variety. Surely, it is acknowledged, Spinoza comes in for a good bit of criticism at Hegel's hands, and so Hegel's monism must diverge in some way from Spinoza's. But whether organic or teleological or spiritual, the monism tends to go hand in hand with the metaphysical reading. On the other hand, the interpreters who see Kant as the leading light in Hegel's firmament tend to see Hegel oriented either by epistemology or by concerns about norms. Guidance is then provided either by the Transcendental Analytic's deduction of the categories or by the Groundwork's deduction of the moral law. On both readings, Hegel is seen as offering a re-tooled transcendental argument, regressing on the conditions of the possibility of self-consciousness.

Kreines, however, offers us a Hegel who looks to Kant for metaphysics and whose monism is epistemological rather than metaphysical. The key, he argues, is to see Hegel as continuing not the Transcendental Analytic but the Dialectic, and in particular the Antinomies. On this account, the problem with metaphysics is not that it is superseded, but that it is naïve and unable to come to grips with its own contradictory tendencies. These contradictory tendencies were diagnosed by Kant himself, of course, in the Antinomies. Unlike many contemporary interpreters who see the Antinomies as a jointly absurd compilation of severally unconvincing arguments, Kreines (and Kreines' Hegel) takes them quite seriously. Kreines plausibly motivates the tension in the argument (particularly the Second Antinomy) by appeal to the pressures of complete explanation and then reconstructs Hegel's position against the matrix of possible responses. As Kreines puts it, Hegel is optimistic about knowledge of the unconditioned as opposed to Kant's pessimistic solution to the conflict by limiting our knowledge to spatio-temporal objects. But Hegel is partially deflationary with respect to the conception of the unconditioned (divorcing it from its image in rationalist substance metaphysics) and partially inflationary (by seeing both teleological and spiritual phenomena as more completely explicable than rule-governed phenomena) (150).

One of the best things about the book is the patient care with which Kreines disentangles different senses of metaphysics. He argues that the sense of metaphysics essential to Hegel is that of seeking answers to why-questions -- discovering the reasons, or grounds, or responsible factors: "Metaphysics (of reason) = Philosophical inquiry into explanatory reasons, or reason in the world, and ultimately into their completeness" (9). Within that metaphysics as Hegel has it, there turn out to be three different orders of explanation, and this bit of metaphysical pluralism will bring us to Hegel's epistemological monism. There are law-governed phenomena that are explained by the powers and natures of the things related by the laws; there are living phenomena that are explained by immanent ends of self-preservation; and there are spiritual phenomena such as reasoning that are explained by the immanent concept of freedom (23). Each of these types of phenomena and the entities involved are equally real and existent, but they are explicable to different degrees -- listed here in ascending order. Because only spiritual phenomena are fully explicable (by the concept of freedom embodied in the absolute idea), our knowledge of lawful and living phenomena is secured by comparison or approximation. This theme of approximation to the paradigmatic and fullest case is, of course, a classic bit of rationalism. But here it is put to epistemological rather than metaphysical use. Or rather, its epistemological form is driven by the pluralistic metaphysics, as a way to demonstrate the validity of optimism about the possibility of knowledge about all the orders and sorts of things in the world.

This concern to get metaphysics right is Kreines' driving force as much as Hegel's. In fact, I cannot think of any recent work on Hegel that is so deeply engaged with contemporary analytic metaphysics -- its field of possibilities and its modes of arguments. Kreines devotes equal energy to arguing that neither Humeanism, nor neo-Aristotelianism, nor substance metaphysics is immune to the critical imperatives to which Hegel responds. Against the Humeans, Kreines argues that their reduction of laws to patterns introduces precisely the kind of objective explanatory relations -- or reason in the world -- that the reduction was supposed to avoid (69). The disagreement between Hegel and the Humeans turns out to be not whether there is such reason in the world, but in what direction it operates. Against the neo-Aristotelians, Kreines argues that life and species-kinds, though clearly superior in explanatory import to lawful regularities, still fall short of our expectations of complete explanation (which can be found only in free, spiritual phenomena). And against substance metaphysics, Kreines argues that it conflates dependence and explanation (159, 207-8). In fact, it turns out to be Hegel's view that spiritual phenomena embody the absolute idea, but only by dependence on living and lawful phenomena that are not themselves directly explained by the absolute idea. This is a paradoxical notion to be sure -- that completeness of explanation and extent of dependence could not only be separable but also in fact run in opposite directions -- but it is to Kreines' credit that when the outlines of that position become clear in the last quarter of the book, its plausibility both in itself and as a solution to the antinomial problem of metaphysics is readily apparent.

Let me then close with a critical note on the shape of that antinomial problem. It is right to read Kant that way, but Kreines' ambitions extend further than that -- he is at pains to argue that this is the right way to orient metaphysics. Two features of this orientation seem questionable.

The first and perhaps most pressing is what he calls the Irreplaceable Guidance Claim. Kreines argues that all theoretical inquiry is necessarily interested not only in explanatory reasons as such but also in complete reasons. Metaphysics in particular is so committed and thus is subject to the criticisms of Kant's dialectic. Discussing David Armstrong and Jonathan Schaffer in particular, he argues that any metaphysical view that proposes more fundamental explanations than those provided in the natural sciences either slides toward a dogmatic foundationalism or offers weak-kneed appeals to balance in order to resist such a slide:

Armstrong needs to rest on a philosophical case that explanatory appeals to laws implicitly require commitment to his universals; but then he remains open to the charge that this case itself requires commitment as well to "the Absolute" he so resists. His resistance, then, will have to stand on his counsel of balance. But this is no principle, and judgments will obviously differ: the humean, for example, will think that the humean view is the perfect balance between denying the existence of laws and more metaphysically inflationary views like Armstrong's. (146)

In the light of this problem, Kant's pessimism about metaphysics -- his restriction of all knowledge to spatio-temporal objects -- looks like a better, because more principled, response to the underlying problem. Hegel takes up the challenge to provide an alternative but no less principled response that maintains optimism about metaphysical knowledge. Here the cost is a paradoxical or counter-intuitive metaphysics in which dependence and explanation go in opposite directions. But absent excessive confidence in our own supposed metaphysical intuitions, this might be a price we should be willing to pay.

Kreines' claim, however, is broader and stronger: not just metaphysics, but theoretical inquiry as such is taken to have this interest of reason. Put another way, metaphysics is committed to some version of the unconditioned, and we are all committed to metaphysics once we try to explain anything at all. Here, however, the argument seems to me much weaker, depending on a strained analogy between iterated prisoner's dilemma games and vicious circles of explanation (129). Now, one might think that just showing that any metaphysics is committed to the unconditioned is sufficient, but it is worth noting that the stronger claim is required to fully motivate either Kantian or Hegelian idealism.

The second problem concerns the distinction between explanation and dependence that is so crucial to Kreines' view. Making this distinction results in Hegel's "combination of extreme metaphysical ambition about reasons with such a dismissal of any metaphysics of substrata" (173). So rather than making the tension between dependence and sufficiency internal to explanation itself, he separates the two and rejects dependence arguments as a way of doing metaphysics. The problem is that this view makes it look as if the antinomy can be done away with because one half of its force can be dismissed as a misguided inference from language to metaphysics (e,g., 187). Put another way, the interpretation makes the contradiction of the Antinomies more apparent than real (see the discussion of Leibniz on 175, also of contemporary metaphysics on 187).

Kreines is certainly live to the problem here:

One reason why it can be difficult to make sense of Hegel's claim for the reality of contradiction, in this case and others, is that this seems to present a dilemma: On the one hand, if we really explain the view, or render it thinkable, then we seem to undercut the sense in which reality would contain contradiction within it; we make reality seem to make more sense than it would if really contradictory. On the other hand, if we insist on the reality of a kind of contradiction that could never make sense or be explained, beyond the grasp of thought, then we seem to suggest one or another view that, although possibly of philosophical appeal in some respects, cannot cohere with Hegel's other commitments (196).

Kreines embraces the first horn of the dilemma, and I think that his solution involves teasing apart the kinds of dependence arguments that generate substrata from the kind of dependence arguments that generate Hegel's own view that the completely explicable (the absolute idea) depends on the incompletely explicable (the lawful and the living); but I am unable to report the precise form of this solution. The two problems are related, of course, since traditional arguments for the kind of unconditioned, complete explainer Kreines takes to remain necessary guidance for us rely at least partially upon the very considerations of dependence from which Kant tried to free us.

In any event, Kreines' book marks an important step forward for understanding Hegel's theoretical philosophy. In clearly framing the import of Hegel's conceptual innovations by placing them against the background of options in modern metaphysics, Kreines continues his contributions towards the cultivation of a productive space for debate about the metaphysical significance of Hegel's thought.