Uwe Meixner

Defending Husserl: A Plea in the Case of Wittgenstein and Company Versus Phenomenology

Uwe Meixner, Defending Husserl: A Plea in the Case of Wittgenstein and Company Versus Phenomenology, De Gruyter, 2014, 509pp., ISBN 9783110342314.

Reviewed by John Fennell, Grinnell College

In this long, very methodically argued and meticulously textually-documented book, Uwe Meixner aims to provide a "critical commentary" (xii) on the philosophy of mind of Husserl and Wittgenstein (and the Wittgensteinians). His selected posse of Wittgensteinians comprises: Ryle, Dennett, and Bennett and Hacker (the latter two are treated as one author). By critical commentary Meixner means not merely to lay out what Wittgenstein and the Wittgensteinians have to say on some central issues in the philosophy of mind side by side with what Husserl says on them, but provide a philosophical evaluation of the two positions intended to assess their relative philosophical merits and shortcomings. Unsurprisingly given the book's title, this invariably comes to Meixner applauding Husserl's position and criticizing Wittgenstein's/the Wittgensteinians'. The book has four chapters: the first three "critically juxtapose" Husserl's views with Wittgenstein's (and the Wittgensteinians'), on the issues of imagining (Chapter 1), knowing one's mind (Chapter 2), and intentionality (Chapter 3); the fourth situates Meixner's interpretations of Husserl and Wittgenstein inside some of the influential related secondary literature. I will concentrate on the first three chapters where Meixner presents his own first-order views on these figures.

Meixner aims to defend what he calls "the traditional view of the mind" (103), which he takes Husserlian phenomenology to exemplify, and by which he means a dualist commitment to the "inward mental life" (an omnipresent phrase in the book) that is private both ontologically and epistemologically against externalist-physicalist attacks that he takes to be expressed by Wittgenstein and Co. In the chapter on imagining, it turns out that the phrase "inward mental life" is purposely general so as to allow Meixner to draw a distinction inside the inner realm of the mental between mental representations or mental pictures, and what he calls mental images, upon which much of his critical discussion of the various figures will turn. Meixner accuses Wittgenstein and the Wittgensteinians of an aversion to all things mental or inner (of being "prejudiced against the inward mental life" [5]) and thus of failing to distinguish between mental representations and mental images. This in turn results in their wrongly inferring from their denial of mental representations to the denial of mental images, and indeed to their resultant rejection of anything mental, inner, subjective as philosophically important to accounting for what goes on when one is imagining (or having any conscious state, e.g., perceiving, day-dreaming, hallucinating, etc.).

Ryle and Dennett, for example, rightly (according to Meixner) reject the idea that imagining X (e.g., Helvellyn, or one's childhood home) involves having, or being aware of, a mental picture of the mountain or the house, i.e., of perusing (as it were) a gallery of mental slides of these things, but this Meixner argues does not mean that imagining involves nothing mental. Indeed for him, it involves the having of mental images, where these are precisely distinguished from mental pictures or representations. To begin with (we get more specificity as he goes on) the having of mental images, for Meixner, amounts to something like having an inner experience of something mental (or at least something that is not the real mountain or house itself). However where Meixner diverges is that Ryle and Dennett identify mental images, the having of inner experiences, with the having of mental pictures and so in rejecting the later, eliminate the former, and thus the realm of the "inward mental life" entirely. Meixner does not: in not identifying the two, he (following Husserl) can reject the idea of mental pictures or mental representations without doing away with inner experience (or mental images) in toto. For him and Husserl, there are no mental representations, but this does not mean that there are no mental images, inner experience, or inward mental life; rather it means that such inward mental life does not consist in being aware of mental representations. Meixner nicely explains that a shortcoming of Ryle's failure to draw this distinction and thus of his getting rid of all things inner, is that it forces him to characterize imagining as seeming to see, and thus results in his confusing imagining with hallucinating.

Just as Ryle and Dennett reject the idea of mental picture or mental representations, so does Bennett-Hacker and Husserl. However, unlike the others, Husserl does hold the view that there are mental images, and indeed, that imagining involves the having of mental images -- it's just that these mental images are not mental representations or mental pictures (44). For Husserl, in perception and imagination the object as itself is given (rather than a mental representation of the object). The difference in our experience is to be explained in terms of their being given in different ways (35) and also in that they are made of different materials (49, 55). In perception the object as itself is presented, in imagination the object as itself is "quasi-presented" (thus neither involve representations, but presentations or quasi-presentations); in perception the material out of which the presentation of the object itself is composed are sensations, in imagination the material out of which the quasi-presentation of the object itself is composed are "wraiths of sensations" (55, borrowing a phrase from Ryle) or "phantasms" (Husserl's term, 56).

According to Meixner, for Husserl sensations and phantasms are not representations but rather simulacra, which is in turn why neither perception nor imagination involve representing the object (albeit in different ways) but presenting it, because simulacra reproduce the object (in a different form) rather than represent it. The difference between a representation and a simulacrum is that a simulacrum must be similar to the original object (e.g., my left sock stuffed with foam is a simulacrum of my left foot [49]) whereas a representation need not be (the expression 'my left foot' can represent my left foot yet isn't at all similar to it), while something can be both a representation and a simulacrum (e.g., a statue of Lincoln and Lincoln). Mental images -- what are had in perceivings and imaginings -- as simulacra rather than representations are meant to do justice to the phenomenology of our experience when perceiving and imagining, i.e., neither are experienced as experiences of mental pictures or representations while dealing with the problem of distinguishing hallucinations from imaginings (unlike Ryle). Just as the foam-filled left sock as a simulacrum of my left foot in a sock is not a picture of my left foot in a sock, as (say) a photo of my left foot in a sock is, so perceiving my left foot in a sock is being given or experiencing a simulacrum of my left foot in a sock (but one where the simulacrum is not made of foam but of mental images or perceptual sensations) and is not experienced as a picture of my left foot in a sock, as seeing a photo of my left foot in a sock would be. It is rather "given straight", not as a representation. Similarly, imagining my left foot in a sock is being given or experiencing a simulacrum of my left foot in a sock, but one where this simulacrum is not made of foam, or of perceptual sensations, but of possible perceptions, and it is because of this that imagining is a quasi-presentation, since what is presenting itself to consciousness are not actual perceptions but possible perceptions. This is meant to deal with the problem of distinguishing imagining from hallucinating (51 n27) since imaginings are made of mental simulacra of possible but not actual perceptions, whereas hallucinations are made of mental simulacra that are taken by consciousness to be of actual perceptions when they are not really actual (otherwise one would be perceiving not hallucinating).

The book's most successful parts are those in each chapter, like that described above, where Meixner is developing Husserl's own views on some topic, be it imagining, or reflexive experience and the privacy of the mental, or intentionality. Here his work is patient, careful, draws on texts from different periods of Husserl's oeuvre, and contains telling criticisms of Ryle's and Dennett's own views and (mis-) interpretations of phenomenology. Least successful are his criticisms of Wittgenstein and Bennett-Hacker (the only true Wittgensteinian of the so-called group). Here he relies solely on one text, Philosophical Investigations (PI) and his work is in main far less nuanced and tends to either question beg or construct straw men. These problems stem from the fact that coming as he does fully convinced of Husserl's account of the mental, Meixner's criticisms of Wittgenstein are based on his ignoring or else completely misrepresenting Wittgenstein's arguments. An early example of the former: Meixner writes as if Wittgenstein had no arguments against the "inward mental life", diagnosing that Wittgenstein's position is based on "dogmatic anti-Cartesianism", an "epistemico-ontological revulsion [or "prejudice" as he writes in other places] against the inward mental life, against subjectivity" (60). Nothing could be further from the truth, and indeed Meixner does not really believe it himself as he spends large portions of each chapter attempting to rebut Wittgenstein's arguments. This brings us to the latter charge of Meixner's misrepresentation of these arguments; the rest of the review will discuss some of the more egregious examples of this.

A prime example of such misunderstanding is Meixner's reading of Wittgenstein as a nihilist or eliminativist about the inward mental life, which he accuses Wittgenstein of when he presents his first-order views on Husserl and Wittgenstein (see Chapter 1.5, Chapter 2.1 and 2.3 and Chapter 3.4). This results from Meixner trying to forcibly align Wittgenstein's position too closely to Ryle's and Dennett's. The nihilism that he attributes to Wittgenstein is coupled with skepticism about the mental that he also saddles Wittgenstein with, nihilism (that there is no such as the inward mental life) being the ontological correlative of epistemological skepticism (that one cannot know one's one inward mental life). Meixner sometimes thinks that Wittgenstein is unclear about whether the former is a premise for the later(that it's because there is no inward mental life, that one can't know it) or whether the latter is the reason for the former (that it's because one can't know one's inward mental life that there is no such thing). But he ultimately thinks Wittgenstein's argument is the second: that the ontological nihilism with respect to the mental that Wittgenstein espouses is based on his epistemological skepticism regarding it -- see "the elimination argument" (106f) and the "Wittgensteinian instantiation of the Gorgias Schema" discussion (165-173). In fact, the entire, long second chapter is devoted to establishing that it is because one cannot know one's inward mental life either subjectively (via introspection) or intersubjectively that there is no such thing as the inward mental life. The problem is that this interpretation is a complete inversion of Wittgenstein's actual position that there is such a thing as the inward mental life, and although one cannot know it in the first instance by introspection but rather by outward behavior under certain external circumstances, it can be (and is) known. Wittgenstein's true position is that one has one's own feelings and sensations in a way others cannot and that one can experience these, via introspection or inner awareness, in a way others cannot, but neither (that one can have them and know them in ways others cannot) can be what determines what they are or how we can know them in the first instance.

Meixner's basic overall misunderstanding of Wittgenstein's position thus involves a whole cluster of misunderstandings concerning the ontological and epistemological aspects of the privacy of the mental that circle around the private language argument. One concerns his bemusement at Wittgenstein's (172f) and Bennett-Hacker's (194f) refusal to regard pains and other sensations as mental objects that are privately owned by their subjects. Of course Wittgenstein's refusal is based on some central considerations of his famous private language argument, namely that recalling, via reflexive experience, a previous mental image or sample (e.g., an experience of red or pain) to compare a current one to in order to verify that what I think is an experience of red or pain now really is so, is a circular test and thus useless. It is just doing all over again what one already did in thinking that it was an experience of red or pain to begin with (as Wittgenstein says, it would be like buying several copies of the same newspaper to determine whether what it said was true, PI 1, §265). Such a procedure cannot serve as a criterion for determining the identity of an experience since it does not provide any independent check on the correctness of the original identification but just performs again the same process which still stands in need of checking. Thus, if all the subject has to go on are what can be furnished by her own reflexive experience, whatever seems to her to be a red-experience or a pain-experience will be a red-experience or pain-experience, and therefore there will be no determinacy to her experiences (PI 1, §258). But Meixner's discussion of the private language argument misses this point and is oddly disconcerting since much of what he has to say seems to me to support or establish Wittgenstein's point, yet Meixner takes his remarks to be objections to Wittgenstein. For example, Meixner writes:

If this animal that now comes to the waterhole is the strange animal again (the one he previously noticed coming to the waterhole, etc), then Robinson*'s ['Robinson*' is meant to designate a "born Crusoe", unlike the Crusoe in Defoe's tale who was brought up in human society before ultimately becoming isolated] application of the designator "A" to it is correct; but if it is not the strange animal again, then Robinson*'s application of the designator "A" to it is incorrect. Likewise: if this now occurring sensation of his is the strange sensation again (the one he previously noticed having, etc.), then Robinson*'s application of the designator "E" to is correct; but if it is not the strange sensation again, then Robinson*'s application of "E" to it is incorrect. (157, Meixner's emphasis)

This is all true but it is precisely Wittgenstein's point. Yes, if the strange sensation is in fact occurring, and if the animal is in fact at the waterhole, then we have a criterion for assessing the correctness or otherwise of the use of our terms ("A" and "E") that refer to them, but if there is only Robinson*'s own experience of the animal or strange sensation (as opposed to the fact of the animal's being there or strange sensation itself) then there is no criterion of correctness/mistake, and no way of determining if one is using the term(s) correctly or not. If one then replies that Robinson* still needs to experience these facts, so ultimately we are back with his experience after all (as Meixner does at the top of the same page and again on 160), this does not mean his experience is now acting as the criterion of correctness, as Meixner seems to think, rather the facts (of the animal actually being there or the strange sensation actually occurring) still are, and to the extent that his experience aligns with these facts and he uses the relevant term when describing his fact-aligning experience then to that extent his use is correct, and to the extent that his experience does not align with the facts, then to that extent his use is mistaken. There is a criterion of correctness and it is provided by the facts of the matter, his experience on which his word usage is based is assessed by reference to it. Having to experience or recognize a criterion of correctness does not make the criterion of correctness thereby that experience, nor does it mean that one's experience can no longer be assessed in terms of it. And, that we may not always be able to tell from our experience if our experience does or does not align with the facts just means that we are not always sure if we are correct (having a criterion of correctness does not mean always using it correctly, as Meixner rightly notes), but if there is to be a criterion of correctness, and thus something that makes for the very possibility of being mistaken (or correct), then there has got to be something more than just one's experiences, and that "something more" is the fact (of the animal being there or the sensation's actually occurring).

The above misunderstanding leads to Meixner's mistaking the conclusion of the private language argument:

Wittgenstein . . . supposes (or seems to suppose) that there can be no language with private rules, and from this he concludes (or seems to conclude) that there can be no language about the private, that is . . . a language (also) about the inward mental life. This . . . I consider to be Wittgenstein's so-called (and endlessly discussed) private language argument. Its pivotal premise (which can be disentangled with some effort from PI I, §256 and §257) -- namely, that a language about the private . . . is ipso facto a language with private rules -- is highly questionable. (162, Meixner's emphasis)

However Wittgenstein's private language argument does not conclude that there cannot be a language that talks about the private -- sensations, feelings, perceptions, imaginings, etc. -- but that if there is one (and he thinks there is), it must have publicly accessible rules for the use of its terms. Therefore Wittgenstein is precisely denying Meixner's "pivotal premise" -- that a language about the private is ipso facto a language with private rules -- for Wittgenstein's point is that to the extent that we can speak a language that talks about private experiences, it must be the case that this language is not one regulated by private rules.

Meixner seems to think that Wittgenstein thinks that speaking about our private mental world of subjective feelings and sensations involves following intrinsically private rules for the correct application of sensation terms, rules that are incapable of being grasped by another, and since Wittgenstein argues that the later provide no meaning determinacy for sensation terms, a language that talks about sensations (say) is impossible. But this gets matters completely the wrong way round: in denying the possibility of a private language, Wittgenstein is not denying that we can talk meaningfully about the private realm of feelings, far from it; what he is denying is that in talking meaningfully about the private (which we do) we are following intrinsically private rules for the correct application of sensation terms, rules that are incapable of being grasped by another. If this is what speaking about the inward mental life involved, then such talk would be meaningless, but since it's not, it doesn't.

Put another way, Meixner's discussion here is marred by a failure to draw a distinction between following a rule privately and following a private rule, which is just his own distinction between privacy and privatism (22-24, 104), but applied to linguistic rules. It turns out, contra Meixner, that Wittgenstein very much has this distinction in mind. So applied, the moral of the private language argument is not that there is no such thing as following a rule in private, i.e., a rule that no-one other than the rule-maker happens to know about but which could in principle be grasped by others (this is simply not true, think of coded messages which initially only the encoder happens to know, but which others could in principle know if/when they are decoded). It is rather that we cannot follow a private rule, a rule that no-one else could in principle understand. It is private rules in this sense that Wittgenstein argues have no determinate content, and if speaking about our inward mental life involved using them then it would be impossible. But Wittgenstein's point is that it doesn't, so it isn't.

Meixner also misunderstands Wittgenstein's remarks on the privacy of sensations, taking Wittgenstein to deny such privacy. This is too crude. For Wittgenstein it is not that pains aren't private, they are. It is that their privacy is not an ontologically defining or distinctive feature of them -- that the privacy of a pain makes a claim about what pains essentially are, how they are individuated (and in particular that they are individuated by their owners), as if pains are different if they are had by different persons. Wittgenstein is arguing that this is false and that the mistake is the result of mistaking the grammar of statements like "I can't have another's pain". Meixner and other "traditional theorists of mind" think, according to Wittgenstein, that such a statement is analogous to a claim, like "I (being male) can't give birth", i.e., a statement of metaphysical possibility/impossibility, whereas Wittgenstein thinks it merely expresses a grammatical rule that governs what it makes sense to say and what is senseless with regard to sensation-talk (specifically, that it's senseless to say "I have your toothache" or "She and he both had my headache", and so on), and which is why he likens it to analytic truths like "one plays patience [solitaire] by oneself" (PI 1, §248), and "This body has extension" (PI 1, §252).

Furthermore, Wittgenstein's view that "I can't have another's pain" is a quasi-analytic or grammatical truth is supported by the fact that its denial "I can have your pain" is not false, but nonsense. For Wittgenstein, it is true that I can't have your pain but it is true not because pains are especially private but because they're not -- i.e., I can't have your pain because there is no such thing as your pain, in the sense of a pain that is distinctively yours and which is different from any pain I could have. Thus although I can't have your pain, in this sense, because there is no such thing, what I can have is the same pain as you for pains aren't individuate by owner but by their phenomenal qualities. To Meixner's objection (174,191-2) that this fails to distinguish universal and particular, type and token -- that kinds of pains (e.g., headaches or toothaches in general) may be shareable but pain-particulars or particular pain-tokens (e.g., this particular migraine of mine that I'm experiencing now) are surely private -- and thus that pains in this sense of pain-tokens are private, Wittgenstein would reply that this is true but trivial. This is because it is not a sense in which pain-tokens, and other mental state-tokens, are importantly or distinctively private -- physical state-tokens of my body also have this privacy since just as I can't have your pain qua pain-token, I likewise can't have your smile (this particular bodily state-token of your smiling now) or your sneeze or your brain state, qua bodily state-tokens.

Relatedly, Meixner misconstrues the sense of Wittgenstein's claims about epistemological privacy. When Wittgenstein says that "I can't know that I am in pain", he is precisely not claiming that one has to be skeptical about one's own mental states, as Meixner's skeptical reading of Wittgenstein would have it. When Wittgenstein says "I can't know that I'm in pain", or that it's nonsense to say "I know I'm in pain", this needs to be understood in the right way. The sense in which this is meant and which makes it nonsense to say that I know I'm in pain also makes it nonsense to say I doubt I'm in pain. Thus skepticism about the inward mental life is not being advocated, but rather is taken to be nonsensical.

Wittgenstein's point is that doubt about one's own present mental states is not possible, so likewise, in a sense, knowledge of them is not possible. In what sense? Well, in the sense in which knowledge of the external states of affairs in the world is made possible. Wittgenstein's point is, rather, that first-person, present-tense mental states, unlike external states of affairs in the world, have a different epistemology, cannot be doubted (or don't enter into the "language game of doubt") so they don't enter into the language game of knowledge (and so it can't be properly said of them that they are known). Put another way, it's not that they can't be known, but that they are not known in the same way as external states of affairs in the world. First-person, present-tense experiences and sensations can be known, and known with certainty, not because one has absolutely unimpeachable evidence for them, but because one needs no evidence for them, since nothing could be more certain than them which could then act as evidence for (or against) them. This is a key feature of "bedrock" proposition (PI 1, §217), of which first-person present-tense experiential statements are prime examples, that Wittgenstein develops at length in On Certainty (a text Meixner's fails to consider), and it is of a piece with what he has to say (PI 1 s. 289), namely, that such propositions are held without justification but nevertheless with right. What he means by this is that statements like "I am in pain" or "I am having a red experience" have no justification, but, and this is the important thing, they do not need any. To say that such statements have no justification is then not to say they are unjustified, but that they are always already justified, that some epistemically more basic beliefs that would justify them cannot be supplied for they are justification "ground zero". In this way, although they do not have any evidence or justification for them, they are nevertheless justified (they are held "without justification but not without [epistemic] right"). Thus to think, as Meixner does, that Wittgenstein's statement that "I can't know that I'm in pain" espouses skepticism is to mistake its sense, to misconstrue statements about one's present sensations as descriptive claims about the inward mental life that require justification from inner sense or introspection.

Ironically Meixner's "traditional" view of the mental that supposedly attempts to underscore the intimacy and privacy of pain and other sensations actually exiles them, makes them things one can be wrong about or doubt, and that require evidence (from introspection), and thus that can be impugned for the lack of it. Wittgenstein's position (which Meixner accuses of evincing skepticism) makes one's relation to one's own mental states more epistemically intimate, not less -- for Wittgenstein, one always already knows one's own mental states such that one needs no justification for holding that one has them, and that asking for such justification is to misunderstand them. Wittgenstein's holding that first-person, present-tense psychological statements are expressive is just marking their distinctness from descriptive or representational language, that first-person present tense psychological statements function in a different way, that they are expressive, non-representational, and thus require and can have no evidential or justificatory support. In a further irony, if Meixner were more alive to Wittgenstein's point, he would welcome Wittgenstein's "expressivism" as a sign of anti-representationalism rather than a sign of his skepticism and nihilism.

A final example of Meixner's blindness to a key insight of Wittgenstein's that were he to appreciate it would challenge his Husserlian position comes from his discussion of intending in Chapter 3, and draws together some of the discussion on imagining (and perceiving) in Chapter 1 as well as the discussion of the private language argument in Chapter 2. What Meixner calls in Chapter 1 "the inward mental life", i.e., what consciousness is aware of when perceiving or imagining, and what he, following Husserl, thinks is composed of non-representational mental images or simulacra, turns out to be one version of what Wittgenstein calls the 'visual room' (PI 1, §398f). Wittgenstein's notion of the 'visual room' is the common empiricist idea that when perceiving (or imagining, though Wittgenstein concentrates on the case of perception) there is something the perceiving subject is aware of (viz. the "room" of his private world of inner experience) which is what he 'really sees', and which in the case of perceiving a physical object is thought of as the immediate sensory effect of the impact of physical objects on his sensory surfaces. Husserl's Ideas 1 account of intentionality ("the Id1-intentionality view", 269), which Meixner articulates and endorses in Chapter 3, is his definitive account of (what Wittgenstein calls) the 'visual room', and according to it the contents of the visual room, what are usually called objects of experience, or intentional objects (to use the terminology of phenomenology) though not separable from consciousness are nevertheless to be thought of as genuine objects. This is what Wittgenstein subjects to sustained criticism.

An intentional object of experience for Husserl is the meaning or sense of the experience; alternatively, it is the object as it is experienced, or the object that is experienced by the experiencer, or the object as it is given in experience. Thus, when I perceive the table in my office, there is the real table out there in the world, and there is that table-as-it-is-given-in-my-experience (the table-in-the-visual-room) and this latter is what Husserl means by the intentional object. Further, for Husserl and Meixner, though intentional objects are inseparable from perceptions, i.e., from intentional acts of perception, they are still genuine objects, i.e., bearers or "subjects" of attributes that are "re-identifiable individuals" (261-62). Thus, Husserl and Meixner mean that intentional objects are objects not just in the sense that they are to be distinguished from the usual empiricist notion of 'ideas' or 'sense-data' (e.g., particular shaped color patches such as a greyish-white rhomboid in the case of my experiencing a table) for intentional objects (noemata) are not subjective apparitions like greyish-white rhomboids, but objects themselves as they appear from a certain perspective (e.g., the table itself as it appears as a greyish-white rhomboid), but they are objects also in the sense that the intentional object is distinct from the act of perception that it is nevertheless inseparable from, i.e., it is a bearer of attributes, an individual that is re-identifiable across different temporally-dated intentional acts (278).

Whether intentional objects can genuinely be "objects" in this sense is what Wittgenstein's discussion of the visual room questions. In PI 1, §398 he writes that there is no "seeing", no "subject", and no "object" in the senses of seeing, subject and object that obtains in the case where one sees an "outer" object in the physical environment because the relation a perceiver stands to a physical object is completely different from the relation between a perceiver and the "visual object" (the object in "the visual room"). The visual object is not an object in the same way as a physical object is because the visual object does not exist independently of one's experience of it (remember it is inseparable from the act of perception), so the grammar of objecthood does not apply to the visual object.

Meixner and Husserl reply that phenomenological intentional objects do exist independent of one's experience of them (thus they are genuine objects) because intentional objects can recur as the same across different, temporally-dated experiences or intentional acts (see the distinction between temporal occurrence and recurring individuals, [262, 278]), to think they do not is to confuse them with early modern 'ideas' or the phenomenalist 'sense-data'. However drawing on his discussion in the private language argument, Wittgenstein's response is that an intentional object's genuinely recurring as the same requires it to be intersubjectively identifiable as the same, otherwise there is no distinction between an intentional object seeming to a subject to be the same and it really being the same. And intentional objects are not capable of being identifiable as the same across different subjects because they are inherently mental, and thus private and subjective in nature. For a Husserlian intentional object to genuinely recur as the same across different, temporally-dated experiences or intentional acts it needs to be capable of being given as the same across different experiencers, which it isn't, and since this -- intersubjective re-identification -- is what is required for genuine object-hood according to Wittgenstein, intentional objects are not properly objects (in Wittgensteinian parlance: do not belong to the language game of objects).

On the whole this book exemplifies just how hard it is to do careful, fair-handed comparative work crossing the balkanized continental-analytic divide. On the one hand, it is an extremely laudable, sustained and rare attempt at bringing a central figure of each tradition into critical discussion with the other. On the other hand, given the philosophical sympathies and expertise of the author, the critical discussion is not always, or even often, staged fairly, with Wittgenstein's position, in particular, being incompletely and incorrectly represented, leaving those more sympathetic to Wittgenstein's views, such as myself, with the distinct impression that straw men have been built and questions begged. This is probably only to be expected when two traditions with such different methodological starting points and theoretical commitments are brought into confrontation.